Augustine: Political and Social Philosophy

augustineSt. Augustine (C.E. 354-430), originally named Aurelius Augustinus, was the Catholic bishop of Hippo in northern Africa.  He was a skilled Roman-trained rhetorician, a prolific writer (who produced more than 110 works over a 30-year period), and by wide acclamation, the first Christian philosopher.  Writing from a unique background and vantage point as a keen observer of society before the fall of the Roman Empire, Augustine’s views on political and social philosophy constitute an important intellectual bridge between late antiquity and the emerging medieval world.  Because of the scope and quantity of his work, many scholars consider him to have been the most influential Western philosopher.

Although Augustine certainly would not have thought of himself as a political or social philosopher per se, the record of his thoughts on such themes as the nature of human society, justice, the nature and role of the state, the relationship between church and state, just and unjust war, and peace all have played their part in the shaping of Western civilization. There is much in his work that anticipates major themes in the writings of moderns like Machiavelli, Luther, Calvin and, in particular, Hobbes.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
    1. Historical Context
    2. Augustinian Political “Theory”
    3. The Augustinian World View
  2. Foundational Political and Social Concepts
    1. Two Cities
    2. Justice and the State
    3. Church and State
  3. War and Peace
    1. War Among Nations
    2. War and Human Nature
    3. The Just War
    4. Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello
    5. Augustine’s Conception of Peace
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Background

a. Historical Context

Augustine’s political and social views flow directly from his theology.  The historical context is essential to understanding his purposes.  Augustine, more than any other figure of late antiquity, stands at the intellectual intersection of Christianity, philosophy, and politics.  As a Christian cleric, he takes it as his task to defend his flock against the unremitting assault by heresies spawned in an era uninformed by the immediate, divine revelations which had characterized the apostolic age.  As a philosopher, he situates his arguments against the backdrop of Greek philosophy in the Platonic tradition, particularly as formulated by the Neo-Platonists of Alexandria.  As a prominent Roman citizen, he understands the Roman Empire to be the divinely-ordained medium through which the truths of Christianity are to be both spread and safeguarded.

Augustine died reciting the Penitential Psalms as the Vandals besieged the city of Hippo on the coast of northern Africa (now the city of Annaba, in Algeria). This occurred two decades after the sacking of Rome by Alaric.

b. Augustinian Political “Theory”

Augustine’s willingness to grapple with substantive political and social issues does not mean, however, that the presentation of his ideas comes pre-packaged as a simple system—or even as a system at all.  Quite the contrary, his political arguments are scattered throughout his voluminous writings, which include autobiography, sermons, expositions, commentaries, letters, and Christian apologetics.  Moreover, the contexts in which the political and social issues are addressed are equally varied.

Nevertheless, it would be a mistake to suggest that his arguments are not informed by a cogent theory.  Taken together, his political and social musings constitute a remarkable tapestry.  Indeed, the consistency evident in the expression of his varied but related ideas leads both fairly and directly to the assumption that Augustine’s political-philosophical statements arise from a consistent set of premises which guide him to his conclusions; in other words, they reveal the presence of an underlying, if unstated, theory.

c. The Augustinian World View

Because Augustine considers the Christian scriptures to constitute the touchstone against which philosophy—including political philosophy—must be assayed, his world view necessarily includes the Christian tenets of the Creation, the Fall of man, and the Redemption.  In stark contrast to the pagan philosophers who preceded him—who viewed the unfolding of history as a cyclical phenomenon, Augustine conceives history in strictly linear terms, with a beginning and an end.  According to Augustine, the earth was brought into existence ex nihilo by a perfectly good and just God, who created man. The earth is not eternal; the earth, as well as time, has both a beginning and an end.

Man, on the other hand, was brought into existence to endure eternally. Damnation is the just desert of all men because of the Fall of Adam, who, having been created with free will, chose to disrupt the perfectly good order established by God. As the result of Adam’s Fall, all human beings are heirs to the effects of Adam’s original sin, and all are vessels of pride, avarice, greed and self-interest.  For reasons known only to God, He has predestined some fixed number of men for salvation (as a display of His unmerited mercy—a purely gratuitous act altogether independent even of God’s foreknowledge of any good deeds those men might do while on earth), while most He has predestined for damnation as a just consequence of the Fall. The onward march of human history, then, constitutes the unfolding of the divine plan which will culminate in one or the other outcome for every member of the human family.

