Rudolf Hermann Lotze (1817–1881)
Hermann Lotze was a key figure in the philosophy of the second half of the nineteenth century, influencing practically all the leading philosophical schools of the late nineteenth and the coming twentieth century, including (i) the neo-Kantians; (ii) Brentano and his school; (iii) The British idealists; (iv) William James’s pragmatism; (v) Husserl’s phenomenology; (vi) Dilthey’s philosophy of life; (vii) Frege’s new logic; (viii) the early Cambridge analytic philosophy.
Lotze’s main philosophical significance is as a contributor to an anti-Hegelian objectivist movement in German-speaking Europe. The publication of the first editions of his Metaphysics (1841) and Logic (1843) constituted the third wave of this movement. The first came in 1837, in the form of Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre. The second came three years later, in 1840, when Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg published his Logische Untersuchungen. Lotze’s early works furthered this objectivist line of thought. And when a new surge of philosophical objectivism crested again in the 1870s, Lotze used the opportunity to restate his position in the second editions of his Logic (1874) and of his Metaphysics (1879).
Closely following Trendelenburg, Lotze advanced an objectivist philosophy that did not start from the subject-object opposition in epistemology. He insisted that this opposition is based on a metaphysical relation that is more fundamental (Schnädelbach 1983, p. 219). In this way, the very possibility for philosophical subjectivism was suspended.
Lotze promoted the “universal inner connection of all reality” by uniting all objects and terms in a comprehensive, ordered arrangement . Especially important to Lotze’s theories of order is the concept of relation. A favorite saying of his illustrates this point. “The proposition, ‘things exist’,” he repeatedly said, “has no intelligible meaning except that they stand in relations to each other.”
The priority of orderly relations in Lotze’s ontology entailed that nature is a cosmos, not chaos. Furthermore, since the activity that is typical for humans—thinking—is an activity of relating, man is a microcosm. This point convinced Lotze to jointly study microcosm and macrocosm, a conviction which found expression in his three-volume book on Microcosm (1856/64).
The distinction between the universe as macrocosm and humanity as microcosm gave rise to another central component of Lotze’s philosophy: his anthropological stance. According to Lotze, the fundamental metaphysical and logical problems of philosophy are to be discussed and answered through the lens of the microcosm, that is, in terms of the specific perceptual and rational characteristics of human beings. There is no alternative access to them.
Lotze’s philosophical work was guided by his double qualification in medicine and philosophy. While he chose academic philosophy as his profession, his medical training was an ever-present influence on his philosophical thought, in two respects. First, his overall philosophy was characterized by a concern for scientific exactness; he criticized any philosophical doctrine that discards the results of science. Second, he devoted many academic years to (more or less philosophical) studies in medicine and physiology. His efforts in this direction resulted in foundational works in psychology, in virtue of which there is reason to count him among psychology’s founding fathers.
Table of Contents
- Life and Works
- Philosophical Principles and Methods
- Theoretical Philosophy
- Philosophy and Life
- References and Further Reading
Rudolf Hermann Lotze was born in Bautzen (Saxony) on May 21, 1817, the third child of a military medical doctor. Two years later the family moved to nearby Zittau.
Lotze’s father died in 1827, when Hermann was 12. Soon thereafter, the family got into serious financial troubles. This series of events shaped Lotze’s character in significant ways. He was independent, ambitious, serious and thrifty, but also melancholic, reserved, even shy.
Between 1828 and 1834 Hermann attended the local High School (Gymnasium). In 1834 he registered at the University of Leipzig. He wanted to study philosophy—a wish nourished by his love of art and poetry—and he did. However, his experience with financial hardship urged him to simultaneously pursue a degree in the more practical and lucrative field of medicine. Four years later, in 1838, he received doctorates in both disciplines.
After practicing medicine for a year in Zittau, Lotze joined the University of Leipzig as an adjunct lecturer in the Department of Medicine in 1839, and in the Department of Philosophy in 1840. In 1840 Lotze achieved dual degrees, based on post-doctoral dissertations (Habilitation), in medicine and philosophy. As a result, he received a license to teach (venia legendi) at German universities in these two fields.
