Political philosophy begins with the question: what ought to be a person’s relationship to society? The subject seeks the application of ethical concepts to the social sphere and thus deals with the variety of forms of government and social existence that people could live in – and in so doing, it also provides a standard by which to analyze and judge existing institutions and relationships.
Although the two are intimately linked by a range of philosophical issues and methods, political philosophy can be distinguished from political science. Political science predominantly deals with existing states of affairs, and insofar as it is possible to be amoral in its descriptions, it seeks a positive analysis of social affairs – for example, constitutional issues, voting behavior, the balance of power, the effect of judicial review, and so forth. Political philosophy generates visions of the good social life: of what ought to be the ruling set of values and institutions that combine men and women together. The subject matter is broad and connects readily with various branches and sub-disciplines of philosophy including philosophy of law and of economics. This introduction skims the most relevant theories that the student of political philosophy is likely to encounter. The article covers Liberalism, Conservativism, Socialism, Anarchism, and Environmentalism.
Table of Contents
- Ethical Foundations
- Methodological Issues
- Political Schools of Thought
Political philosophy has its beginnings in ethics: in questions such as what kind of life is the good life for human beings. Since people are by nature sociable – there being few proper anchorites who turn from society to live alone – the question follows as to what kind of life is proper for a person amongst people. The philosophical discourses concerning politics thus develop, broaden and flow from their ethical underpinnings.
To take a few examples: the ethical utilitarian claims that the good is characterized by seeking (that is, attempting to bring about) the greatest amount of happiness for the greatest number of people (see consequentialism). Accordingly, in the political realm, the utilitarian will support the erection of those institutions whose purpose is to secure the greatest happiness for the greatest number. In contrast, an ethical deontologist, who claims that the highest good is served by our application of duties (to the right or to others), will acknowledge the justification of those institutions that best serve the employment of duties. This is a recognizable stance that merges with human rights theorists’ emphasis on the role of rights (to or from actions and/or things). In turn an ethical relativist will advocate a plurality of institutions (within a nation or around the world), whereas an ethical objectivist will condemn those that are seen to be lacking a universally morally proper purpose (for example, those that support certain inalienable rights).
As ethics is also underpinned by metaphysical and epistemological theories, so too can political philosophy be related to such underlying theories: theorizing on the nature of reality and of how we know things logically relates to how we do things and how we interact with others. The greatest and most persistent ethical-political issue that divides philosophers into a host of schools of thought is that concerning the status of the individual: the ethical ‘person’. Although the variety and subtleties of this area of thought cannot be examined here, suffice it to say that philosophers divide between those who deem the individual person as sacrosanct (that is, ethically and thus politically so) and those who consider the individual to be a member of a group (and accordingly for whom the group takes on a sacred status). Others consider political institutions to be sacred in their own right but this is hardly a tenable position: if humanity did not exist such institutions would be meaningless and hence can only gain their meaning from our existence. The key question that divides political philosophers returns to whether it is the group or the individual that should be the political unit of analysis.
The language used by the opposing thinkers to describe the political primacy of their entity (that is, individual or group) alters throughout history depending on other competing or complementing concepts; but today the division is best characterized by the “rights of the individual” versus the “rights of the group.” Other appropriate terms include: the dignity of the individual; the duties and obligations owing to the group; the autonomy or self-determination of the group or individual – and these in turn resolve into particular and applied issues concerning the role of cultural, racial, religious, and sexual orientations. In political theory courses, the debate proceeds today between communitarians and liberals who debate the middle ground of rights and obligations as they stretch between groups and individuals.
This caricature of extremes enables us to consider the differences and the points of agreement between the several schools of political philosophy in a better light. But as with generalizations made of historical events, the details are much more complicated and subtle. This is because the application of philosophy in the political realm necessarily deals with social institutions, and since people are sociable – indeed could hardly be said to be human if we possessed no society or culture – both extremes must examine and evaluate the social-ethical realms of selfhood, friendship, family, property, exchange, money (that is, indirect exchange), community, tribe, race, association, and the state (and its various branches) – and accordingly the individual’s relationship with each.
In pursuing a philosophical examination of political activity, philosophers also divide between those who are methodological individualists and those who are methodological holists. Methodological individualists seek to explain social actions and behavior in terms of individual action – and politically are known as individualists, whereas holists seek to explain behavior by considering the nature of the group. The bifurcation results from a metaphysical division on the appropriate unit of study. In contrast to methodological individualists, who claim that a society (or culture, people, nation) is no more than the sum of its living members, holists argue that the whole is greater than the sum of the parts, which in the political realm is translated into the state being greater than the citizenry, or the race, folk, or people being greater than the individual; politically, holism translates into the general theory known as “collectivism,” and all collectivist theories deny or lessen the value and authority of the individual in relation to the higher status accorded a collective entity. Methodological individualism translates into political individualism, in which the individual’s cultural or group membership is either rejected completely as not worthy of study or its causal or scientific relationship is deemed too amorphous or pluralistic and changing to provide anything by qualitative assessments of social affairs.
Simmering in the background, it must also be noted, are theological-political philosophies that deny any primacy to the individual or to the group in favor of the supreme status of the divine realm. Yet these too must also split between individualist and holist conceptions of the individual (or of the soul) and for our purposes here can be said to follow the same dialogue as secular oriented political philosophers. Once theologians admit to having to have some kind of government or rule for the living on earth, the general debate of political philosophy can be admitted and expounded upon to define the good life for people amongst people.