Within this framework of political and legal systems, the state is a divinely ordained punishment for fallen man, with its armies, its power to command, coerce, punish, and even put to death, as well as its institutions such as slavery and private property. God shapes the ultimate ends of man’s existence through it.  The state simultaneously serves the divine purposes of chastening the wicked and refining the righteous.  Also simultaneously, the state constitutes a sort of remedy for the effects of the Fall, in that it serves to maintain such modicum of peace and order as it is possible for fallen man to enjoy in the present world.

While it is not clear that God predestines every event during man’s sojourn on earth, nothing happens in contravention of His designs. In any case, predestination fixes the ultimate destination of every human being—as well as the political states to which they belong.  Hence, predestination for Augustine is the proverbial elephant in the room. Whether predestination was divinely contemplated prior or incidental to the Fall (a point which Augustine never clearly articulates), the following problem arises:  If one is to be saved or damned by divine fiat, what difference does it make whether the world possesses the social order of a state?  For those who are predestined for damnation, what is the point of their being “chastened” (or a means to encourage their reformation) by the state?  For those predestined for salvation, what is the point of their being refined by the vicissitudes of life in a political state?  In order to prevent the collapse of such a systematic account of the human condition as Augustine provides, the question simply must be set aside as a matter unknowable to finite man.  However, this means that the best Augustine can hope to accomplish is to provide a description of political life on earth, but not a prescription for how to obtain membership in the perfect society of heaven; for, even strict obedience to Christian precepts will not compensate for one’s not being gratuitously elected for salvation.

As the social fabric of the world around him unravels in the twilight years of the Roman Empire, Augustine attempts to elucidate the relationship between the eternal, invisible verities of his faith and the stark realities of the present, observable political and social conditions of humanity.  At the intersection of these two concerns, Augustine finds what for him is the central question of politics:  How do the faithful operate successfully but justly in an unjust world, , where selfish interests dominate, where the general welfare is rarely sought, and where good and evil men are inextricably (and, to human eyes, often unidentifiably) intermingled, yet search for a heavenly reward in the world hereafter?

2. Foundational Political and Social Concepts

a. Two Cities

Even though those elected for salvation and those elected for damnation are thoroughly intermingled, the distinction arising from their respective destinies gives rise to two classes of persons, to whom Augustine refers collectively and allegorically as cities—the City of God and the earthly city.  Citizens of the earthly city are the unregenerate progeny of Adam and Eve, who are justifiably damned because of Adam’s Fall.  These persons, according to Augustine, are aliens to God’s love (not because God refuses to love them, but because they refuse to love God as evidenced by their rebellious disposition inherited from the Fall).  Indeed, the object of their love—whatever it may be—is something other than God.  In particular, citizens of the “earthly city” are distinguished by their lust for material goods and for domination over others.  On the other hand, citizens of the City of God are “pilgrims and foreigners” who (because God, the object of their love, is not immediately available for their present enjoyment) are very much out of place in a world without an earthly institution sufficiently similar to the City of God.  No political state, nor even the institutional church, can be equated with the City of God.  Moreover, there is no such thing as “dual citizenship” in the two cities; every member of the human family belongs to one—and only one.

b. Justice and the State

The Augustinian notion of justice includes what by his day was a well-established definition of justice of “giving every man his due.”  However, Augustine grounds his application of the definition in distinctively Christian philosophical commitments:  “justice,” says Augustine, “is love serving God only, and therefore ruling well all else.”  Accordingly, justice becomes the crucial distinction between ideal political states (none of which actually exist on earth) and non-ideal political states—the status of every political state on earth.  For example, the Roman Empire could not be synonymous with the City of God precisely because it lacked true justice as defined above; and since, “where there is no justice there is no commonwealth,” Rome could not truly be a commonwealth, that is, an ideal state.  “Remove justice,” Augustine asks rhetorically, “and what are kingdoms but gangs of criminals on a large scale?  What are criminal gangs but petty kingdoms?”  No earthly state can claim to possess true justice, but only some relative justice by which one state is more just than another.  Likewise, the legitimacy of any earthly political regime can be understood only in relative terms:  The emperor and the pirate have equally legitimate domains if they are equally just.