In 1839, Lotze became engaged to Ferdinande Hoffmann of Zittau (b. 1819), and they were married in 1844. The marriage produced four sons. Lotze was deeply attached to his wife, and her death in 1875 was a loss from which he never recovered. One of his numerous British students, Richard Haldane (who later became Lord Chancellor), described him after his wife’s death as one who “seldom sees people, as he lives a sort of solitary life in the country where his home is, about half a mile from Göttingen, and is looked upon as unsociable” (Kuntz 1971, p. 50).
In the year of his marriage, 1844, Lotze was named Herbart’s successor as Professor of Philosophy at the University of Göttingen. He remained at Göttingen until 1880, when he was named Professor of Philosophy at the University of Berlin. A few months later (on July 1, 1881) he died of a cardiac defect that he had suffered from all his life. He was succeeded in the Berlin Chair by Wilhelm Dilthey.
Among Lotze’s teachers were Gustav Theodor Fechner, from whom he learned the importance of quantitative experiment, and Christian Weiße, who helped the young Hermann to see the philosophy of German idealism from its aesthetic perspective. Lotze was especially influenced by Kant, Hegel, Herbart, Schelling and Fries. He was personally introduced to Fries—who at the time was a Professor in Jena—by his friend and Fries’ student Ernst Friedrich Apelt.
Some philosophers believe that Lotze was also influenced by his countryman Leibniz (Leibniz was born and raised in Leipzig, Saxony). Indeed, there are some common points between these two philosophers. But Lotze himself denied such an influence. A hidden influence (seldom discussed in the literature) came from Schleiermacher—via Trendelenburg—who had insisted against the Kant–Drobisch idea of formal logic that logic must be developed together with metaphysics.
Many British and American philosophers of the 1870s and 1880s admired Lotze. William James considered him “the most exquisite of contemporary minds” (Perry 1935, ii., p. 16). Josiah Royce, James Ward and John Cook Wilson studied under him in Göttingen. Oxford’s T. H. Green was so enthusiastic about Lotze that in 1880 he began the large project of translating his System of Philosophy. The project was incomplete two years later at the time of Green’s death, but it was continued by a team under the guidance of Bernard Bosanquet. Besides Green and Bosanquet, A. C. Bradley (brother of F. H. Bradley), R. L. Nettleship and J. Cook Wilson took part in the general editing. The translation appeared in 1884. In parallel, James Ward and Henry Sidgwick at Cambridge were instrumental in preparing the translation of Lotze’s Microcosm by Elizabeth Hamilton (daughter of William Hamilton) and E. E. Constance Jones, which was published in 1885.
Lotze’s first publications were his “lesser” Metaphysics (1841) and “lesser” Logic (1843), in which he charted his philosophical program. His Habilitation in medicine was published in 1842 under the title Allgemeine Pathologie und Therapie als mechanische Naturwissenschaften.
Over the next ten years, Lotze worked on problems at the intersection of medicine and philosophy, in particular the relation between soul and body. The result of these studies were published in two books: Allgemeine Physiologie des körperlichen Lebens (1851) and Medicinische Psychologie oder Physiologie der Seele (1852). During this period, Lotze also published extensive essays on “Leben. Lebenskraft” (1843), “Instinct” (1844), and “Seele und Seelenleben” (1846). In the late 1840s he published important works on aesthetics: “Über den Begriff der Schönheit” (1845), “Über Bedingungen der Kunstschönheit” (1847), and “Quaestiones Lucretianae” (1852).
Microcosm (published in 3 volumes between 1856 and 1864) marked a new period in Lotze’s philosophical development. In this monumental work, he synthesized his earlier ideas: the logico-metaphysical ideas of 1841–3, his psychological ideas of 1842–52, and his aesthetic ideas of 1845–52. Despite some interpretations to the contrary, the book was not only a popular treatise. It also developed technical logical and metaphysical ideas in a form that was unknown from his earlier work.
Shortly after Lotze finished Microcosm, he started his System of Philosophy which consisted of his “greater” Logic (1874), and “greater” Metaphysic (1879). A third part of the system, on Ethics, Aesthetics and Religious Philosophy, remained unfinished at the time of his death. Briefly, the difference between Microcosm and System of Philosophy can be put this way: while Microcosm was something of an encyclopedia of philosophical deliberations on human life, private and public, the System was an encyclopedia of the philosophical disciplines.
