Knowledge

Philosophy’s history of reflection upon knowledge is a history of theses and theories; but no less of questions, concepts, distinctions, syntheses, and taxonomies. All of these will appear in this article. They generate, colour, and refine these philosophical theses and theories about knowledge. The results are epistemological — philosophical attempts to understand whatever is most fundamentally understandable about the nature and availability of knowledge. We will gain a sense of what philosophers have thought knowledge is and might be, along with why some philosophers have thought knowledge both does not and could not exist.

Thus, we will examine some of the general kinds or forms of knowledge that epistemologists have thought it important to highlight (section 1), followed by the idea of knowledge as a kind or phenomenon at all (section 2). Knowledge seems to be something we gain as we live; how do we gain it, though? That will be our next question (section 3), before we ask whether our apparently gaining knowledge is an illusion: might no one ever really gain knowledge (section 4)? Answers to these questions could reflect finer details of knowledge’s constituents (section 5), including the standards involved in knowing (section 6). The article ends by asking about the fundamental point of having knowledge (section 7).

Table of Contents

  1. Kinds of Knowledge
    1. Knowing by Acquaintance
    2. Knowledge-That
    3. Knowledge-Wh
    4. Knowing-How
  2. Knowledge as a Kind
  3. Ways of Knowing
    1. Innate Knowledge
    2. Observational Knowledge
    3. Knowing Purely by Thinking
  4. Knowing by Thinking-Plus-Observing
  5. Sceptical Doubts about Knowing
  6. Understanding Knowledge?
    1. The Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge
    2. Not the Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge?
    3. Questioning the Gettier Problem
  7. Standards for Knowing
    1. Certainty or Infallibility
    2. Fallibility
    3. Grades of Fallibility
    4. Safety and Lucky Knowing
    5. Mere True Belief
    6. Non-Factive Conceptions
  8. Knowing’s Point
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Kinds of Knowledge

We talk of knowledge: all of us do; philosophers do. But what is knowledge? We can best answer that potentially complex question in several stages. Let us begin by considering whether there are different kinds of knowledge. Epistemologists have contemplated at least the following general possibilities.

a. Knowing by Acquaintance

Your knowing a person, it seems, involves direct interaction with him or her. Otherwise, at most, you should claim only that it is almost as if you know him or her: ‘I’ve seen and heard so much about her that I feel like I know her. I wonder whether I’ll ever meet her — whether I will ever actually know her.’ Without that meeting, you could well know facts about the person (this being a kind of knowledge to be discussed in section 1.b). Nonetheless, could you know facts about a person without ever meeting him or her? If so, there could well be a kind of knowledge which is different to knowing a fact; maybe knowing a thing or entity (such as a person) is distinct from knowing a fact about that thing or entity.

Bertrand Russell (1959 [1912]: ch. 5) famously distinguished between knowledge by description and a quite particular kind of knowledge by acquaintance. He allowed there to be a form of acquaintance that was immediate and unquestionable, linking one with such things as abstract properties and momentary sensory items passing before one’s mind: you can be acquainted with the abstract property of redness, as well as with a specific patch of redness briefly in your visual field. Knowledge by description was the means by which, in Russell’s view, a person could proceed to know about what he or she had not experienced directly. We formulate definite descriptions (‘the third man listed in the current Sydney residential phonebook’) and indefinite ones (‘a man listed in the current Sydney residential phonebook’). With these, we can designate individuals with whom we have not interacted. Then we can formulate claims using such descriptions. Some of these claims could be knowledge. Thus, we may open up for ourselves a world of knowledge beyond what is revealed by our immediate experiences.

b. Knowledge-That

Most philosophical discussion of knowledge is directed at knowledge-that — such as knowledge that kangaroos hop, knowledge that koalas sleep most of the time, knowledge that kookaburras cackle, and the like. This is generally called propositional knowledge (a proposition that such-and-such is so is the object of the knowledge), declarative knowledge (the knowledge’s object is represented by a declarative sentence: ‘Such-and-such is so’), or knowledge-that (the knowledge is represented in the form ‘that such-and-such is so’). Knowledge by description (mentioned in section 1.a) would be one form that could be taken by knowledge-that: some known propositions include descriptions; but not all do. In principle, knowledge-that is the kind of knowledge present whenever there is knowledge of a fact or truth — no matter what type of fact or truth is involved: knowledge that 2 + 2 = 4; knowledge that rape is cruel; knowledge that there is gravity; and so on. When philosophers use the term ‘know’ unqualifiedly, knowledge-that is standardly what they mean to be designating. (It will therefore be the intended sense throughout most of this article.)

c. Knowledge-Wh

But should knowledge-that receive such sustained and uninterrupted focus by philosophers? After all, there is a far wider range of ways in which we talk and think, using the term ‘know’. Here are some of them (collectively referred to as knowledge-wh):

knowing whether it is 2 p.m.; knowing who is due to visit; knowing why a visit is needed; knowing what the visit is meant to accomplish; knowing how that outcome is best accomplished; and so forth.

How should these be understood? The usual view among epistemologists is that these are specific sorts of knowledge-that. For example, knowing whether it is 2 p.m. is knowing that it is 2 p.m., if it is; and knowing that it is not 2 p.m., if it is not. Knowing who is due to visit is knowing, for some specified person, that it is he or she who is due to visit. Knowing what the visit is meant to accomplish is knowing, for some specified outcome, that it is what the visit is meant to accomplish. Knowing how that outcome is best accomplished is knowing, for some specified description of how that outcome could be accomplished, that this describes the best way of accomplishing that outcome. And so on.

Still, not everyone will assess these examples in quite that way. Note a variation on this theme that is currently being developed. Called contrastivism, its basic idea is that (perhaps always; at least sometimes) to know is to know this rather than that. (For different versions, see Schaffer 2005; 2007; Morton 2011.) One’s knowing, understood contrastively, is explicitly one’s knowing one from among some understood or presumed bunch of possible alternatives. The word ‘explicitly’ is used here because one would know while acknowledging those alternatives. Consider the example of knowing-who. On contrastivism, you could know that it is Fred rather than Arjuna and Diego who is due to visit; and this might be the only way in which you know that Fred is due. ‘Who is due?’ ‘Fred, as against Arjuna or Diego.’ Your knowing-who would not be simply your knowing, of Fred, that it is he who is due to visit. Your knowing-who would be your knowing that it is Fred as against Arjuna or Diego who is due to visit. This remains propositional knowledge, nonetheless.

d. Knowing-How

Gilbert Ryle (1971 [1946]; 1949) made apparent to other philosophers the potential importance of distinguishing knowledge-that from knowledge-how. The latter is not (thought Ryle) one’s knowing how it is that something is so; this, we noted in section 1.c, is quite likely a form of knowledge-that. What Ryle meant by ‘knowing how’ was one’s knowing how to do something: knowing how to read the time on a clock, knowing how to call a friend, knowing how to cook a particular meal, and so forth. These seem to be skills or at least abilities. Are they not simply another form of knowledge-that? Ryle argued for their distinctness from knowledge-that; and often knowledge-how is termed ‘practical knowledge’. Is one’s knowing how to cook a particular meal really only one’s knowing a lot of truths — having much knowledge-that — bearing upon ingredients, combinations, timing, and the like? If Ryle was right, knowing-how is somehow distinct: even if it involves having relevant knowledge-that, it is also something more — so that what makes it knowledge-how need not be knowledge-that. [For more on this issue, see, for example, Bengson and Moffett 2012). Might knowledge-that even be a kind of knowledge-how itself, so that all instances of knowledge-that themselves are skills or abilities (for example, Hetherington 2011a: ch. 2)?]