A second important methodological issue that relates both to epistemology as well as to ethics is the role that reason plays in social affairs. The extreme positions may be characterized as rationalism and irrationalism, but the descriptions are not necessarily logical opposites. A rationalist may declare his belief in rationalism to be ultimately irrational (for example, Karl Popper), and an irrationalist may act rationally.
Political rationalism emphasizes the employment of reason in social affairs: that is, individuals ought to submit to the logic and universality of reason rather than their own subjective or cultural preconceptions. Rationalists argue that reason unifies humanity politically and hence is a conducive vehicle to peace. Irrationalists, on the other hand, downplay the efficacy of reason in our human affairs or more particularly in our social affairs. In turn, a broad range of alternatives are put forward in reason’s stead: emotions; cultural, religious, or class expectations; atavistic symbols; or mystical forms of intuition or knowledge. Irrationalists of all hues can also criticize rationalists for ignoring the subtle wisdom of intellectual and social heritage that often lies beneath contemporary society or which is deemed necessary for the reasoning mind; politically, they consider the demands of reason to be rationalizations of a particular culture (usually the criticism is leveled against the West) rather than demands that are universal or universalizable claiming that political solutions that appear rational to one group cannot necessarily be translated as solutions for another group.
Some irrationalists uphold polylogism – the theory that there are (or ought to be) more than one form of logic, which ultimately collapses into an epistemological subjectivism. That is, tribal logic is predicated on the separateness or distinctiveness of particular groups’ logic or methods of discourse and thinking. However, other irrationalists deny that the human mind develops alternative logics around the world, but that human action does develop alternative methods of living in different places and from different historical circumstances. Politically this stance translates into conservativism, a philosophical stance that is skeptical of rationalist designs (say to overthrow all political institutions so as to begin ‘afresh’ according to some utopian blueprint) and which emphasizes the continuity of wisdom – as contained in institutions and the language of politics – over the generations and in specific localities.
To return to the epistemological problems facing holism, the existence of overlapping loyalties that often characterize groups presents a strong criticism against collectivist doctrines: which group ought to be the subject of analysis when an individual belongs to more than one sociological entity? (Marx, for instance, based his philosophy on class analysis but did not give any precision to the term ‘class’.) If an epistemological relativism is permitted, say in the field of logic (“European logic is different from American”), further analysis must permit more particular gradations (“German logic is different from French logic” and “Bavarian logic is different from Schleswig-Holstein logic”) until one reaches the final thinking agent – the individual (“Franz’s logic is different from Katja’s”). The rationalist aspires to avoid such fractional implications of polylogism by maintaining the unity of human logic. Yet, if the rationalist is also an individualist, the paradox arises that individuals are united into the collective whole of rational beings (all individuals share reason), whereas irrationalism collapses into a plurality of individualistic epistemologies (all groups are ultimately composed of subjectivists).
Nonetheless, between individualists (who emphasize the sacred status of the individual) and collectivists (who emphasize the sacred status of the group) exist a panoply of schools of thought that derive their impetus from the philosophical shades – the gray overlapping areas, which are today found in the perpetual disputes between individualists and communitarians.
Having illuminated some of the extremes that characterize political philosophy with regards to method and terminology, the major schools of thought can be introduced. What will be noted is not just to which end of the methodological spectrum the school leans, but also its implied connections to ethics. Similarly, other aspects need to be elucidated: does the school emphasize the primacy of reason in social affairs, or does it underplay the role of reason in political affairs in favor of the forces of history, heritage, emotional or tribal predispositions?
The term “liberalism” conveys two distinct positions in political philosophy, the one a pro-individualist theory of people and government, the second a pro-statist or what is better termed a “social democratic” conception. Students of political philosophy ought to be aware of the two schools of thought that reside under the same banner to avoid philosophical confusions that can be resolved by a clarification of terms. The “Great Switch,” as cultural historian Jacques Barzun notes, took place in the late Nineteenth Century, a switch which was the product of shifting the political ground towards socialist or social democratic policies under the banner of liberal parties and politics.
Etymologically, the former is the sounder description since liberalism is derived from the word “liberty,” that is, freedom and toleration rather than notions of justice and intervention that took on board in the Twentieth Century. Yet, the pro-statist connotation pervades modern thinking so much so that it is difficult to separate its notions from the previous meanings without re-classifying one or the other. The former is often referred to as ‘classical liberalism’ leaving the latter unchanged or adapted to “social democratic liberalism,” which is a rather confusing mouthful; “modern liberalism” is an easier term to wield and shall be used unless the emphasis is laid upon the socialist leanings of such modern liberals.