Lotze possessed an extraordinary ability for studying languages. Many of his papers were written in French, some of them in Latin (e.g., “Quaestiones lucretianae”), and one in English (“Philosophy in the last forty years”, 1880). Lotze also published a volume of his Poetry (Lotze 1840).
It will come as no surprise, given his medical training, that Lotze was a scientifically oriented philosopher. His credo was that no philosophical theory should contradict scientific results. In his medical writings, and above all in the programmatic Allgemeine Pathologie of 1842, he rejected all forms of vitalism (which claims that organismic life is explained by causes other than biochemical reactions) more radically than anyone before him.
Lotze was not a lonely pioneer in embracing the scientific orientation in philosophy. In this he followed his teacher and friend, the early experimental psychologist Gustav Fechner, as well as Hegel’s contemporaries and rivals, Fries and Herbart. However, he was unique insofar as he introduced a method for recasting particular problems of German Idealism in a refined, philosophical–logical form that was science-friendly. A typical example in this respect was his approach to studying thinking. Lotze connected thinking to two “logically different” domains, valuing and becoming (see section 3.d, below), and considered each of them to be explored by a special science: logic investigates the validity of thinking, and psychology investigates the development of thinking.
Lotze’s new method disciplined metaphysics and ethics on the one hand, and enriched logic on the other. In other words, it made metaphysics and ethics more exact, formal disciplines, while making logic more philosophical.
One of Lotze’s motives for embracing this approach was his desire to eliminate the radical disagreements that traditionally had characterized philosophical theorizing—a main source of philosophy’s developing reputation for being unscientific. Lotze believed that the formal (logical) presentation of philosophical theories eliminates their subjective side—the principal source of philosophical animus—and that, thus purified, even seemingly contradictory systems could be shown consistent with one another (Misch 1912, p. xxii).
Lotze’s commitment to this approach led to radical changes in his philosophical practice. In particular, he started to investigate philosophical problems bit by bit, piecemeal, so that a later discovery of a mistake in his investigation did not made his overall philosophy false. (This practice was later followed by Russell (cf. Russell 1918, p. 85) and became central to analytic philosophy.) Lotze’s piecemeal philosophy was facilitated by the introduction—or in some cases the revival—of many concepts which are still widely discussed today, including: (i) the concept of value in logic (its best known successor was the concept of truth-value); (ii) the context principle; (iii) the idea of concept/judgment as a function; (iv) the metaphors of coloring expressions and of saturated–unsaturated expressions; (v) the objective content of perception or the concept of the given (its best known successor was the concept of sense-data); (vi) the objective content of judgments; and (vii) anti-psychologism in logic. These concepts proved to be seminal to a certain line of German-language philosophy: in various combinations, they play central roles in the thought of Frege, Brentano, Husserl, and those associated with their schools.
In short, Lotze introduced a several philosophical–logical problems and theses which could be further investigated independently of his overall system. In this sense he instructed his readers to regard his philosophy as “an open market, where the reader may simply pass by the goods he does not want” (Lotze 1874, p. 4). Among other things, this characteristic of Lotze’s philosophy made him the most “pillaged” philosopher of the nineteenth century (Passmore 1966, p. 51). Many of his theses were embraced without crediting him.
A central principle of Lotze’s philosophy was that all processes and movements—physical, biological, psychological, bodily, social, ethical, cultural—are accomplished in a way that can best be called mechanical. This “Principle of Mechanism” helped Lotze to avoid references to deep, metaphysical causes, such as vitalism in the philosophy of biology. In contrast, he insisted that, when theorizing, we are obliged to look to reality as revealed by experiment. On this point, he was clearly influenced by his education as a medical doctor.
At the same time, however, Lotze believed that there were features of experience—such as life, mind, and purpose (telos)—that could not be explained mechanistically. Lotze took these limitations on mechanistic explanation to indicate—even delineate—a “higher and essential being”, reference to which was necessary in order to make mechanistic explanations fully intelligible. For instance, Lotze thought that our ideas of forces and natural laws describe but do not explain how things work in nature. To understand this, we must connect them with the realm of the trans-sensual (Übersinnliche, 1856b, p. 306). Only by making this connection can we understand the processes carried out through these mechanisms.