2. Knowledge as a Kind

Section 1 shows how there might be different kinds of knowledge. We will now focus on one of them — knowledge-that. What kind of thing is such knowledge? In particular, is it a natural kind — a naturally occurring element in the scientifically describable world? Alternatively, is knowledge at least partly a conventional or artifactual kind — a part of our practices of judging and evaluating, possessing a socially describable nature?

The former idea portrays knowledge as an identifiable and explanatory aspect of what it is for beings relevantly like us to function as a natural component of a natural world. We have beliefs, some of which help us to achieve our aims by telling us how not to ‘bump into’ the world around us. We can ‘fit into’ — by ‘finding our way within’ — the world by using beliefs. Is that because these beliefs are knowledge? Is that part of why humans as a natural kind (if this is what we are) have prospered so markedly? In introducing epistemologists to the idea of what he called a naturalized epistemology, W. V. Quine (1969) recommended that philosophy conceive of us in psychological terms, so that when it seeks to understand us as reasoning, as believing, and as rational, it does not do this in terms distinct from those scientific ways of describing our psychological and physical features. Hilary Kornblith (2002) continues that theme: in effect, we know as other animals do — limitedly but reliably, thanks to our roles as sensing and believing beings operating within the world’s natural order. There would be natural laws, say, or at least natural regularities — scientifically formulable ones, we may hope — about how we know.

In contrast, we may feel that knowing is a distinctively conventional accomplishment. It might consist of socially constituted and approved patterns — not thereby natural laws or regularities admitting of scientific description — in aspects of how we interact with other people. Perhaps we can collectively choose what to count as knowledge. Perhaps that is all there is to knowing. Such a view could even say that this is how knowledge differs from belief: beliefs happen to or within us; knowledge we shape from beliefs. And we might do this deliberatively, subjecting ourselves and others to social norms of inquiry, responding to other people and their concepts, aims, and values. As civilizations expand and mutate, could knowing change not only its content (that is, what is known), but its basic nature (for example, how the knowing occurs and even what in general is required for it to occur)? Different social arrangements would bring into being different ways of thinking and acting, new aims and values. In that sense, possibly knowledge is an artefact, created by us in social groupings, used by us in those same groupings — often wittingly and deliberately so. In short, maybe knowing is a matter of functioning in socially apt ways. Barry Allen (2004) is one who argues for an artifactual interpretation of knowing’s nature.

The rest of this article will remain neutral between these two broad ideas. Some of the suggestions to be considered will be more appropriate (and clearly so) for one than the other of the two. But in general the article’s aim will be to display, not to favour.

3. Ways of Knowing

To say the least, not everyone knows everything, not even everything that in principle is knowable. Individual instances of knowledge come to individual people at individual times, remaining in place for varying — individual — lengths of time. So it is right to ask how it is that individual cases of knowledge reach, or are acquired by, people; along with how it is that these cases of knowledge are then retained by people. In what broadly characterisable ways do people gain and maintain their knowledge? In practice, philosophers do not treat that as a question about the ineliminable specificities of each person, each moment, and each particular piece of knowledge. It is treated as a question about general ways and means of coming to know a specific fact or truth.

Over the centuries, these have been some of the more philosophically pondered forms of answer to that question:

  • Some or all knowledge is innate. (And then it is remembered later, during life.)
  • Some or all knowledge is observational.
  • Some or all knowledge is non-observational, attained by thought alone.
  • Some or all knowledge is partly observational and partly not — attained at once by observing and thinking.

The rest of this section will consider these in turn.

a. Innate Knowledge

If some instances of knowledge accompany a person into life, how will they reveal themselves within his or her life? How would the person, or indeed anyone else, know that he or she has this innate knowledge? It could depend on what is being known innately — the subject matter of this knowledge with which the person has been born.

For example, if people begin life already knowing some grammatical rules (an idea famously due to Noam Chomsky: see Stich 1975, ch. 4), this innate knowledge would be shown in subsequent speedy, widespread, and reliable language-learning by those involved. These instances of people learning so readily and predictably would be actions expressing some knowledge-how. But (as section 1.d acknowledged) such manifestations of knowledge-how might actually reflect the presence within of knowledge-that.

Or consider another possible example: knowledge of some mathematics and some logical principles. Seemingly, Plato (in the Meno, one of his dialogues) accorded people this sort of innate knowledge; as did Leibniz, in his New Essays. (For excerpts from Plato and from Leibniz, see Stich 1975, ch. 2.) Plato presented us with a story of a slaveboy, lacking education, whom Socrates brought, via minimal questioning, to a state of remembering some geometrical knowledge.

Naturally, it could be difficult to ascertain that any particular knowledge is genuinely innate. Knowledge which is not innate, but which is acquired especially easily, seemingly effortlessly, might nonetheless feel innate. And (as section 1.d also acknowledged) even when an action, such as of language-learning, is manifesting knowledge-how, there remains a philosophical question as to whether that action is reflecting knowledge-that already existing within, dormant until activated. The answer to that question might be that there is only knowledge-how present — without owing its existence to some related prior knowledge-that. (As ever throughout this article these possibilities are suggested for continued consideration, not as manifestly decisive refutations.)

b. Observational Knowledge

One of epistemology’s perennially central topics has been that of observational knowledge. Let us consider a few of the vast number of philosophical questions that have arisen about such knowledge.

Can there be purely or directly observational knowledge? When you observe a cat sleeping in front of you, do you know observationally — and only observationally — that the cat is sleeping there? Observation is occurring; and you do not consciously ‘construct’ the knowledge. Still, is there a perceptual experience present, along with some conceptual or even theoretical knowledge (for example, that cats are thus-and-so, that to sleep is to do this-and-not-that, and so forth)? Otherwise, how could your experience constitute your knowing this-content-rather-than-another? Is conceptual knowledge what gives knowledgeable content to your observational experience? Is this so, even for experiences that are as simple as you can imagine having?

Can there be foundational observational knowledge? Wilfrid Sellars (1963) engaged famously with this question, confronting what he called the myth of the given. Part of the traditional epistemological appeal of the idea of there being purely or directly observational knowledge was the idea that such knowledge could be foundational knowledge. It would be knowledge given to us in experiences which would be cases of knowledge, yet which would be conceptually simple. Sellars argued, however, that they would not be conceptually so simple.

For example, imagine knowing observationally that here is something white. This would possibly be as simple, in conceptual terms, as observational knowledge could be for you. Nevertheless, even here the question remains of whether you are applying concepts (such as of being here, of being something, and of being white); and if you are doing so, of whether you must be able to know that you are using them correctly. Would you need to find even simpler observational experiences, via which you could know what these concepts involve? If so, the other experience — knowing observationally that here is something white — would not have been foundational. That is, it would not have amounted to a basic piece of knowledge, upon which other pieces of knowledge can be based and which need not itself be based upon other pieces of knowledge.