In the broadest, presently popularly accepted term the modern liberal accepts rights against the person and rights to entitlements such as health care and education. The two positions do not sit well philosophically however, for they produce a host of potential and recurrent inconsistencies and contradictions that can only be resolved by stretching the definition of freedom to include the freedom to succeed (or freedom to resources) rather than the freedom to try. This sometimes generates difficult and perhaps insurmountable problems for those who seek to merge the classical and modern doctrines; nonetheless, the (modern) liberal project is actively pursued by modern thinkers such as J.S. Mill, John Rawls, Will Kymlicka, Ronald Dworkin and others. For these writers, the historical emphasis on toleration, plurality and justice underscore their work; they differ on their interpretation of toleration, public and private roles, and the perceived need for opportunities to be created or not. Some modern liberals, however, do try to remove themselves from classical liberalism (for example, Kymlicka) and therefore become more like ‘social democrats’, that is, humanitarians of a socialist bent who assert the primacy of minorities and even individuals to partake freely in the democratic processes and political dialogues, or whose emphasis on equality demands an active and interventionist state that classical liberals would reject.
Dworkin, for example, claims justice is the essential motif of liberalism and that the state’s duty is to ensure a just and fair opportunity for all to compete and flourish in a civil society. That may require active state intervention in some areas – areas that classical liberals would reject as being inadmissible in a free economy. Dworkin’s position emanates from Aristotle’s ethical argument that for a person to pursue the good life he requires a certain standard of living. Poverty is not conducive to pursuing the contemplative life, hence many modern liberals are attracted to redistributive or welfare policies. Such fairness in opportunity to create equal opportunities underpins John Stuart Mill’s liberalism for example. However, the modern liberal’s emphasis on equality is criticized by classical liberals who argue that people are neither born equal nor can be made equal: talents (and motivation) are distributed unequally across a population, which means that attempts to reduce men and women to the same status will imply a reduction in the ability (or freedom) of the more talented to act and to strive for their own progression. Similarly, the modern liberal’s criticism of inherited wealth is chastised as being misplaced: although the policy connects well to the desire to ensure an equal start for all, not all parents’ gifts to their children are monetary in nature. Indeed, some, following Andrew Carnegie’s self-help philosophy, may contend that monetary inheritances can be counter-productive, fostering habits of dependency.
Both modern and classical liberals may refer to the theory of a social contract to justify either their emphasis on the free realm of the individual or the fostering of those conditions liberals in general deem necessary for human flourishing. Classical liberals derive their theory of the social contract initially from Thomas Hobbes’s model (in Leviathan) in which individuals in a state of nature would come together to form a society. Liberals of both variations have never believed such a contract ever took place, but use the model to assess the present status of society according to criteria they believe the contract should include. Hobbes leaned towards a more authoritarian version of the contract in which individuals give up all political rights (except that of self-preservation which he sees as a natural, inalienable right) to the sovereign political body whose primary duty is to ensure the peace; John Locke leaned towards a more limited government (but one that could justly take the alienable life of an aggressor); Rousseau sought a thoroughly democratic vision of the social contract; and more recently Rawls has entertained what rights and entitlements a social contract committee would allot themselves if they had no knowledge and hence prejudices of each other.
Both classical and modern liberals agree that the government has a strict duty towards impartiality and hence to treating people equally, and that it should also be neutral in its evaluation of what the good life is. This neutrality is criticized by non-liberals who claim that the assumed neutrality is in fact a reflection of a specific vision of human nature or progress, and although critics disagree what that vision may entail, their claim prompts liberals to justify the underlying assumption that promotes them to accept such issues as: equal treatment by the law and by the state; liberty to pursue one’s life as one sees fit; the right to private property, and so on.
Nonetheless, broad liberalism accepts and emphasizes that people ought to be tolerant towards their fellow men and women. The modern importance of toleration stems from the Renaissance and post-Reformation reactions to the division in the Church and the ensuing persecutions against heterodoxy. Freedom in religious belief extends to other realms of human activity that do not negatively affect neighbors, for example in sexual or romantic activities, the consumption of narcotics, and the perusal of pornography. But what is philosophically more important is that the liberal doctrine of toleration permits the acceptance of errors – that in pursuing the ethical good life and hence the appropriate political life, people may make mistakes and should be permitted to learn and adapt as they see fit; or, alternatively, that people have a right to live in ignorance or to pursue knowledge as they think best. This is held in common with political conservatives who are somewhat more pessimistic and skeptical of our abilities than most liberals. Classical and modern liberals do unite in expressing a skepticism towards experts knowing what is in the best interest of others, and thus liberals tend to reject any interference in people’s lives as unjustifiable and, from utilitarian point of view, counter-productive. Life, for the liberal, should be led from the inside (self-oriented) rather than outside (other- imposed); but modern liberals add that individuals ought to be provided with the resources to ensure that they can live the good life as they see fit. The classical liberal retort is who will provide those resources and to what age should people be deemed incapable of learning or striving by themselves?
Despite such differences over policy, liberals – of both the social democratic and classical strain – predominantly hold an optimistic view of human nature. In modern philosophy the position is derived from Locke’s psychological theory from An Essay on Human Understanding that people are born without innate ideas and hence his environment, upbringing, and experiences fashion him: for classical liberals this implies a thorough rejection of inherited elitism and hence of supposed natural political hierarchies in which power resided with dynasties; for modern liberals this implies the potential for forging appropriate conditions for any individual to gain a proper education and opportunities.