At first glance, this move to teleology as a necessary explanatory category may seem incompatible with Lotze’s own Principle of Mechanism. He did not think so, however, and part of Lotze’s achievement was the way in which he sought to show these prima facie contrary categories compatible.
Lotze’s solution was to declare the Principle of Mechanism not a metaphysical principle, but a purely methodological principle belonging mainly to the natural sciences. That is, the principle does not imply that reality is, at bottom, mechanistic. Rather, it only prescribes a methodology and a mode of interpretation or description as means to achieving a useful understanding of the processes of our environment. As purely methodological, Lotze’s “Principle of Mechanism” does not claim to capture the full nature of those processes, nor even to begin to describe their sources. Nor does it claim to explain—or explain away—life, mind, and purpose. To the contrary, it is consistent with the view that mechanistic processes are the means by which purposes are realized in the world.
Thus, ultimately, Lotze’s position required seeking both mechanistic descriptions of natural processes and teleological explanations of those processes. Lotze called this hybrid position, “teleomechanism,” or “teleological idealism.”
In Lotze’s hands, the “Principle of Teleomechanism” (i.e., that ultimate explanations should have the hybrid form described above) shapes logic, metaphysics and science through what he calls idealities (Orth 1986, p. 45)- the fundamental orienting concepts of these fields. Among the idealities are ethical values, logical validities and aesthetic worth. In science and metaphysics, the idealities of spatial and temporal order, the principle of atomicity (cf. section 3.a,e) and the aforementioned relationism (cf. the opening summary at the head of this article), play a central role.
The declared objective of Lotze’s philosophy was a “reflection on the meaning of our human being [Dasein]” (1856b, p. 304). The urgency of this task was a consequence of the scientific and industrial revolution of the beginning and the middle of the nineteenth century. That revolution dramatically changed the way in which humans see the cosmos and universe. It eroded the unity of God and humanity; traditional mythology proved inconsistent. As a consequence, the world started to seem alien, cold, immense. A substantial weakening in religious belief followed. Lotze saw danger in the numerous attempts (on the side of the mechanic philosopher-scientists like Georg Büchner, Heinrich Czolbe, Franz Fick, Jacob Moleschott and Karl Vogt) to prove that the microcosm of human beings is merely mechanical, or materialistic. His objective was to disprove such attempts and to make people feel at home in the world again.
Contrary to the trends in then-current anthropology, Lotze did not seek to explain humanity in terms of the technologies it produced. Rather, he thought, the keys for understanding the human race are found in the results of human education and schooling (Bildung), as they have been developed in history. This meant that his philosophical investigations began not simply with the elements of human culture, but with developed human cultures taken as wholes, and indeed the history of such cultures taken as a whole. From these wholes, he then worked “backwards”, analyzing their “parts”, such as logic, metaphysics, science and mathematics. This is the approach of regressive analysis (1874, § 208; 1879, pp. 179 ff.).
Lotze believed that the main educational goods (Bildungsgüter) of human culture are usually conveyed by poetry and religion. They provide a “higher perspective on things,” the “point of view of the heart.” This means that the mechanistic processes upon which science focuses are not the only key to understanding the world; they are not even the most important key. To the contrary, science becomes intelligible and useful for humans only in connection with the historically developed values and forms of schooling and education characteristic of a developed human culture (cf. Lotze’s Principle of Teleomechanism, in section 2.b, above). This point is clearly seen in the fact that we have a priori notions neither of bad and good, nor of blue or sweet(1864, p. 241).
But how exactly can the history of culture command the shape of logic, metaphysics and science? Lotze’s answer in brief is: through the idealities they produce. As magnitudes identifiable in experience, these idealities serve as orientating concepts for all academic disciplines, giving them direction and purpose within the context of a unified human life in a developed human culture.