How much observation is needed for observational knowledge? When you look at what appears to be a cat, for how long must you maintain your gaze if you are to know that you are seeing a cat? Do you need also to walk around it, still looking at it, scrutinising it from different angles, if you are to know that you are seeing a cat? And what of your other senses? Could the animal’s sounding or smelling like a cat, for example, be needed if the knowledge in question is to be yours? There is a more general question behind those ones: What standard must observational knowledge meet? You are using, it seems, observational evidence; what standard must it meet, if it is to be giving you observational knowledge? (And that sort of question will arise about all evidence and all knowledge. That will become apparent as this article proceeds.)

[For a range of readings on observational knowledge, see Dancy 1988.]

c. Knowing Purely by Thinking

When philosophers ask about the possibility of some knowledge’s being gained purely by thinking — by reflection rather than observation —  they are wondering whether a priori knowledge is possible. Historically, those who believe that some such knowledge is possible are called rationalists about knowledge. (Empiricists, in contrast, believe that all knowledge is observational in its underlying nature, even when it might not seem so. This is the belief that all knowledge is a posteriori — present only after some suitably supportive observations are made.) As was done for observational knowledge in section 3.b, this section mentions a few of the multitude of questions that have arisen about a priori knowledge — knowledge which would be present, if it ever is, purely by thinking, maybe through an accompanying rational insight.

How would there be a priori knowledge? It is difficult, to say the least, for us ever to know that a piece of putative knowledge would not be at all observational, so that it would be gained purely by thought or reflection. We talk of pure mathematics, for example, and our knowledge of it. Consider the content of the sentence, ‘2 + 2 = 4.’ It could be applied to physical objects; nonetheless, we might deny that it is at all about such objects. But then we must explain how we know that we are using thought alone in knowing that 2 + 2 = 4, rather than knowing this mathematical truth in a way which is simply much less directly observational. Would we know it, for instance, partly by knowing how to interpret various physical representations which we would observe — numerals (‘2’ and ‘4’) and function signs (‘+’ and ‘=’)? If this is even part of how we know that 2 + 2 = 4, is the knowledge at least not purely a result of thought rather than observation?

[On related issues, see Quine’s ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’, in Moser 1987, a collection with many readings relevant to this section.]

Could a priori knowledge be substantive? It might be thought that pure reflection — and hence a priori knowledge — is possible when the truths being known are especially simple, even trivial. ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ is true, yet trivial: it is uninformative for anyone who understands at all the concept of a bachelor. ‘There is more than one infinity’ is true yet not trivial: it is informative for some who understand at all the concept of an infinitude. If ‘There is more than one infinity’ is knowable by thought alone, that would be substantive a priori knowledge. But if only truths like ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ are knowable purely by thinking, maybe there cannot be substantive a priori knowledge. So, which is it to be? (If we reply that it depends upon what a particular a priori known truth is about, we return to the previous paragraph’s question about knowledge gained purely by thinking. Alternatively, if we reply that it depends upon which standard is being met — such as when understanding a specific concept like that of bachelorhood or of infinitude, so as to gain knowledge from it — this takes us to the next paragraph’s question.)

[Classically, the issue of whether there can be substantive a priori knowledge was posed by Immanuel Kant, in his eighteenth-century Critique of Pure Reason (2007 [1781/1787] — as the question of whether there can be synthetic a priori knowledge.]

What standard would a priori knowledge have to satisfy? If there could be a priori knowledge, is it clear what standard it would need to have satisfied? There have long been philosophers for whom part of the appeal in the idea of a priori knowledge is the presumption that it would be infallible. That is, it would satisfy a conclusive — in effect, a perfect — evidential standard. It would do this because a capacity for pure thought, undistracted by observed contingencies within this world, would be what has provided the a priori knowledge. However, some recent epistemologists (for example, BonJour 1998) regard that picture as overly optimistic. The one person is both observing and thinking; and if we expect fallibility to be part of how she observes, maybe we should expect fallibility likewise when she is thinking. Is it simply obvious that when we are not observing, only thinking, we are more — let alone perfectly — reliable or trustworthy in our views? Or do we also think only imperfectly? Perhaps we need observations as ‘checks’ on what could otherwise become thoughts ‘floating free’ in our minds. Yet maybe, even so, these ‘checks’ remain imperfect. To think without observing might not be to improve dramatically, if at all, the use of one’s mind.

d. Knowing by Thinking-Plus-Observing

And so again we meet the question of the extent to which, in one way or another, we are vulnerable when trying to gain whatever knowledge we can. Of course, we might claim that we are only vulnerable when focussing just on observation or on reflection — ignoring the other. Surely (it will be suggested), much or even all of our knowledge is a mixture — both observational and reasoned. Is that how we will stride forward as knowers?

Optimism replies, ‘Yes. Possibly there are philosophical limits upon the effectiveness of observation by itself and of reason by itself. Still, to combine them is to overcome those limits, or at least enough of them.’ In response to which, less-than-optimism counsels, ‘Maybe not. If each of observation and reflection has limitations of its own, a combination of them might compound those weaknesses. The result could be a blurring of the two, so that we would never know whether, on a particular occasion, weakness in one — in the observing or in the reflecting — is weakening the whole.’ Which of those alternatives is right? Optimism? Less-than-optimism?

That depends. We should now consider an epistemologically classic doubt about people’s abilities ever to gain knowledge.

4. Sceptical Doubts about Knowing

From the outset of philosophical thinking about knowledge, doubts have never been far away: do we really know what we think we know? And that question was not meant merely to ask whether sometimes we are mistaken in claiming a particular piece of knowledge. The philosophical concern was more pressing: do we ever know what we think we know? Even when lacking all views on whether we know, could we always fail to know? Is knowledge an attainment forever beyond us — all of us, everyone, all of the time?

That question confronts us with a radical sceptical possibility. Possibilities that are less radical but still possibly disturbing, and less widely sceptical but still sceptical, have also been discussed. Is there no knowledge of a physical world? Is there no scientific knowledge? Is there no knowledge of moral truths? Is there no knowledge of the future? And so it goes. Let us now examine one of these. It is one of philosophy’s most famous non-radical sceptical arguments — a scepticism about external world knowledge. (It is sceptical, partly because it denies something otherwise accepted by almost everyone: sceptical denials are surprising in that sense.) Here is how it unfolds.

If there is observational knowledge (section 3.b), it is knowledge of what philosophers generally call the external world. By this, they mean to designate the physical world, regarded as something with an existence and nature distinct from (and perhaps, or perhaps not, represented accurately in) any individual’s beliefs as to its existence and nature. Those beliefs could be true because there is a physical world with a nature matching what the beliefs attribute to it. Equally, however, the beliefs could be false because there is no physical world quite, or even at all, as the beliefs claim it to be. And if the beliefs are false, the usual philosophical moral to be drawn would be that they are not knowledge. (Knowledge is only of truths or facts: see section 6.f.)

Still, do we ever have reason to regard all of our beliefs about the physical world as actually false? Perhaps not consciously so, while ever in fact we have the beliefs; for part of having a belief is some sort of acceptance of its content as true, not false. Nevertheless, maybe one can have a belief while accepting that one cannot know quite how one has gained that belief. And this is significant because there are ways of having a belief which — even without guaranteeing the belief’s being false — would be incompatible with the belief’s being knowledge. For instance, even if one feels as though a particular belief has been formed via careful reasoning, perhaps ultimately that belief is present largely because one wants it to be. And one might concede this, even if reluctantly, as a possibility about oneself. More generally, therefore, maybe one could have a belief while also accepting one’s not quite being able to know that one has not gained it in a way which is wholly unsuitable for its being knowledge.