Liberals applaud those institutions that reason sustains as being conducive to human freedoms: classical liberals emphasizing those institutions that protect the negative freedoms (rights against aggression and theft) and social democratic liberals the positive freedoms (rights to a certain standard of living). If an institution is lacking according to a critical and rational analysis – failing in its duty to uphold a certain liberal value – then it is to be reorganized for the empowerment of humanity. At this juncture, liberals also divide between deontological (Rawls) and utilitarian theorists (Mill). Most classical liberals ascribe to a general form of utilitarianism in which social institutions are to be reorganized along lines of benefiting the greatest number. This attracts criticism from conservatives and deontologists – according to what ends? – according to whose analysis? – comprising which people? and so on. Deontologists are not precluded from supporting liberalism (Immanuel Kant is the most influential thinker in that regard), for they hold that the proper society and hence political institutions should generate those rules and institutions that are right in themselves, regardless of the particular presumed ends we are seeking (for example, happiness).
Modern liberals lean towards a more interventionist government, and as such they place more emphasis on the ability of the state to produce the right political sphere for humanity and thusly emphasize reform projects more than classical liberals or conservatives. Peace, to choose one example, could be brought to warring peoples or natives if only they admit to the clearly defined and rational proposals of the liberal creed – that is, they should release themselves from parochial prejudices and superstitions and submit to the cosmopolitanism of liberal toleration and peace. The variants here – as in the host of applied subjects – are broad ranging: some liberals espouse the need to secure peace through the provision of a healthy standard of living (effected by appropriate redistribution policies from rich countries to poor); others promote the free market as a necessary condition for the growth of the so-called “soft morals” of commerce; while others emphasize the need for dialogue and mutual understanding through multi-cultural educational programs. These kind of programs, the modern liberals argue, ideally should be implemented by the world community through international bodies such as the UN rather than unilaterally which could arouse complaints against imperialist motives; however, once the beneficial classical or modern liberal framework is created, the state and political institutions ought to remain ethically neutral and impartial: the state is to be separated from imposing itself on or subsidizing any belief system, cultural rites, forms of behavior or consumption (so long as they do not interfere in the lives of others).
The liberal seeks the best form of government which will permit the individual to pursue life as he or she sees fit within a neutral framework, and it is the possibility of a neutral framework that critics challenge the liberal ideal.
This approach plays down the unifying or omniscient implications of liberalism and its unifying rationalism and thus accords institutions or modes of behavior that have weathered the centuries a greater respect than liberals. Politically, philosophical conservatives are cautious in tampering with forms of political behavior and institutions and they are especially skeptical of whole scale reforms; they err on the side of tradition, but not for tradition’s sake, but from a skeptical view of our human ability to redesign whole ranges of social values that have evolved over and adapted to many generations; detrimental values will, conservatives reason, fall into disuses of their own accord.
The first issue facing the conservative is: what ought to be secured (against, say, a popular but misguided temporary rebellion)? How long does an institution have to exist before it gains the respect of the philosophical conservative? Here, the philosopher must refer to a deeper level of analysis and proceed to question the nature and purpose of the institution in light of some standard. Liberalism turns to reason, which is broadly accepted as the unifying element to human societies, but conservatives believe that reason can be highly overestimated for it belongs to single individuals and hence to their own political motives, errors, prejudices and so on.
Conservatives typically possess a pessimistic vision of human nature, drawing on the modern tradition, on Hobbes’s belief, that were it not for strong institutions, men would be at each others’ throats and would constantly view one another with deep suspicion. (Their emphasis is thus not on the ensuing hypothetical pacifying social contract but on the prevalence of fear in human society). Conservatives are highly skeptical of power and man’s desire to use it, for they believe that in time it corrupts even the most freedom loving wielders: hence, the potential accession to any position of supreme power over others, whether in the guise of a national or international chamber, is to be rejected as being just as dangerous a state as Hobbes’s vision of the anarchic state of nature. Conservatives thus applaud those institutions that check the propensity for the stronger or the megalomaniacal to command power: conservatives magnify the suspicion one may hold of one’s neighbor. Critics – for example, of an anarchist or socialist strain – claim that such fears are a product of the presiding social environment and its concomitant values and are not the product of human nature or social intercourse per se. Such opponents emphasize the need to reform society to release people from a life of fear, which conservatives in turn consider a utopian pipe dream unbefitting a realistic political philosophy.
For conservatives, the value of institutions cannot always be examined according to the rational analysis of the present generation. This imposes a demand on conservatism to explain or justify the rationale of supporting historical institutions. Previously, conservatives implicitly or explicitly reverted to the myths of our human or of a particular culture’s origins to give present institutions a sacred status – or at least a status worthy of respect; however, evolutionary thinkers from the Scottish Enlightenment (for example, Adam Ferguson), whose insights noted the trial and error nature of cultural (and hence moral and institutional) developments generated a more precise and historically ratifiable examination of institutions and morals – see the work of Friedrich Hayek especially.
Accordingly, in contrast to many liberals, conservatives decry the notion of a social contract – or even its possibility in a modern context. Since societies evolve and develop through time, present generations possess duties and responsibilities whose origins and original reasons may now be lost to us, but which, for some thinkers, still require our acceptance. Justifying this is problematic for the conservative: present cultural xenophobia may emanate from past aggressions against the nation’s territory and may not serve any present purpose in a more commercial atmosphere; or present racism may emerge from centuries of fearful mythologies or again violent incursions that no longer are appropriate. But conservatives reply that since institutions and morals evolve, their weaknesses and defects will become apparent and thereby will gradually be reformed (or merely dropped) as public pressure against them changes. What the conservative opposes is the potential absolutist position of either the liberal or the socialist who considers a form of behavior or an institution to be valid and hence politically binding for all time.