Following Kant, Lotze claimed that idealities pertain to mental, not material, reality. However, they require matter in order to be exemplified or articulated by human beings. We understand idealities only in experience. To be more specific, we find them at work above all in our sensual life and in our feelings of pleasure and displeasure. We find them further in ethics, aesthetics, science, mathematics, metaphysics and logic. The spatial order, for example, is such an ideality: it is revealed via the matrix of discrete material entities in their dimensional magnitude and in the spaces between them, but it is not given as another thing among things. Rather, it is mentally “noticed” as a necessary “backdrop” to, a “condition of the possibility of”, the matrix of material things. (This conception was adopted by Bertrand Russell in his Essays on the Foundations of Geometry; cf. Milkov 2008)
Given his views on the relation of the material to the ideal, Lotze was convinced that the quarrel between materialism and idealism was misguided. . It was a quarrel about meaning: Idealists see too much meaning (borne by ideal entities) in reality, while materialists see no meaning in it at all. Fearing that the characteristically vague aesthetic elements of human experience would undermine exact science, the materialists attempted to extract all humanistic meaning from reality by sanctioning only mathematical descriptions of mechanically-construed natural processes (the likes of which we see in scientific formulae, such as F=MA in physics). But Lotze thought such fears were in vain. Just as mechanism was compatible with teleology, so Lotze thought that aesthetics (poetry) and religion (revealed truth) were compatible with the mathematics and calculation preferred by the materialists. By the same token, the acceptance of mechanism as a purely methodological principle in science did not invalidate the belief in free will. On the contrary: since mechanism made the spiritual effort to achieve the trans-sensual more strenuous, it only “increased the poetical appeal of the world”(1856b, p. 306).
Lotze’s main objective was the investigation of the concrete human being with her imaginings, dreams and feelings. He considered these elements—as expressed in poetry and art—as constitutive of a human person and her life. This explains the central role that the concept of home (Heimat) plays in his metaphysics. The related concept in his philosophy of mind is feeling and heart (Gemüt), as different from mind (Geist) and soul (Seele). Indeed, Lotze introduced the concept of heart in the wake of German mysticism (e.g., Meister Eckhart); however, he used it in a quite realistic sense. Heart is what makes us long for home. The longing itself is a result of our desires which we strive to satisfy. Life consists, above all, in consuming (geniesen) goods, material and ideal. This conception of human life is, of course, close to hedonism. (cf. section 3.a)
Lotze did not introduce anthropological investigation in philosophy. Rather, it was started in the sixteenth century, in an effort to renovate theology. During the next three centuries, anthropology became a favorite subject among German university philosophers—including Kant. In his anthropology, however, Lotze did not follow Kant. Kant distinguished between theoretical philosophy and mundane philosophy, with anthropology following in the latter category. But Lotze abolished Kant’s distinction between the theoretical and mundane (1841a, p. 17), and he developed his “theoretical anthropology” exactly in order to merge the two philosophical disciplines into one.
The conclusion Lotze made was that Kant’s question “what can I know?” cannot be answered in the abstract; it can be only answered in terms of embodied persons in concrete socio-historical situations. Only when we embrace this perspective, Lotze thought, can we also grasp the depth and the importance of metaphysical problems.
This point brings us to the most important characteristic of Lotze’s philosophy. Lotze did not simply shift from metaphysics to anthropology. Rather, his anthropology became philosophy proper (Orth 1986, p. 43).
From the very beginning of his career, Lotze’s subscribed to the view that, “When we cannot necessarily join one of the dominating parties, we [shall …] stay in the middle via free eclecticism” (Lotze 1843, p. 1). Today the word “eclecticism” is used mainly in a pejorative sense, but this was not true for Lotze. To the contrary, he thought eclecticism a most useful method in philosophy, and in 1840 even lauded it in a poem entitled “Eclecticism” (Kroneberg 1899, p. 218).
Lotze’s eclecticism was characterized by his logical turn in metaphysics. Indeed, as seen in section 2.a, the latter made his philosophy a rigorous science, enabling him to compress many of the problems of generations of philosophers into a unified theory. This point explains the astonishing success with which Lotze employed his eclecticism. It enabled him to look past the differences of philosophers like Kant, J. G. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, and to focus on what he took to be the most valuable ideas common to them. Distilling their thought, he frequently reformulated their views in logically exact expressions.
Consistent with his eclecticism, Lotze also used something approaching Hegel’s dialectical method (Lotze, 1841a, p. 320). This is why “there are some passages [in Lotze’s writings] in which he does seem conscious of the contradictions and [nevertheless] attempts to mediate between the two,” rather than eliminating one of them. (Kuntz 1971, p. 34).