In theory, there are many possible knowledge-precluding ways of gaining a particular belief. Here are a few generically described ways:

  • Sometimes, your individual sensing or thinking might be only yours, in the worrying sense that it could be misleading on the particular topic of your belief, more so than other people’s sensing or thinking would be on that same topic.
  • Sometimes, anyone’s sensing is only human, in the sense that it could be misleading about aspects of the world which other animals sense more accurately.
  • Human reasoning is also only ever human in the sense that (as Christopher Cherniak has explained: 1986) even some seemingly simple assessments could be computationally beyond our capacities. There is only so much that any person’s brain can do with so much data. Even checking for something as familiar as consistency between many of one’s beliefs is an extremely complex task. This is not necessarily because consistency in itself is always complex. It is because there is too much checking to do, given the need to evaluate every possible combination from among one’s beliefs.

Sceptical arguments could be generated from those and from comparable possibilities.

One historically prominent suggestion — philosophers usually attribute its most influential form to Descartes (1911 [1641]), in his ‘Meditation I’ — directs us to the phenomenon of dreaming. Suppose that you feel as though you are sensing, in a normal way, a cat’s sitting in front of you. But suppose that this experience is actually present as part of your dreaming, not as part of using your senses in a normal way. There seems to you to be a cat; the circumstance feels normal to you; even so, in fact you are asleep, dreaming. Presumably, therefore, your feeling or experience at this time is not providing you with knowledge right now of the cat’s presence.

Now, could that be how it is on every occasion of your feeling there to be a cat in front of you? Indeed, we can generalise that question, to this philosophical challenge: Whenever you seem to be having a sensory experience about the world around you, can you know that you are not dreaming at that time? And this question is a challenge, not only a question, because it might not be clear how you could have that knowledge of not dreaming at that time. Any evidence you mention in support of the contention that you are not dreaming will be the same sort of evidence as that which has just been questioned. Imagine thinking to yourself, ‘I remember waking up this morning. I feel awake still. I feel so awake.’ You thereby feel as though you are mentioning some good evidence, reflecting decisive non-dreaming experiences. But your having that feeling could itself be present as part of your dreaming; and if it is, then it is not knowledge. So, any such experience on your part of reaching for apparently good evidence, of bringing to mind how awake you feel, will merely be more of the same. That is, it will be just another instance of the same sort of experience as was being questioned in the first place; and it will be no less vulnerable to the possibility of merely being part of a more or less extended moment of dreaming by you. Your citing these further experiences thus provides no new form of evidence which is somehow above suspicion in this context of questioning the apparently observational evidence (the suspicion, remember, of possibly being an experience produced as part of a dreaming experience).

Then the sceptical conclusion follows swiftly. If you never know that your apparent experiences of the physical world around you are not present as part of your dreaming while asleep, you never know that what feels to you like a normally produced belief about the world is not present as part of an experience which precludes that you are thereby having a belief at this time which is knowledge. Accordingly, for all that you do know about yourself at that time, you fail to have knowledge of your surroundings. In that sense, you might not have knowledge of the physical world around you. Do your apparent beliefs about the world fail in that way to be knowledge? Indeed so, concludes the sceptical reasoning: if (for all that you do otherwise know about them) they might not be knowledge, then they are not sufficiently well supported by you to actually be knowledge.

[On external world scepticism in particular, see Stroud (1984: ch. 1). On scepticism and dreaming, see Sosa (2007: ch. 1). On sceptical reasoning in general, see DeRose and Warfield 1999.]

5. Understanding Knowledge?

There are various possible ways of seeking philosophical understanding of a phenomenon. One such approach involves attempting to understand the phenomenon in terms of other phenomena. If one can do this exhaustively and with full precision, one might even attain a definition of the phenomenon. Sometimes that method is called the search for an analytic reduction of the phenomenon in question. (It is also often described as analysing the concept of that phenomenon. But the associated aim should thereby be to understand the phenomenon itself: hopefully, we would understand X by having a full and precise understanding of what it takes for something to satisfy the concept of X.) That approach has dominated epistemology’s efforts over the past fifty or so years to understand knowledge’s nature.

a. The Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge

In 1963, a short paper was published which highlighted — while questioning strikingly — a way of trying to define knowledge. Section 5.b will present the question raised by that paper. Right now, we should have before us a sense of what it questioned — which was a kind of view that has generally been called the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.

That conception was usually presented as a definition. The thinking behind it took this form:

Consider someone’s knowing that such-and-such is the case. This instance of knowing amounts, by definition, to the person’s having a true and well justified belief that such-and-such is the case.

So, three distinct phenomena are identified (even if only in a generic way), before being combined. And that combination is being said to be what any — and only any — case of knowledge exemplifies. Knowledge is a belief; but not just any belief. Knowledge is always a true belief; but not just any true belief. (A confident although hopelessly uninformed belief as to which horse will win — or even has won — a particular race is not knowledge, even if the belief is true.) Knowledge is always a well justified true belief — any well justified true belief. (And thus we have the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.)

What does ‘justified’ mean? That is a substantial topic in its own right, but it is not the topic of this article. Still (for illustration only), here are two possible forms that justification can take within knowledge:

Evidence. Often, you have evidence — supportive experiences and views, consciously held — which, overall, favours your belief that such-and-such is the case. This evidence is thereby justification for or towards your belief’s being true. (On justification as evidence, see Conee and Feldman 2004.)

Reliability. Often, you have formed your belief that such-and-such is the case in a way which was likely to have led you to form a true belief. This reliability is thereby justification for or towards your belief’s being true. (On reliability as justification, see Goldman 1979.)

Must such justification — be it favourable evidence or be it reliability in belief-formation — be perfect support for or towards the belief’s being true? Section 6.a will discuss that idea; the usual answer is ‘No, perfection is not needed.’ At the very least, that answer was part of the underpinning to the famous 1963 questioning of the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.

[Epistemology textbooks standardly present some version of a justified-true-belief conception of knowledge: for example, Chisholm 1989; Hetherington 1996; Feldman 2003; Morton 2003; Zagzebski 2009.]

b. Not the Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge?

Edmund Gettier’s 1963 article had a dramatic epistemological impact — as immediately so as is possible within philosophy. Almost all epistemologists, at the time and since, have agreed that Gettier disproved the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge. How so?

He proposed two supposed counterexamples to the claim that a belief’s being true and well justified is sufficient for its being knowledge. In each of his imagined cases, a person forms a belief which is true and well justified, yet which — this is the usual view, at any rate — is not knowledge. (These situations came to be known as Gettier cases, as did the many subsequent kindred cases.) For instance, in Gettier’s first case a person Smith forms a belief that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket. Smith’s evidence is that the company president told him that Jones would get the job, and that Smith has counted the coins in Jones’s pocket. Is Smith’s belief true? Yes, it is; but only because he himself will get the job and because he himself has ten coins in his pocket — two facts of which he is actually unaware.