Nevertheless, political states, imperfect as they are,  serve a divine purpose.  At the very least, they serve as vehicles for maintaining order and for preventing what Hobbes will later call the “war of all against all.”  In that respect, the state is a divine gift and an expression of divine mercy—especially if the state is righteously ruled.  The state maintains order by keeping wicked men in check through the fear of punishment.  Although God will eventually punish the sins of all those elected for damnation, He uses the state to levy more immediate punishments against both the damned and the saved (or against the wicked and the righteous, the former dichotomy not necessarily synonymous with the latter).  Rulers, as God’s ministers, punish the guilty and always are justified in punishing sins “against nature,” and circumstantially justified in punishing sins “against custom” or “against the laws.” The latter two categories of sins change from time to time.  In this regard, the institution of the state marks a relative return to order from the chaos of the Fall.  Rulers have the right to establish any law that does not conflict with the law of God. Citizens have the duty to obey their political leaders regardless of whether the leader is wicked or righteous.  There is no right of civil disobedience.  Citizens are always duty bound to obey God; and when the imperatives of obedience to God and obedience to civil authority conflict, citizens must choose to obey God and willingly accept the punishment of disobedience. Nevertheless, those empowered to levy punishment should take no delight in the task.  For example, the prayer of the judge who condemns a man to death should be, as Augustine’s urges, “From my necessities [of imposing judgment to a person] deliver thou me.”

c. Church and State

Even though the ostensible reason for the state’s divinely appointed existence is to assist and bless humankind, there is no just state, says Augustine, because men reject the thing that best could bring justice to an imperfect world, namely, the teachings of Christ.  Augustine does not suggest that current rejection of Christ’s teachings means that all hope for future amendment and reformation is lost.  However, Augustine’s whole tenor is that there is no reason to expect that the political jurisdictions of this world ever will be anything different than what they now are, if the past is any predictor of the future.  Hence, Augustine concludes that

Christ’s servants, whether they are kings, or princes, or judges, or soldiers . . . are bidden, if need be, to endure the wickedness of an utterly corrupt state, and by that endurance to win for themselves a place of glory . . . in the Heavenly Commonwealth, whose law is the will of God.

Augustine clearly holds that the establishment and success of the Roman Empire, along with its embracing of Christianity as its official religion, was part of the divine plan of the true God.  Indeed, he holds that the influence of Christianity upon the empire could be only salutary in its effect:

Were our religion listened to as it deserves,” says Augustine, “it would establish, consecrate, strengthen, and enlarge the commonwealth in a way beyond all that Romulus, Numa, Brutus, and all the other men of renown in Roman history achieved.

Still, while Augustine doubtless holds that it is better for Rome to be Christian than not, he clearly recognizes that officially embracing Christianity does not automatically transform an earthly state into the City of God.  Indeed, he regards Rome as “a kind of second Babylon.”  Even if the Roman Emperor and the Roman Pontiff were one and the same—even if the structures of state and church merged so as to become institutionally the same—they would not thereby become the City of God, because citizenship in the City of God is determined at the individual and not the institutional level.

Augustine does not wish ill for Rome.  Quite the contrary, he supplicates God for Rome’s welfare,  since he belongs to it, in temporal terms at least.  He sees Rome as the last bastion against the advances of the pagan barbarians, who surely must not be allowed to overrun the mortal embodiment of Christendom that Rome represents.  Nevertheless, Augustine cannot be overly optimistic about the future of the Roman state as such—not because it is Rome, but because it is a state; for any society of men other than the City of God is part and parcel of the earthly city, which is doomed to inevitable demise.  Even so, states like Rome can perform the useful purpose of championing the cause of the Church, protecting it from assault and compelling those who have fallen away from fellowship with it to return to the fold.  Indeed, it is entirely within the provinces of the state to punish heretics and schismatics.