Conservatives thus do not reject reform but are thoroughly skeptical of any present generation’s or present person’s ability to understand and hence to reshape the vast edifices of behavior and institutions that have evolved with the wisdom of thousands of generations. They are thus skeptical of large scale planning, whether it be constitutional or economical or cultural. Against socialists who become impatient with present defects, the conservatives counsel patience: not for its own sake, but because the vast panoply of institutions that are rallied against – including human nature – cannot be reformed without the most detrimental effects. Conservatives – following Edmund Burke – thus typically condemn revolutions and coups as leading to more bloodshed and violence than that which the old regime produced.
Some conservatives argue that a modicum of redistribution is required to ensure a peaceful non-revolutionary society. Whereas modern liberals justify redistribution on the grounds of providing an initial basis for human development, conservatives possess a pragmatic fear of impoverished masses rising up to overthrow the status quo and its hierarchy stems from the conservative reaction to the French Revolution. The conservative critique by Edmund Burke was particularly accurate and prescient, yet the Revolution also served to remind the political hierarchy of its obligations (noblesse oblige) to the potentially violent masses that the revolt had stirred up. The lesson has not been lost on modern conservative thinkers who claim that the state has certain obligations to the poor – including perhaps the provision of education and health facilities, or at least the means to secure them. In contrast to socialists though (with whom some conservatives may agree with a socialized system of poor relief), conservatives generally prefer to emphasize local and delegated redistribution schemes (perhaps even of a wholly voluntary nature) rather than central, state directed schemes.
In affinity with classical liberals, conservatives often emphasize the vital importance of property rights in social relations. Liberals tend to lean towards the utilitarian benefits that accrue from property rights (for example, a better distribution of resources than common ownership or a method of providing incentives for further innovation and production), whereas conservatives stress the role private property in terms of its ability to check the power of the state or any other individual who seeks power. Conservatives see private property as a sacred, intrinsically valuable cornerstone to a free and prosperous society.
The broad distribution of private property rights complements the conservative principle that individuals and local communities are better assessors of their own needs and problems than distant bureaucrats. Since conservatives are inherently skeptical of the state, they prefer alternative social associations to support, direct, and assist the maturation of civilized human beings, for example, the family, private property, religion, as well as the individual’s freedom to make his own mistakes.
Conservatives of the English Whig tradition (Locke, Shaftesbury) have much in common with classical liberals, whereas conservatives of the English Tory tradition have more in common with modern liberals, agreeing to some extent with the need for state intervention but on pragmatic rather than necessary grounds. Those of the Whig tradition accordingly ally themselves more with individualism and rationalism than Tory conservatives, who emphasize community and ‘one-nation’ politics and its corresponding duties and responsibilities for the individual. The two, initially opposing doctrines, merged politically in the late Nineteenth Century as liberalism shifted its ground to incorporate socialist policies: the two sides of conservativism enjoyed a particularly visible and vocal clash in the late Twentieth Century in the political reign of Margaret Thatcher in the United Kingdom.
The term “socialist” describes a broad range of ideas and proposals that are held together by a central overarching tenet: the central ownership and control of the means of production – either because central ownership is deemed more efficient and/or more moral. Secondly, socialists agree that capitalism (free-market conservativism or liberalism) is morally and hence politically flawed. Thirdly, some socialists of the Marxist persuasion argue that socialism is the final historical era that supplants capitalism before proper communism emerges (that is, a “historicist” conception). This section will focus on the first two claims.
Politically, socialists claim that the free market system (capitalism) should be replaced or reformed, with most arguing for a radical redistribution of resources (usually to “workers” – that is, those socialists deem who do not presently own anything) and for the state or some form of democratic institution to take over the running of the economy. In the aftermath of Communism’s collapse – which is a point of conjecture amongst the historicist Marxist wing as to whether the Soviet system was truly communist or socialist – many socialists abandoned state ownership and control of economic resources in favor of alternative projects that proposed to be more flexible, democratic and decentralized. Economists of the Austrian school (notably Ludwig Mises and Friedrich Hayek) had long predicted the inexorable collapse of socialism because of its inability in the absence of market generated price mechanisms to plan resource distribution and consumption efficiently or effectively. Socialist economists such as Oskar Lange accepted the important critique and challenge but pushed on with state controlled policies in the belief that theoretically the markets’ prioritization of values through prices could by replaced by complex economic modeling: for example, Leontieff input-output models in which priorities are given values by either the central authorities, or in more modern turns with the socialist movement, by more decentralized institutions such as worker co-operatives.
Despite the empirical challenge of the collapse of the Soviet system – and more importantly the failure of centrally controlled economies throughout the West and the Third World, socialists have rallied to parade alternative conceptions of the communal ownership and control of resources. Market socialism, for instance, tolerates a predominantly market system but demands that certain ‘essential’ resources be controlled by the state. These may then act to direct the general economy along politically desirable roads: for example, expanding technology companies, educational and health services, or the economic and physical infrastructure of the nation. Others argue that while markets should predominate, the state should control only the investment industry. However, the economists’ critique that state intervention produces not only an inefficient outcome but also an outcome that the planners themselves do not desire is extendable to all instances of intervention – and especially any interventions in investment, where the complexity of the price mechanism deals not just with consumers’ and producers’ present preferences but also their more subtle intertemporal preferences for present and future consumption.