Why is a belief like Smith’s not knowledge? Many theories have been proposed, as to why such beliefs (Gettiered beliefs, as they have come to be called) are not knowledge. Collectively, this post-Gettier theorising has generated another independently large epistemological topic — the Gettier problem. But none of those theories are favored here because epistemology as a whole has not favored one. There has been widespread agreement only on Gettier cases being situations from which knowledge is absent — not on why or how the knowledge is absent.

[For an extensive exposition of the first twenty years of epistemology’s engagement with the Gettier problem, including a range of theories that were proposed as to why Gettiered beliefs are not knowledge, see Shope 1983. For recent accounts, see Lycan 2006 and Hetherington 2011b.]

c. Questioning the Gettier Problem

A few forms of doubt have been advanced about the potency of Gettier’s challenge. Such doubts, if correct, could allow philosophers to return to a view — a pre-Gettier view — of knowledge as being some sort of justified true belief. Let's consider two of those forms of doubt.

A more varied range of intuitions is needed. In reacting to Gettier’s own two cases and to the many similar ones that have since appeared, epistemologists have continually relied on its being intuitively clear that the cases’ featured beliefs are not instances of knowledge. In response to case after case, epistemologists say that ‘intuitively’ the belief in question — the Gettiered belief — is not knowledge.

Yet that sort of reaction has begun to be questioned by some work that initiated what has since become known as experimental philosophy. Rather than continuing to rely only on what epistemologists and their students would say about such thought-experiments, Jonathan Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich (2001) asked a wider range of people for their intuitive reactions, including to some Gettier cases. This wider range included people not affiliated with universities or colleges, along with more people of a non-European ancestry. And the results were at odds with what epistemological orthodoxy would have expected. For example, interestingly more respondents of a Subcontinental ancestry (Indian, Pakistani, Bangladeshi) than ones of a Western European ancestry replied that the Gettiered beliefs about which they were being asked are instances of knowledge.

This does not prove that Gettiered beliefs are knowledge, of course. But it complicates the epistemological story: to whom — to whose intuitions, if to any — should we be listening here? Some philosophers are beginning to wonder whether such a result should even undermine their confidence in knowledge’s being something more than a justified true belief — in particular, its being a non-Gettiered justified true belief.

[For discussions of the nature and role of intuitions within philosophy, see DePaul and Ramsey 1998. On intuitions and epistemology, see Weinberg 2006.]

The need to be fallibilist in assessing the knowledge’s absence. Gettier introduced his challenge (section 5.b) as concerning precisely what knowledge is if its justification component is not required to be producing infallibly good support for or towards the belief’s being true. Section 6 will focus upon a range of possible standards that knowledge could be thought to need to meet. Fallibilism is one of them; for now, we need note only that it functions explicitly within Gettier’s challenge as a constraint upon knowledge.

For example, in Gettier’s first case Smith’s evidence (the company president’s testimony, and Smith’s counting the coins in Jones’s pocket) justifies only fallibly his final belief (that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket). By this, Gettier meant that the evidence does not logically mandate or entail the belief’s being true: the belief could have been false, even given that evidence’s being true. In fact, the belief is true. But how is it made true? It is made true, we saw, not by aspects of Jones, but by aspects of Smith himself — none of which are noticed by his evidence. Accordingly, the fallibility within the case amounts to a ‘gap’ of logic or information between the evidence-content’s being true and the final belief’s truth. This gap allows the case’s final belief to be true because of something other than what is reported in the evidence. And so that final belief is not knowledge.

Yet here is a counter-challenge (described more fully in Hetherington 2011c). When thinking that the case’s final belief is not knowledge, could epistemologists unwittingly have been applying a higher standard to the case than a fallibilist one? Is it possible that to deny Smith this knowledge is to assume, even if not deliberately, an infallibilist standard instead? It will not feel to an epistemologist as if this is happening. Yet could it be, even so? How would an epistemologist know that an infallibilist standard is not what is being applied, even if only implicitly and even if she is claiming explicitly to be applying a fallibilist standard? Ultimately, epistemologists have relied on appeals to intuition as a way of monitoring their more theoretical interpretations of Gettier cases. And (as we found a moment ago) there is a question about how decisive that is as a way of knowing exactly what epistemological moral to take from the cases.

Here is an alternative possible fallibilist interpretation of Gettier’s case about the job and the coins. Although there is a ‘gap’ of logic or information between what Smith’s evidence and reasoning claims to tell him about directly (that is, aspects of Jones) and how his final belief is made true (that is, by aspects of Smith himself), some such ‘gap’ is sometimes to be expected whenever a merely fallibilist standard for knowing is at stake. So (continues this interpretation), if the presence of a fallibilist standard was the only shortcoming in the case, we should not dismiss the belief as failing to be knowledge; for that would be simply an infallibilist dismissal of the belief.

We must acknowledge, however, that something more than mere fallibility is present within the case: only through some actual oddity does Smith’s true belief (the final belief) eventuate within the case. Hence, the question is one of whether that combination — the fallibility and the oddity — should be allowed by fallibilism as being knowledge nonetheless. Of course knowledge would rarely, even at most, be fallibly present in such an odd way; could it ever be, though? Normally it would not be; abnormally, however, could it be? So, could there be knowledge like this? Might a Gettiered belief be knowledge? Even if it is rare, is it possible?

Some epistemologists have argued that what such cases show is the need for the justification within a belief’s being knowledge somehow to guarantee the truth of the belief (for example, Zagzebski 1994). But we should ask whether this is evading rather than solving Gettier’s challenge. (Howard-Snyder, Howard-Snyder, and Feit argue that it is also not needed for solving Gettier’s challenge: 2003.) That question arises because Gettier is challenging only justified-true-belief conceptions of knowledge which include a fallibilist form of justification. Our correlative aim, if we accept the usual reading of Gettier cases, should be to formulate a satisfactory conception of that form of knowledge.

[On the nature of fallibilism, see Hetherington (2005) and Dougherty (2011).]

6. Standards for Knowing

Many philosophical questions about knowledge (its nature and availability) may be treated as questions about standards. We expect knowledge to amount to something, to be an improvement in some respect upon various forms of non-knowledge. (Why is that so? Section 7 will discuss what knowledge is for, hence why it should meet any particular standard.) Section 5 ended by asking about knowledge and infallibilism; we may now consider a wider range of possible standards, beginning with infallibility, which have at times been placed by epistemologists and others upon knowing.

a. Certainty or Infallibility

There is a recurring temptation, often felt by philosophers and non-philosophers alike, to impose some kind of infallibilist standard upon knowing. This can even feel intuitive to the person applying the standard. One version of that temptation talks of certainty — not necessarily a subjectively experienced sense of certainty, but what is usually termed an epistemic kind of certainty. The latter amounts to the certainty’s being a rationally inviolable and unimprovable form of justificatory support, regardless of whether it feels so perfect. (It could also be experienced as certainty. That would not be the important aspect of its being part of the knowing, though.)

Why would one adopt such a demanding view of knowledge? Perhaps because the alternative could feel too undemanding. Consider the apparent oddity of claims like this:

I do know that I’m looking at a dingo, even though I could be mistaken.

(One could talk in that way because one might implicitly be thinking, ‘My evidence isn’t perfect.’) Is that concessive knowledge-attribution, as it is often called, a contradiction? If it is, perhaps knowing is incompatible with possibly being mistaken; in which case, knowledge does have to involve an epistemic certainty. What epistemologists in general regard as the most famous advocacy of knowing’s including such certainty was by Descartes, again in his ‘Meditation I’ (1911 [1641]).