3. War and Peace

a. War Among Nations

Inasmuch as the history of human society is largely the history of warfare, it seems quite natural for Augustine to explain war as being within God’s unfolding plan for human history.  As Augustine states, “It rests with the decision of God in his just judgment and mercy either to afflict or console mankind, so that some wars come to an end more speedily, others more slowly.”

Wars serve the function of putting mankind on notice, as it were, of the value of consistently righteous living.  Although one might feel to call upon Augustine to defend the notion that God can, with propriety, use so terrible a vehicle as war to chasten the wicked, two points must be kept in mind:  The first point is that, for Augustine, all of God’s acts are just, by definition, even if the application of that definition to specific cases of the human experience eludes human reasoning.             This point invites a somewhat more philosophically intriguing question:  Is it just to compel men to do good who, when left to their own devices, would prefer evil?  If one were forced to act righteously contrary to his or her will, is it not the case that he or she would still lack the change of heart that is necessary to produce a repentant attitude—an attitude that results in genuine reformation?  Perhaps; but Augustine is unwilling to concede that it is better, in the name of recognizing the agency of others, to let them continue to wallow in evil practices.  Augustine argues,

The aim towards which a good will compassionately devotes its efforts is to secure that a bad will be rightly directed.  For who does not know that a man is not condemned on any other ground than because his bad will deserved it, and that no man is saved who has not a good will?

Exactly how God is to bring about his good purposes through the process of war may not be clear to man in any particular case.  Any who acquire a glimpse of understanding as to why the divine economy operates as it does truly possess a good will and shall not hesitate to administer to those erring, according to God’s direction, the punitive discipline that war is intended to bring.  Moreover, those of good will shall administer discipline to those erring by moving them toward repentance and reformation.

All of this leads conveniently to a second point: War can bring the need to discipline by chastening. Those of good will do not manifest cruelty in the proper administration of punishment but, rather, in the withholding of punishment.  “It does not follow,” Augustine states, “that those who are loved should be cruelly left to yield themselves with impunity to their bad will; but in so far as power is given, they ought to be both prevented from evil and compelled to good.”  What if, however, the violence of war serves only to subdue the wrongdoings of the wicked but fails to produce the change of heart that would characterize the transition from a bad to a good will—much like the case of the criminal who is sentenced to prison but who feels no remorse for his or her actions and, given his or her freedom, would all too readily repeat the crime?  For Augustine, it is always better to restrain an evil man from the commission of evil acts than it is to permit his continued perpetration of those acts.  As for the evil but unrepentant man, it would seem that he will have failed to reap the intended benefit of God’s chastening, which, reckoned by any measure, is a great tragedy indeed.

For Augustine, even the death of the mortal body, as ultimate a penalty as it might appear from the mortal perspective, is not nearly so serious a consequence as that which would ensue if one is left to wallow in sin: “But great and holy men, although they at the time knew excellently well that that death which separates the soul from the body is not to be dreaded, yet, in accordance with the sentiment of those who might fear it, punished some sins with death, both because the living were struck with a salutary fear, and because it was not death itself that would injure those who were being punished with death, but sin, which might be increased if they continued to live.”

Writing after the time when Christianity became the official religion of the Roman Empire, Augustine holds that there is no prohibition against a Christian serving the state as a soldier in its army.  Neither is there any prohibition against taking the lives of the enemies of the state, so long as he does it in his public capacity as a soldier and not in the private capacity of a murderer.  Nevertheless, Augustine also urges that soldiers should go to war mournfully and never take delight in the shedding of blood.