In the face of a growing indictment (and unpopularity) of central planning, many socialists have preferred instead to concentrate on altering the presiding property relationships demanding that companies be given over to the workers rather the assumed exploitative capitalist classes. Resources, most socialists claim, need to be radically redistributed.
Worker control socialism (worker control capitalism) sees the way forward through worker owned and operated businesses, usually small-scale and run on a democratic basis. Legislative proposals that demand more discussion and agreement between management and staff are a reflection of such beliefs. However, the policy to give control to the workers presumes (a) the workers are a definable class deserving of a greater moral and hence political status than presently they are assumed to enjoy (which ethically would have to be established) and (b) that the workers are permanently in a condition of being either employed or exploited (perhaps by the same commercial concerns) and that they themselves do not wish to or actually do set up their own businesses or move between employees. An individual can at the same time be an employer, an employee, a worker and a capitalist and since individuals can move between the economic classes scientific precision is reduced and even abandoned.
The strongest critique of socialist plans for the redistribution of income – coming from within and without the camp’s discussions – is on what moral or political criteria resources ought to be distributed. The pervading clarion call of Marx that resources ought to be distributed from each according to his ability to each according to his need does not offer any guide as to what should constitute a need. Social democrats may point to the disabled as deserving resources they are not in a position – through no fault of their own – to attain; but psychological disorders can be just as debilitating. Others generate more complex arguments. For example, the deserving are those who have historically been persecuted. But this raises the problem of how far back in history one ought to proceed as well as a host of ethical ramifications of being born either guilty (and somehow deserving moral and economic reprobation) or needy (and somehow deserving unearned resources – which certainly presents a paradox for most socialists, who in Nineteenth Century Europe castigated the aristocratic classes for their unearned incomes).
The gravest criticism leveled against all arguments for a redistribution of resources, even assuming that the criteria could be agreed upon, is that, in the absence of perpetual and strict controls resources will eventually become unevenly distributed; Robert Nozick presents a strong challenge to socialists in his Anarchy, State, and Utopia, asking what would be wrong with a voluntary redistribution in favor of say, supporting an excellent basketball player, which would result in an uneven distribution. Socialists may thus either have to accept the persistence of continual redistribution of incomes and resources within a given band of tolerance, or to accept a permanent inequality of income and resource ownership once voluntary exchanges are allowed. Faced with such criticisms, socialists can resort to arguments against the morality of capitalism or the free market.
The initial unequal distribution of talent, energy, skills, and resources is not something that socialists usually focus their moral critique upon. Rather they comment on the historical developments that led to an unequal distribution of wealth in favor of some individuals or nations. War and exploitation by the powerful, they argue, unfurled an immoral distribution, which reformers would prefer to correct so as to build society on a more moral basis: not all would claim that socialism then becomes necessary (or that socialism provides the only evaluation of historical injustices); but socialists often refer to the historical injustices that have kept the down trodden and meek poor and oppressed as a justification for present reforms or critique of the status quo. Proposals are wide-ranging on how a society should redistribute resources as are the proposals to ensure present and future generations are permitted at least equal access to a specified standard of living or opportunities – here moderates overlap with left wing or social democratic liberals and pragmatic conservatives, who believe in the primacy of freedom but with a modicum of redistribution to ensure that all children get a fair start in life.
Defining fairness, however, is problematic for all socialists: it brings to the fore the issues outlined above – of what standards and policies and justifications are appropriate. If socialists depart from such intricacies they can assert that capitalism is morally flawed at its core – say, from its motivational or ethical underpinnings. The most popular criticism leveled against capitalism (or classical liberalism) is the unethical or selfish material pursuit of wealth and riches. Socialists often decry the ethical paucity of material values or those values that are assumed to characterize the capitalist world: competition and profit seeking and excessive individualism. Socialists prefer collective action over individual action, or at least individual action that is supportive of group rather than personal or selfish values. Nonetheless, most socialists shy away from espousing an anti-materialist philosophy; unlike environmentalists (see below): most support the pursuit of wealth but only when created by and for the working class (or in less Marxist terminology, the underrepresented, the underdog, the oppressed, or the general “poor”). They are often driven by a vision of a new golden age of riches that pure socialism will generate (how that will be so without the price mechanism is the subject of socialist economics). Some, however, do desire a lower standard of living for all – for the return to a simpler, collective life of earlier days; these socialists perceive a better life to be held in a medieval socialism of local trade patterns and guilds. Such ascetically leaning socialists have much in common with environmentalism.
Regardless of the moral problem of perpetual unequal distributions, socialists have an optimistic vision of what we can be – perhaps not what he now is (exploitative or oppressed), but of what he is capable of once society is reformed along socialist lines. Marxists, for example, assume that inconsistent or hypocritical bourgeois values will disappear; in their stead, any class-based morality will disappear (for class distinctions will disappear) but the particularities of what will guide ethical behavior is not readily explored – Marx avoided the topic, except to say that men will consider each other as men and not as working class or bourgeois. Most assume that socialism will end the need for family, religion, private property and selfishness – all opiates of the unawakened masses that keep them in a state of false consciousness: accordingly, free love, resources, food for all, unhindered talent and personal development, and enlightened collectivism will rule. The rejection of all authority that some in the socialist camp foresee is something they have in common with anarchists.