Of course, there remains the possibility that knowing is merely incompatible with saying or thinking that one is possibly mistaken — not with the fact of one’s possibly being mistaken. This is why the oddity of concessive knowledge-attributions might not entail knowledge’s including certainty or infallibility. The matter is currently being debated (for example, Dougherty and Rysiew 2009).

b. Fallibility

The spectre of a sceptical conclusion is the most obvious philosophical concern about requiring knowledge to satisfy an infallibilist standard. If knowledge is like that, then how often will anyone succeed in actually having some knowledge? Rarely, if ever (is the usual reply). For people’s imperfections in their attempts to know (see the examples highlighted early in section 4) will be incompatible with the success of those attempts — if perfection is required for such success. Anyone who accepts infallibilism about some or all knowledge must confront the question of whether he or she wants thereby to deny that any such knowledge is ever actually attained. (Descartes wished not to be a sceptic, for example, even as he allowed that some knowledge, if it was to be present, would have to be certain.)

So there is a key choice, between infallibility and fallibility, in what standard we are to require of knowing. To demand infallibility is to court the danger of scepticism. Again, though (as section 6.a acknowledged), settling for fallibility may seem overly accommodating of the possibility of mistake. This is a substantial choice to make in thinking philosophically about knowledge. Most epistemologists profess not to be infallibilists. They aim to understand knowing as needing only to satisfy a fallibilist standard. Think of everyday situations in which people attribute knowledge: ‘I know that you are a good person. And I know that you are sitting down.’ The knowledge being attributed is not being thought to involve infallibility. Nonetheless, we do claim or attribute knowledge casually yet literally, all day, every day. In practice, we are fallibilists in that respect. (Still, in practice we also often could have infallibilist moments: ‘You’re not sure? Then you don’t know.’ The situation is complex. Maybe we are not always consistent about this.)

c. Grades of Fallibility

What any fallibilist could helpfully do, therefore, is to ascertain which standard of fallibility is the minimum one that must be met by any instance of knowing. So far, the discussion has been about fallibility, not different standards of fallibility. But in theory the latter way of talking is available. After all, fallibility is merely an absence of infallibility; and there might be many possible standards available to be met, each of which would fall short to some or another extent of the absolute achievement constituted by infallibility. Consider three ideas that have been proposed.

Animal knowledge; reflective knowledge. Maybe we can distinguish between a kind of knowledge which involves some sort of reliability (see section 5.a above), and one which adds to that reliability an appropriately aware reflectiveness about that reliability. Sosa (2009) describes this as a distinction between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge; and he regards the latter as a better way of knowing a truth. In principle, each kind of knowledge can be fallible (although an infallibilist, such as Sosa himself, can also accept the distinction). What matters for the present discussion is that you could know a particular truth, such as that you are tired, in either an animal way or a reflective way. But your reflective knowledge of being tired will be a better grade than your animal knowledge of being tired. The reflectiveness would improve your epistemic relationship to the fact of your being tired. Nevertheless, that relationship would remain one of knowing. So the knowing would improve as knowledge of the particular fact of your being tired. You would know that fact less fallibly, by knowing it more reflectively.

Knowledge-gradualism. That talk of improving the knowing should be suggestive for a fallibilist. Maybe we can allow there to be many grades or degrees of fallibility — reflecting, for instance, the multiply varied extents to which evidence can support a belief well. Think of a body of observational data: your belief could receive improved support if the data proceeded to be supplemented by further corroborative observations. Similarly, think of hearing expert testimony — and then more of it, by even better experts — in support of a thesis. The idea of improving one’s evidence, or one’s reliability in attaining true beliefs, is perfectly compatible with already having good support for a particular belief. A belief could be more, or it could be less, fallibly supported — yet well supported all the while.

Then we might also say that the knowledge itself is improved. The belief would already be knowledge, with there being good enough justificatory support for it. But its quality as knowledge of the particular truth in question would correspond to the degree or grade of its fallibility, such as of the fallibility in its justification component. And this degree or grade could improve, as the fallibility is lessened by the improvement in the justificatory support. For example, you know better that it is raining, if you see that it is and you feel its doing so. You still know — but less well — that it is raining, if you only see that it is. In each case, your knowledge is fallible; it remains knowledge, though. [For more on this idea, see Hetherington (2001; 2011a). See Hetherington (2011a: sec. 2.7) on others who have accepted it.

Contextualism. In recent years, contextualism has attracted much philosophical attention, especially within epistemology (for example, Cohen 1986; 1991; DeRose 1999; 2009; Lewis 1996). It is a way of claiming to understand the truth-conditions of utterances or thoughts, particularly of knowledge-attributions or knowledge-denials. And it is often thought to accommodate the existence of different standards for knowledge-attributions. It has mainly focussed on this sort of comparison:

  • In an ‘everyday’ conversational context, when she is asked whether you know that dingoes exist, your friend may well say of you that you do.
  • In a conversational context where sceptical possibilities are being taken seriously, when she is asked that same question, your friend may well deny that you know that dingoes exist.

This disparity, according to contextualism, reflects different standards (or something similar) being applied within the respective contexts. A lower and more accommodating standard for applying the term ‘knows’ to you is presumed within the everyday context; not so in the sceptically-aware context.

Note that contextualism, as a kind of theory of knowledge-attributions or knowledge-denials, is not directly a kind of theory of knowing. It is a theory directly about language use and meaning (specifically, occasions of talking or thinking while using the word ‘knows’ and its cognates); in that sense, it is not directly about knowing as such. Contextualism is mentioned here because some epistemologists (for example, Stanley 2005) have thought that if we were to countenance there being different grades of (fallible) knowing, this is how we would have to do so. Such a thought is mistaken, though, even if we regard contextualism as indirectly a theory of knowing. For we have already met two approaches that are directly about knowing (animal/reflective knowledge, and knowledge-gradualism) while also accepting the possibility of there being different grades of fallible knowing.

d. Safety and Lucky Knowing

Even if we accept that knowledge can be fallible (section 6.b) and even if we accept that there can be different grades of (fallible) knowledge (section 6.c), we might still be concerned about the possibility of being too generous in according people knowledge. (The concern would be about the possibility of generosity’s triumphing over accuracy.) In particular, some epistemologists (for example, Prichard 2005) will insist that a moral to be learnt from the Gettier problem (section 5.b above) is that (fallible) knowledge is never present when some kinds of luck are involved in the presence of that true belief, given that justification. In this respect, can there be lucky knowledge — accurate and justified, but only luckily accurate (even given that justification)? Epistemologists usually deny that knowledge could be like that. Recently, their denial has tended to take the form of specifying that knowledge has to be safe — a condition failed, we are then told, by those beliefs found within Gettier cases:

Safety. A true belief is safely formed just in case, given how it has been formed, it would have been formed only if true.

But is that sort of condition really failed in Gettier cases? This depends on how we describe the way, within a given Gettier case, in which the final true belief has been formed. For example, it would be natural to say that in Gettier’s own first case (section 5.b above), Smith forms his belief — that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket — by listening to the company president and by counting coins in Jones’s pocket. Yet to form that belief on that basis is to proceed in a way that was likely to yield not only Smith’s same belief, but its being true. Hence, Safety does not obviously tell us why Smith’s belief — by being unsafely formed — is not knowledge.