Some authors have a negative view of these Hegelian tendencies in Lotze. For example, Eduard von Hartmann complains that “there is scarcely a ‘yes’ by Lotze, which is not undermined at another place by a ‘no’” (Hartmann 1888, p. 147). Yet other philosophers, like George Santayana, have recognized that, despite the apparent contradictions, Lotze’s system remained very consistent overall. Careful attention reveals that most of the supposed contradictions are apparent only, and result from the failure to note the varying perspectives from which Lotze conducted his philosophical research.
For instance, as discussed in section 2.b., Lotze insisted that mechanistic descriptions were appropriate and indeed required in science, but inappropriate in metaphysics, where teleological explanations are required. It is easy to see this double-demand for mechanism and teleology as contradictory, so long as one fails to recognize that each demand is a “methodological” demand only, made by the requirements of two disciplines with differing norms and purposes. Similarly, the idealistic tendencies of his system were part of a psychological description of reality, “a personal manner of reading things, a poetic intuition of the cosmic life” (Santayana 1889, 155). Other aspects of his system—like his atomism—were radically objectivistic, suited only to the demands of scientific description and scientific work.
Lotze’s perspectivalism—his tendency to treat some views as “merely methodological” from within a given disciplinary perspective—can make him difficult to follow. The problem is compounded by his tendency to, on occasion, switch perspectives in the course of a single work. For instance, he begins his ontological investigations with pluralistic realism only to end it with monistic idealism. As a result, Lotze’s views are frequently difficult to state, and also difficult to criticize.
Lotze also introduced a specific method of discussing different views (Ansichten) on the subject under scrutiny. He was against the hasty satisfaction of our theoretical needs and expectations through one-sided theories. Furthermore, Lotze claimed that his final solutions were merely views which satisfy “needs of the heart”. Incidentally, this point can be comfortably interpreted in the sense of Freud–Wittgenstein: philosophical puzzles are similar to mental neuroses, which can be treated by changing the perspective.
Lotze’s ethics were influenced by J.F. Herbart, who preceded Lotze as the Philosophy Chair in Gottingen. The starting point of philosophical exploration for J.F. Hebart begins with the analysis of the objects immediately given in inner and outer experience. (Pester 1997, p. 119). Being was for Herbart real—beyond and independent from the world of ideas. From here followed a strict division between theoretical and practical philosophy—reality and values, being and obligation, are independent one from another.
Lotze agreed with Herbart that we cannot draw conclusions about value from facts about reality, but he insisted that we can do the reverse; that is, we can draw conclusions about reality from facts about values. He expressed this belief in the claim that both logic and metaphysics are ultimately based on ethics. Lotze already declared this idea in his first philosophical work, his lesser Metaphysics, where he claimed that “the beginning of metaphysics lies not in itself but in ethics” (1841a, p. 329). Two years later he postulated that “the logical forms cannot be independent from metaphysical presupposition, and they also cannot be totally detached from the realm of morality” (1843, p. 7).
Of course, ethics is not presented in metaphysics in propositional form. Rather, ethics enters metaphysics in judgments about which possibilities for ordering facts correspond to an ideally presupposed order or to Lotze’s idealities (see section 2.c, above). In this sense, there is no knowledge without ethical presuppositions.
Lotze’s idealities found expression above all in the concept of value. More especially, Lotze claimed that “values are the key for the world of forms” (1857, p. 22). This position explains why in the literature, he is widely considered to be the philosopher who introduced the concept of “values” in philosophy.
Lotze was adamant that the measure of values is only the “satisfaction of the sentimental needs [Gemütsbedürfnisse]” (1852, p. 242). The most natural of these satisfactions is pleasure. This means that moral principles are to be founded on the principle of delight (Lustprincip). This is an empirical solution to the problems of ethics which is clearly related to Epicurean hedonism.
This position explains why Lotze avoided Kant’s formalism of the categorical imperative. Instead, following Fries, he accepted a psychological basis of the maxims of ethics, claiming that we draw our moral principles from the immediate certainty with which we consider something as true or good (1858, p. 287).
The point which unites the subjectivism of this position with Lotze’s idiosyncratic objectivism (cf. the summary) is that, despite assuming values to be recognized via delight, he does not limit them to persons only. Rather, Lotze understands values—by way of being idealities—also as crucial for apprehension of physical facts: they constitute the “meaning of the world in general—as a universal method for speculative expansion of all appearances” (Misch 1912, p. lxv).