Anarchy stems from the Greek word, anarkos, meaning “without a chief.” Its political meaning is a social and political system without a state or more broadly a society that is characterized by a lack of any hierarchical or authoritarian structures. The general approach of the anarchist is to emphasize that the good life can only be lived without constraining or limiting structures. Any institution or morality that is inconsistent with the life freely chosen is to be attacked, criticized, and rejected. What is therefore the crucial issue for anarchists is defining what constitutes genuinely artificial impediments and structures from those that are the product of nature or of voluntary activities.
Major anarchist thinkers include William Godwin, Max Stirner, Leo Tolstoy, Proudhon, Bakunin, Kropotkin, and recent libertarian and conservative thinkers who lean to anarchism such as Hans Hermann Hoppe and Murray Rothbard.
Various branches of anarchism emphasize different aspects of the protracted leaderless society: utopian versions look forward to a universal egalitarianism in which each is to count for one and no more than one, and accordingly each person’s values are of equal moral and political weighting. (Utopian anarchists in the Nineteenth Century experimented with a variety of small communities that on the whole had short lives.) But the notion of egalitarianism is rejected by those anarchists who are more sympathetic to the rugged individualism of the American frontier and of the individual who seeks the quiet, private life of seclusion living close to nature.
Max Stirner, for example, rejects any kind of limitation on the action of the individual, including social structures that may evolve spontaneously – for example, parental authority, money, legal institutions (for example, common law), and property rights; Proudhon, on the other hand, argues for a society of small enterprising co-operatives. The co-operative movement often attracts those with collectivist leanings but who seek to move away from the potentially authoritarian model of typical socialism. In contrast, libertarian thinkers who support the free market have proposed anarchic solutions to economic and political problems: they stress the voluntaristic nature of the market system as a moral as well as an efficient means of distributing resources and accordingly condemn state failure to provide adequate resources (health care and education but also police and defense services); the so-called public goods and services, they assert, ought to be provided privately through the free market.
Regardless of the political direction that the anarchist leans towards (collectivism or individualism), how the anarchic community is to be secured presents philosophical problems that demand a close regard to possible inconsistencies. Historicist anarchists believe that anarchy is the ultimate state that humanity is (inevitably) ascending towards – they agree with Marx’s general theory of history that history (and the future) divides into convenient eras which are characterized by a movement towards less authority in life (that is, the gradual displacement of authoritarian or socially divisive structures), and that this movement is inexorable. Radical anarchists claim that the future can only be fought for, and any imposition of authority on an individual’s actions is to be defended against – their calls extend to anarchists actively undermining, disrupting and dismantling the apparatus of the coercive state; those on the libertarian wing stress that only government coerces whereas those more sympathetic to socialism’s moral critique of capitalism emphasize the oppressive nature of multinational companies and of global capitalism. While some anarchists are pacifistic in their rejection of authority (drawing on Gandhi’s conduct against British rule in India), others condone the use of violence to secure their freedom from external coercion. In common with modern liberal and with some socialists and conservatives, some branches of anarchism reject the material world and economic progress as being innately valuable. Anarchists who rail against economic progress (or “global capitalism”) as somehow limiting their choices seek alternative ends to their political utopia, one which has much in common with the final political theory examined: environmentalism.
Beyond the traditional ethical disputes concerning the good life for human beings and what political situation would best suit our development, others take up an alternative conception of humanity and its relationship with the living world. Broadly termed “environmentalist,” this political philosophy does not concern itself with the rights of people or of society, but of the rights of the planet and other species.
The political philosophies of liberalism, socialism, conservativism and anarchism – and all of their variants – agree that the good life sought by political philosophy ought to be the good life for human beings. Their respective criticism of political practice and mores stem from a competing standard of what ought to constitute the good life for us. Feminists, for example, within the four man pro-human political theories argue for more (or different) rights and duties towards women; resident interventionists in the liberal and conservative clubs claim that political control over some means of production may enhance the opportunities for some hitherto underrepresented or disempowered folk; similarly, welfarists propose universal standards of living for all, to be secured by the their respective beliefs in collective or voluntaristic associations. However, environmentalism starts on a different premise: human beings are not the center of our politics – nature is.
At the beginning, it was noted that for argument’s sake that theologically based political philosophies must come to terms or propose standards by which to judge a person’s life on earth. Hence they enter the traditional debates of how people (Christian, Muslim, Jew, Sikh, Hindu, and so forth) ought to relate to his fellow human being and through what kind of institutions. Environmentalism, however, considers our place on earth to be of secondary importance to that of the natural world. In its weaker forms, environmentalism claims that human beings are custodians of nature, to whom we must show respect and perhaps even certain ethical and political obligations (obligations akin to those some theological positions hold of people to their God) to the natural world. This implies that people are accorded an equal ethical status as that of other living species – he is seen as a primus inter pares. In its stronger form, however, environmentalism condemns the very existence of humanity as a blot on the landscape – as the perennial destroyer of all that is good, for all that is good cannot, according to this position, be a product of human beings; people are the source of unending evils committed against the world. In terms of the grand vista of intellectual history, environmentalism stems from several anti-human or anti-secular traditions that reach back three millennia. Eastern religions developed theories of innate human wickedness (or nature’s innate goodness) that filtered through to the West via Pythagorean mysticism and later Christian asceticism and Franciscan variations on a pro-nature theme. Applied issues that provoke its ire include pollution, vivisection, hunting, the domestication of animals, the eating of meat, and the desecration of the landscape.