Instead of Safety, therefore, what the epistemologically usual interpretation needs to require is something a little more complicated, along these lines:

Safety+. A true belief is safely formed just in case, given how it has been formed and given the surrounding circumstances in which it has been formed, it would have been formed only if true.

Does that show us why the usual interpretation of Gettier cases is correct? We should consider two possible answers to this question.

Yes, it does.’ The usual interpretation might say that Smith’s surrounding circumstances include the facts that he himself will get the job and that he himself has ten coins in his pocket — facts of which Smith is ignorant. He has formed his belief (that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket) on the basis only of evidence about Jones — none of which describes how Smith’s belief is in fact made true (by facts about Smith). And in general a belief is formed unsafely if it is formed by overlooking facts that make the belief true. Thus, given how Smith’s belief is formed, it was likely not to be formed as true. This explains why the belief is not knowledge.

No, it does not.’ We might say instead that, although Smith’s circumstances (which include the facts, overlooked by him, that he himself will get the job and that he himself has ten coins in his pocket) are odd, in fact they render even more likely his forming the same final belief along with the belief’s being true. After all, those circumstances now include the details constituting that final belief’s being true — the details of how it is true, details about Smith himself. So (on this alternative interpretation), Smith’s final belief is not formed unsafely. The belief’s failing to be knowledge (if it does fail to be) is therefore not explained by its being formed unsafely.

As the preceding two paragraphs show, competing interpretive possibilities exist here. It might be advisable, then, for us to be cautious about embracing the idea that an anti-luck condition like Safety or even Safety+ impels us towards the usual interpretation of Gettier cases. Those conditions might not reveal the impossibility of lucky knowledge, at least not on the basis of Gettier cases. [For debate on this, see Pritchard 2012 and Hetherington 2012.]

e. Mere True Belief

Section 5.a assumed that knowledge is at least a justified true belief. Gettier’s challenge, in section 5.b, was to knowledge’s never needing to be anything more than a justified true belief. But must knowledge be even as much as a justified true belief? In this section and the next, we will encounter a few epistemologically heterodox ways in which people have sometimes regarded knowledge, in principle at any rate, as able to be less than a justified true belief.

Here is one of those ways of drastically lowering the standard required for knowing:

Knowledge need not be anything beyond a true belief.

On that suggestion (for example, Sartwell 1991; 1992), justification — be it good evidence; be it good reliability; be it both or neither — is not needed as part of knowing. Accordingly, even when justification is in fact present and supporting a particular true belief, it was never needed for the mere presence of knowledge. This is because the belief, by being true, would be knowledge anyway, irrespectively of whether there was also justification supporting the truth of the belief. (What does the justification do in such a case? Even if it was not needed for the knowledge’s mere presence, could its presence improve the knowing? That is, could it strengthen the knowing’s grade? This would exemplify section 6.c’s idea of knowledge-gradualism.)

Might that be how knowledge is? Few epistemologists will accept so, although developed arguments against that picture are also few. The standard form of argument is an appeal to normality of linguistic usage, even intuitions: ‘Intuitively, knowledge is something more than only a true belief. Otherwise, every confident and lucky guess is knowledge!’ Is that sort of point decisive? Section 5.c raised the question of how much we should credit ourselves with having a faculty of intuitive insight into knowledge’s nature. Moreover, Alvin Goldman (1999) shows how, if we allow a weak sense of knowledge (whereby such knowledge is required only to be at least a true belief), we can still accommodate how people in many fields of inquiry and policy beyond philosophy purport to talk — apparently constructively, within those fields — of knowledge.

f. Non-Factive Conceptions

When people talk casually of knowledge, sometimes they reflect a non-factive conception of it. (Philosophers almost never talk in this way of knowledge, but at times others do.) Any non-factive conception of knowledge allows this idea:

Knowledge need not be even a true belief. (Even if it is always a belief or something related, truth is not essential for knowing.)

Here are two ways of expanding upon that idea.

Mere socially justified belief. Maybe being socially justified is enough to make a belief knowledge. That is, what most people within a particular social grouping would accept is thereby knowledge for that grouping; and knowledge would only ever be knowledge for some or another grouping, and in such a way.

Mere professionally justified belief. Some such social groupings are also professional groupings (for example, of physicists, of physicians, of high school teachers, of carpenters, and so forth). Within that kind of social grouping, being widely accepted is enough to make a belief knowledge.

Those proposals share the idea that nothing beyond acceptance within a designated group need be expected of a view if it is to be knowledge. Insisting on truth as an additional condition of the view’s being knowledge would be needless (according to these non-factive conceptions of knowledge), perhaps because any attempt within a group to ascertain whether the accepted view is true would itself need to be accepted within the group. Such acceptance would remain paramount in practice. (We might even want to say that truth is thereby being ascertained, precisely because truth is whatever is accepted widely by one’s fellow speakers and peers. For an influential instance of that pragmatist approach to conceiving of knowledge and truth, see Rorty 1979. But it is far from clear that many classical pragmatists would share that approach: see Bernstein 2010.)

Of course, we may also wonder whether those ways of talking of justification are too lenient in what they allow to be knowledge. The key question is that of whether a group could be not only mistaken in a shared belief, but even unreliable in how they form and try to support it. If so, could that belief actually be unjustified, no matter that the group’s members take it to be justified? This would be so, if justification is a kind of actual reliability (section 5.a) in being correct — reliability which even an entire group might therefore lack when sharing a particular belief.

Yet some people (even if probably no epistemologists) might wish to understand knowledge in an even more deflationary way. Here are two such approaches:

Mere sincere belief. Is it enough — for knowledge — that a person sincerely believes something to be so? Yes.

Mere sincere feeling. Is it enough — for knowledge — for a person to feel something to be so? Yes.

Suppose someone claims to have a specific piece of knowledge. Yet when asked for supporting evidence, she provides none. No matter; she claims anyway to have the knowledge: ‘I really do believe it. I sincerely feel it to be so. That’s enough for knowledge, isn’t it?’

Well, is it? Often the dictates merely of manners or friendliness dictate our not engaging critically with such claims of knowledge. So as to be polite, for example, you refrain from telling someone that his or her claim, made carefully to you, is insufficiently justified and hence is not knowledge. But epistemology professes to focus more upon accuracy and knowledge than cheeriness and decorum. Could you unwittingly be condescending or patronising, indeed, when forbearing to assess critically whether the other person really knows? To allow his or her mere claim or belief — simply because he or she feels it sincerely — to be knowledge is possibly to trivialise the notion of knowledge. Even if this is done with the intention of respecting the person (by not questioning him or her critically), the result could be to trivialise or somehow to lessen the status of the person in that setting. This is because the person would not be being treated as someone whom there is even a point in subjecting to a higher standard (such as of being genuinely justified or definitely correct). Think of how proper it could be to adopt this undemanding approach if the person was a child, or was otherwise mentally incapable of appreciating and striving to meet the higher standard. Equally, therefore, think of how improper it would be to do this if the person is not incapable of such an aim and effort — such as if he or she is a cognitively capable adult.