b. War and Human Nature

If, however, the presence of war serves as a defining characteristic of the earthly city, why does Augustine not pursue the course taken by some of the Latin Patristic writers who precede him by labeling war and military service as merely a “worldly” institution in which true Christians have no place.  The answer seems to lie in Augustine’s world view, which differs from that of many of his predecessors in terms of his optimism for man to comprehend the ultimate verities, live in an orderly manner and find his way back to God.  He becomes quite pessimistic though in his view of human nature and of the ability and desire of humans to maintain themselves orderly, much less rightly.  Pride, vanity and the lust for domination entice men toward waging wars and committing all manner of violence, because of men’s tendency to do evil as the result of Adam’s Fall.  Augustine holds that, given the inextricable mixing of citizens of the two cities, the total avoidance of war or its effects is a practical impossibility for all men, including the righteous.  Happily, he holds that the day will come when, coincident with the end of the earthly city, wars will no longer be fought.  For, says Augustine, citing words from the Psalms to the effect that God will one day bring a cessation of all wars,

This not yet see we fulfilled:  yet are there wars, wars among nations for sovereignty; among sects, among Jews, Pagans, Christians, heretics, are wars, frequent wars, some for the truth, some for falsehood contending.  Not yet then is this fulfilled, ‘He maketh wars to cease unto the end of the earth;’ but haply it shall be fulfilled.

For the present, however, man—particularly Christian man—is left with the question of how to live in a world full of war.

c. The Just War

As the Roman Empire collapses around him, Augustine confronted the question of what justifies warfare for a Christian.  On the one hand, the wicked are not particularly concerned about just wars.  On the other hand, the righteous vainly hope to avoid being affected by wars in this life,   and at best they can hope for just wars rather than unjust ones.   This is by no means a perfect solution; but then again, this is not a perfect world.  If it were, all talk of just wars would be altogether nonsensical. Perfect solutions characterize only the heavenly City of God. Its pilgrim citizens sojourning on earth can do no better than try to cope with the present difficulties and imperfections of the earthly life.  Thus, for Augustine, the just war is a coping mechanism for use by the righteous who aspire to citizenship in the City of God.  In terms of the traditional notion of jus ad bellum (justice of war, that is, the circumstances in which wars can be justly fought), war is a coping mechanism for righteous sovereigns who would ensure that their violent international encounters are minimal, a reflection of the Divine Will to the greatest extent possible, and always justified.  In terms of the traditional notion of jus in bello (justice in war, or the moral considerations which ought to constrain the use of violence in war), war is a coping mechanism for righteous combatants who, by divine edict, have no choice but to subject themselves to their political masters and seek to ensure that they execute their war-fighting duty as justly as possible. Sometimes that duty might arise in the most trying of circumstances, or under the most wicked of regimes; for

Christ’s servants, whether they are kings, or princes, or judges, or soldiers, or provincials, whether rich or poor, freemen or slaves, men or women, are bidden, if need be, to endure the wickedness of an utterly corrupt state, and by that endurance to win for themselves a place of glory

hereafter in the heavenly City of God.

In sum, why would a man like Augustine, whose eye is fixed upon attainment of citizenship in the heavenly city, find it necessary to delineate what counts as a just war in this lost and fallen world?  In general terms, the demands of moral life are so thoroughly interwoven with social life that the individual cannot be separated from citizenship in one or the other city.  In more specific terms, the just man who walks by faith needs to understand how to cope with the injustices and contradictions of war as much as he needs to understand how to cope with all other aspects of the present world where he is a stranger and pilgrim.  Augustine takes important cues from both Cicero and Ambrose and synthesizes their traditions into a Christianized world view that still retains strong ties to the pre-Christian philosophic past.  He resolves the dilemma of just war and pacifist considerations by denying the dilemma: war is simply a part of the human experience that God Himself has ordained or permitted.  War arises from, and stands as a clear manifestation of, the nature of fallen man.  For adherents to nominal Christianity, the explanatory power of Augustine’s thoughts on just war is substantial; his approach enables Christians to understand just war as a coping mechanism for just men who are trying to get along as morally (if not as piously) as they can in an imperfect world.