Generally, environmentalists distinguish themselves from conservationists who, from various positions along the spectrum of political theory, argue that landscapes or animals ought to be protected from extinction only if they are beneficial or pleasing to humanity in some form or other. Environmentalists reject such human-centered utilitarianism in favor of a broad ethical intrinsicism – the theory that all species possess an innate value independent of any other entity’s relationship to them. Criticisms leveled against this argument begin with asking what the moral relationship between a predator and its victim is or ought to be – does the mouse have a right not to be caught by the cat and is the cat a murderer for killing the mouse? And if this cannot be justified or even ethically explained does it not follow that when people stand in an analogous relationship to the animals we hunt and domesticate then we too should not be judged as a murderer for eating meat and wearing fur? The central issue for environmentalists and their animal rights supporting brethren is to explain the moral relationship between human and beast and the resulting asymmetrical justifications and judgments leveled against humanity: that is, according to the environmentalists’ general ethical position, it is morally appropriate, so to speak, for the lion to hunt the gazelle or the ant to milk the caterpillar, but not for people to hunt the fox or milk the cow – and likewise, it can be asked whether it is morally appropriate for the wild-cat or bear to attack people but not for people to defend themselves?
The political philosophy of environmentalism then turns on creating the proper structures for human social life in this context. The weaker form demands, for example, that he stops pillaging the earth’s resources by either prohibiting further exploitation or at least slowing the rate at which he is presently doing so: sustainable resource management is at the center of such environmentalism, although it is a political-economic theory that is also picked up by the other pro-human philosophies. Environmentalists theoretically can differ on what political-economic system can best fit their demands, but one advocate (Stewart Brand writing in The Whole Earth Catalogue) argues that people should return to a “Stone Age, where we might live like Indians in our valley, with our localism, our appropriate technology, our gardens, our homemade religion.” However, the demographic and economic implications are apparently missed by such advocates: to return to a Neolithic state, humanity would have to divest itself of the complex division of labor it has produced with the expansion of its population and education. Effectively, this would imply a reduction in the human population to Neolithic numbers of a million or so for the entire planet. The fact that this would require the demise of five billion people should be addressed: what would justify the return to the supposed Eden and what methods would be appropriate? Brand begins his argument thus: “We have wished…for a disaster or for a social change to come and bomb us into the Stone Age…” Genocidal campaigns are justifiable according to those who assert that their population (culture, nation, race, religion) ought to be the sole residing group on the planet – an assertion hotly contended by other groups of course and those who expound the rights of individuals to pursue a life free of coercion, which leaves environmentalism to explain why people must suffer and even die for its ends. The proffered justifications often stem from a rejection of any rights for human beings.
Environmentalism extends rights to – or duties towards – other species which range extended beyond those animals closest to natural and cultural human sympathies. Rats, insects, and snails have been championed by various lobbies seeking to protect animals from human incursions. Utilitarians of the traditional political schools may agree with such proposals as being useful for humanity (say for future generations), but environmentalists prefer to remove ‘human beings’ from the equation and deposit inalienable rights on such non-human entities regardless of their relationship to humanity. Since animals are not ethical beings, environmentalists have a difficult task explaining why a snail darter possesses a greater right to live on the planet over a human. A solution is that our ethical and political capacities in fact negate our moral status: the fact that we can reason and hence comprehend the import of our actions implies that we are not to be trusted for we can willingly commit evil. An animal is a-moral in that regard: it kills, eats other entities, adapts to and changes its environment, breeds and pollutes, but it possesses no conception of what it does. For the environmentalist this accords non-human species a higher moral status. Animals act and react and there is no evil in this, but people think and therein lies the source of our immorality. From this premise, all human creations can be universally condemned as unethical.
The main political theories assume the ethical and hence political primacy of humanity – at least on this planet – and accordingly proceed to define what they consider the most appropriate institutions for human survival, development, morality and happiness. Environmentalism differs from this approach but all the political theories sketched out in this article are governed by and are dependent on ethical theories of human nature as it relates to the world and to others. Because political theory predominantly deals with human social nature, it must also deal with human individuality as well as our relationships to groups – with one’s sense of self as a political and ethical entity as well as one’s need and sense to belong to overarching identities. The major theories provoke in turn a vast range of discussion and debate on the subtleties of such issues as the law, economy, freedom, gender, nationality, violence, war, rebellion and sacrifice, as well as on the grander visions of our proper political realm (utopianism) and the criticism of present institutions from the local to the international level. The present mainstream debate between communitarianism and liberalism certainly offers the student a fertile ground for examining the nuances generated in the clash between collectivism and individualism, but alternative as well as historical political theories ought not to be ignored: they too still provoke and attract debate.
Last updated: April 25, 2005 | Originally published: April/7/2002
Categories: Political Philosophy