7. Knowing’s Point

With those reflections, we reach the question of what knowing is for. If we are to understand what knowledge is (what kind of thing it is; what its components or features are), along with whether and how it is available to us, we should reflect upon what role knowing would play within the lives of knowers. One way of doing so is to confront the question of what value there is in knowing — its inherent value, if there is any. Jonathan Kvanvig (2003) calls this the value problem within epistemology.

That issue first appeared in Plato’s Meno, as the question of how knowledge is more valuable than merely true belief. How is it more valuable, if it is, for you to know that you are hungry than merely to believe accurately that you are hungry? That question is not intended to be only or even about subjective value, such as about how grateful or pleased you may be, in a given case, to have knowledge rather than something lesser. The question concerns whatever value knowing has for a person, even if he or she does not realise that the value is present. Briefly consider a few possible ways of trying to answer that question.

Virtue epistemology. We might regard knowing as a person’s having manifested various virtues of an intellectual nature. These could be more, or they could be less, narrowly characterised. For example, an intellectual virtue may involve a cognitive faculty that is intellectually reliable (this phenomenon was mentioned in section 5.a); or, less narrowly, an intellectual virtue can reflect more of one’s being generally solicitous and respectful towards truth. And one’s manifesting such virtues would be a personal achievement. It would reflect well in general, to some non-trivial extent, upon one as an inquirer. In this sense, knowing could be an inherent part of personal development. In knowing, is one better as a person (all else being equal)? [For instances of this way of thinking, see Zagzebski 1996; Sosa 2007; Greco 2010.]

Reliable informants. Anyone with knowledge is potentially helpful to others, by being — inherently so — a reliable source of information. In a similar but restricted way, so too is a thermometer (Armstrong 1973: ch. 12); and, realising this, we create thermometers expressly for that purpose. Do we regard knowers analogously, primarily as reliable repositories of information for others? And do we create knowers likewise, when interpreting people as knowers? See section 2 above for the idea of knowledge as an artefact, created socially to serve conventionally significant purposes. In this sense, is knowing an inherent part of how people function socially? And is that valuable in itself? [On the idea of knowers as reliable informants, see Craig 1990. On knowing via testimony, see Coady 1992 and Lackey 2008.]

Usefulness. Knowledge can be used in various ways, some of which could well contribute significantly to the functioning of our lives. And this might be an intrinsic feature of knowing. That is, part — not just a consequence, but a part — of your knowing a specific truth could be that truth’s mattering to your life. You would not know it to be true simply by caring about its being true, for instance: wishful thinking is not knowing. But the importance to your life of that truth might affect what justificatory standard would need to be met, if you are to know it to be true. In this sense, perhaps satisfying some of one’s practical aims or needs is an inherent part of each case of one’s knowing. Equally, perhaps part of any knowing’s value is thereby its inherently satisfying some personal aims or needs. [For a later version of this idea, sometimes called pragmatic encroachment within knowing, see Fantl and McGrath 2009.]

A normative standard for assertions and other actions. Might knowledge (irrespective of whatever else exactly it is or does) function as a normative standard for much that we do? For example, maybe assertion is apt only when expressing or reflecting knowledge. Perhaps even a much wider range of actions is apt only when they are expressing or reflecting knowledge. In this sense, possibly knowing is an inherent contributor to our living as we should — so that we are performing various actions, such as assertion, only when our doing so is apt. [For these ideas about knowledge’s functioning as a normative standard, see Williamson 2000. On Williamson’s epistemology, see Greenough and Pritchard 2009.]

And thus we have a few possible proposals as to knowing’s possible point, bearing upon what knowledge’s inherent value could be. We might blend some or all of them with ideas from earlier in the article, ideas bearing upon knowing’s nature. Some of those combinations will be more natural than others; unless, of course, none of them will be even a little natural. We should not forget the possibility of knowing’s failing to have a point or value in itself. Maybe it will lack, at any rate, all value beyond whatever value is inherent in the presence of a true belief — in one’s being correct at all in a belief about something at all.

Let's close with another idea, touching upon those others:

Existing with value. Perhaps there are few, if any, particular facts which one needs to know in order to exist. But imagine existing while knowing nothing. (Maybe this would reflect a combination of circumstances. First, possibly some of your beliefs would be false. Second, if knowledge is more than true belief — something questioned in section 6.e — then perhaps you would have true beliefs which fail in a further way to be knowledge. Third, presumably some truths escape your attention altogether.) Quite possibly, we would regard such an existence — wholly empty of knowing — as somehow devalued, somehow failing. Bear in mind that there could still be actions and opinions aplenty within your life; but (given the imagined scenario) never would there be knowledge either in them or guiding them. And if such an existence would be a failure to that extent, then perhaps the inherent point or value in knowing a particular truth is the point or value in knowing at all — with this being, in turn, some more or less substantial part of the point or value in living at all.

That proposal is highly programmatic. It would make knowing’s value personal, in an existential way. It would be one’s existing’s having a value which it would otherwise lack (if it was not to include knowing). Hopefully, there are other potential sources of value within a life. But maybe knowing is one aspect of living with value. Without knowing, possibly one’s living lacks part of its possible point — regardless of how, more specifically and fully, we describe that point.

This suggestion, although vague, is substantive enough to imply that if one was to know nothing then to a correlative extent (however far that extent reaches) one would not be alive in a valuable way. To that same extent, one’s living at all would be devalued inherently. (One might not feel or notice its being so. But it would in fact be so.) Hence, the suggestion has the following explanatory implication, for a start. It could help to illuminate why sceptical doubts (such as in section 4) have been a part of philosophy for so long. That could also be why such doubts should remain present within philosophy, at least as hovering dangers to be defused if possible — and also, if ever defused, to remind us of dangers thereby past. In effect, sceptical doubts question whether our lives, no matter what else we do or accomplish within these, are imbued with as much value as we would otherwise assume to be ours. This threat does not make the sceptical doubts correct, but it might cloak them with a living potency, an existential urgency. It does remind us of why the alternative should be sought: Knowing would be our protection against that potential emptiness within our lives.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, Barry. 2004. Knowledge and Civilization. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Armstrong, D. M. 1973. Belief, Truth and Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bengson, John and Moffett, Marc A. (Eds.). 2012. Knowing How: Essays on Knowledge, Mind, and Action. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bernstein, Richard B. 2010. The Pragmatic Turn. Cambridge: Polity.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason: A Rationalist Account of A Priori Justification. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cherniak, Christopher. 1986. Minimal Rationality. Cambridge: The MIT Press.
  • Chisholm, Roderick M. 1989. Theory of Knowledge. 3rd ed. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall.
  • Coady, C. A. J. 1992. Testimony: A Philosophical Study. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1986. “Knowledge and Context.” The Journal of Philosophy 83, 574-585.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1991. “Skepticism, Relevance, and Relativity.” In B. P. McLaughlin, ed., Dretske and His Critics. Cambridge: Blackwell, 17-37.
  • Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard. 2004. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Craig, Edward. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. (Ed.). 1988. Perceptual Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DePaul, Michael R. and Ramsey, William. (Eds.). 1998. Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and its Role in Philosophical Inquiry. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • DeRose, Keith. 1999. “Contextualism: An Explanation and Defense.” In J. Greco and E. Sosa, eds., The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, 187-205.
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Author Information

Stephen Hetherington
Email: s.hetherington@unsw.edu.au
University of New South Wales
Australia

Categories: Epistemology