However, since Augustine seeks to resolve the nature of his ethical tensions, the synthetic character of Augustine’s approach to war is important, not merely for adherents to Christianity, but also for others seeking a strictly rational account of the problem.  For example, if one were to take a de-theologized view of Augustine’s approach and focus simply upon the general theoretical problem of the morality of war, Augustine’s attempt fully deserves serious philosophical consideration. His approach explains how a morally upright citizen of a relatively just state could be justified in pursuing warfare, in prosecuting war, and ultimately, although unhappily, in taking human life.  In any case, Augustine’s just war theory arises from his most deeply rooted philosophical assumptions.  Augustine as a Christian philosopher achieves a full synthesis of the Roman and Christian values associated with war in a way that legitimizes war as an instrument of national policy which, although inferior to the perfect ideals of Christianity, is one which Christians cannot altogether avoid and with which they must in some sense make their peace.

d. Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello

Traditionally, the philosophical treatment of the just war is divided into two categories:  jus in bellum and jus in bello.  The former describes the necessary (and, by some accounts, sufficient) conditions for justifying engagement in war.  The latter describes the necessary conditions for conducting war in a just manner.

Augustine’s jus ad bellum prescripts enjoin that wars can be initiated justly only on the basis of:

1.  a just cause, such as to defend the state from external invasion; to defend the safety or honor of the state, with the realization that their simultaneous defense might be impossible; to avenge injuries; to punish a nation for failure to take corrective action for wrongs (legal or moral ) committed by its citizens; to come to the defense of allies; to gain the return of something that was wrongfully taken; or to obey a divine command to go to war (which, in practice, issues from the political head of state acting as God’s lieutenant on earth); and in any case, the just cause must be at least more just than the cause of one’s enemies;

2.  a rightly intended will, which has the restoration of peace as its prime objective, takes no delight in the wickedness of potential adversaries, views waging war as a stern necessity, tolerates no action calculated to provoke a war, and does not seek to conquer others merely for conquest’s sake or for territorial expansion; and

3. a declaration of war by a competent authority, and except in the most unusual of circumstances, in a public manner, and only as a last resort.

Concerning jus in bello, Augustine holds that wars, once begun, must be fought in a manner which:

1. represents a proportional response to the wrong to be avenged, with violence being constrained within the limits of military necessity;

2. discriminates between proper objects of violence (that is, combatants) and noncombatants, such as women, children, the elderly, the clergy, and so forth.; and

3. observes good faith in its interactions with the enemy, by scrupulously observing treaties and not prosecuting the war in a treacherous manner.

e. Augustine’s Conception of Peace

Both Augustine’s political world view and his approach to war incorporate his conception of peace.  According to Augustine, God designed all humans to live together in the “bond of peace.” However, fallen man lives in society  as according to the divine will or as opposing it.  Augustine distinguishes the two cities in several important ways, as well as the kind of peace they seek:

There is, in fact, one city of men who choose to live by the standard of the flesh, another of those who choose to live by the standard of the spirit.  The citizens of each of these desire their own kind of peace, and when they achieve their aim, that is the kind of peace in which they live.

Because the common choice of fallen man is a peace of his own liking—one that selfishly serves his own immediate or foreseeable ends, peace becomes, in practice, merely an interlude between ongoing states of war.  Augustine is quick to point out that this life carries with it no guarantee of peace; that blessed state is reserved for the saved in heaven.

Augustine delineates three kinds of peace:  the ultimate and perfect peace which exists exclusively in the City of God, the interior peace enjoyed by the pilgrim citizens of the City of God as they sojourn on earth, and the peace which is common to the two cities. Sadly, Augustine is abundantly clear that temporal peace is rather an anomalous condition in the totality of human history and that perfect peace is altogether unattainable on earth:

Such is the instability of human affairs that no people has ever been allowed such a degree of tranquility as to remove all dread of hostile attacks on their dwelling in this world.  That place, then, which is promised as a dwelling of such peace and security is eternal, and is reserved for eternal beings.

However, Augustine insists that, by any estimation, it is in the best interest of everyonesaint or sinner—to try to keep the peace here and now; and indeed, establishing and maintaining an earthly peace is as fundamental to the responsibilities of the state as protecting the state in times of war.

As for the church’s quest for peace, he writes, “it seems to me that no limit can be set to the number of persecutions which the Church is bound to suffer for her training;” and he opines that persecutions will continue until the final scenes of the current state of human history incidental to the second coming of Christ. Interestingly, Augustine gives no suggestion whatsoever that the rest of the earth will be at peace while this violence against the church continues.  On the contrary, the entire tenor of his argument suggests that anti-Christian violence is merely typical of the violence and disorder that will accompany the human experience until the second coming of Christ.

While men do not agree on which kind of peace to seek, all agree that peace in some form is the end they desire to achieve.  Even in war, all parties involved desire—and fight to obtain—some kind of peace.  Ironically, although peace is the end toward which wars are fought, war seems to be the more enduring, more characteristic of the two states in the human experience. War is the natural (albeit lamentable) state in which fallen man finds himself.  The flesh and the spirit of man—although both are good—are in perpetual opposition:

But what in fact, do we achieve, when we desire to be made perfect by the Highest Good?  It can, surely, only be a situation where the desires of the flesh do not oppose the spirit, and where there is in us no vice for the spirit to oppose with its desires.  Now we cannot achieve this in our present life, for all our wishing. But we can at least, with God’s help, see to it that we do not give way to the desires of the flesh which oppose the spirit to be overcome, and that we are not dragged to the perpetration of sin with our own consent.

Augustine concludes that war among men and nations cannot be avoided altogether because it is simply characteristic of the present existence.  The contention that typifies war is merely the social counterpart to the spirit-body tension that typifies every individual person.  However, man can, through the general application of divine precepts contained in scripture and through the pursuit of virtue as dictated by reason, manage that tension both on the individual and societal levels in such a way as to obtain a transitory peace.  War and peace are two sides of the same Augustinian coin.  Owing to the injustice that is inherent in the mortal state, the former is presently unavoidable, and the latter, in its perfect manifestation, is presently unattainable.

4. Conclusion

In sum, the state is an institution imposed upon fallen man for his temporal benefit, even if the majority of men will not ultimately benefit from it in light of their predestination to damnation.  However, if one can successfully set aside Augustine’s doctrine of predestination, one finds in his writings an enormously valuable descriptive account of the psychology of fallen man, which can take the reader a very great distance toward understanding social interactions among men and nations.  Although the doctrine of predestination is indispensable for understanding Augustine’s theology, its prominence does not preclude one from reaping value from his appraisal of the state of man and his political and social relationships in the fallen “earthly city,” to which all either belong or with which they have unavoidable contact.

5. References and Further Reading

All the primary sources are readily available in English.

a. Primary Sources

  • Augustine.  City of God [De civitate Dei]. Translated by Marcus Dods, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. II. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.
  • Augustine.  On Christian Doctrine [De doctrina christiana]. Translated by J. F. Shaw, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. II. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.
  • Augustine.  On Free Choice of the Will [De libero arbitrio libri III].  Translated by Anna S. Benjamin and L. H. Hackstaff.  New York:  Macmillan Publishing Company, 1964.
  • Augustine.  Our Lord’s Sermon on the Mount [De Sermone Domini in Monte secundum Matthaeum]. Translated by William Findlay, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. VI. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bainton, Roland H.  Christian Attitudes Toward War and Peace:  A Historical Survey and Critical Re-evaluation. Nashville:  Abington Press, 1960.
    • On Augustine and War.
  • Battenhouse, Roy W.  A Companion to the Study of St. Augustine.  New York:  Oxford University Press, 1969.
  • Deane, Herbert A. The Political and Social Ideas of St. Augustine. New York:  Columbia University Press, 1963.
    • The indispensable and definitive work on Augustine’s political and social philosophy.
  • Gilson, Etienne.  The Christian Philosophy of Saint Augustine.  New York:  Random House, 1960.
  • Mattox, John Mark.  St. Augustine and the Theory of Just War.  London:  Thoemmes Continuum, 2006.
    • On Augustine and War.
  • Swift, Louis J.  The Early Fathers on War and Military Service. Wilmington:  Michael Glazier, Inc., 1983.
    • On Augustine and War.

 

Author Information

J. Mark Mattox
Email: mark.Mattox@dtra.mil
U. S. A.