According to Lotze’s metaphysics, the world consists of substances in relation, and so of substances and relations. Let’s examine these categories, beginning with substances.
In the Aristotelian tradition, only wholes exhibiting an organic unity, such as a particular human being or a particular horse, can count as substances—arbitrary collections of things, like a heap of sand or the random assortment of items in a person’s pocket, do not count.
Lotze does not embrace either of these two conceptions of substance. Instead, he defends a constructivist position which assumes that substance is a whole composed of parts that hang together in a particular relation of dependence. More especially, the elements of the substance (the whole) stand to one another in a relation in which the elements effect each other reciprocally, binding each other together into the whole that they constitute.
In order to specify this kind of relation, Lotze borrowed from Ammonius (28,1,14) the term effectus transeunt (“action in passing”, or “cursory action”). Effectus transeunt is the minimal effect that elements A and B exercise on each other in the substance M, in virtue of which they stay in M. Through effectus transeunt, the otherwise independent elements of the substance became interdependent. To put this in other words, effectus transeunt produces the “ontological glue” that binds elements into organic wholes.
Formally, we can describe the construction of a substance this way. The elements of a substance (a whole) stand to one another in a reciprocal relation and in a unique order (Folge)(Lotze 1879, § 69). Furthermore, if we call the whole (the substance) M, and its elements A, B, and R (A and B are particular elements which are in the focus of our attention, and R designates the sum of all unspecified elements which can occur in the whole), we can denote the whole with the formula M=φ[A B R], where φ stands for the connection between the elements. The type of connection is a resultant of the specific relations and positions of the elements of the substance, as well as of their order in it (§ 70). In fact, this is the structure of the minimal composite unity.
In general, relations play a central role in Lotze’s ontology. One of his slogans was: “It belongs to the notion and nature of existing [object] to be related” (Lotze 1885, ii. p. 587). Lotze was interested in what Bertrand Russell has later called “internal” relations, or relations between the elements in the substances. The substances themselves stay in “external” relations to one another.
The external relations are of various kinds, each of which has its idiosyncratic type of coordinate. For example, the system of geometrical relations and the system of colors are two networks of relations essential to the material world, but not to the world of art, or to the spiritual world of men. There are also other kinds of relation-networks (see Lotze 1856a, pp. 461–2; Lotze 1885 ii. p. 575). For instance, from the perspective of the subject, Lotze’s universe has at least two further relation-networks:
- that of perception; this network is the universe of what he calls “local-signs” (see section 3.e);
- that of judgments and concepts; this network is the universe of states of affairs. (see section 3.d)
In metaphysics proper, Lotze transformed the Hegelian dichotomy between being and becoming to the trichotomy being, becoming, value. The given is; it is opposed to both what happens (e.g. changes) and to the validities. The transition between these three is impossible.
From the perspective of his conception of values, Lotze also suggested a new interpretation of Plato’s theory of ideas. Ideas have two characteristics: (i) they have their own autonomous being; (ii) in the same time, ideas have properties, similar to those of the objects of reality. Lotze’s claim was that these two conditions are only fulfilled by values. In fact, Plato’s ideas are validities of truths. Plato misrepresented them as “ideas” only because in Greek there is no expression for things which have no being: and values are just such things (1874, § 317). The fact that Plato’s ideas are validities, Lotze argues further, explains why they are beyond space and time, beyond things and minds, remaining at that atomistic. Lotze’s interpretation of Plato’s ideas was further developed by Paul Natorp (Natorp 1902).
Lotze’s task in epistemology was to secure knowledge which is to be extracted, and separated, from perception. The main characteristic of knowledge is that it is true. To Lotze, this means that it, and only it, presents the things as they really are—and, in fact, that is what is expected from thinking as a result.
The difference between perception and knowledge (or thinking; in identifying thinking and knowledge Lotze was followed by Frege) can be set out in the following way. Perception (including imagining, daydreaming, etc.) notes accidental relations of ideas, but knowledge asserts a natural fit (a “necessary connection”) among these ideas: they belong together (zusammengehören). In other words, the perceiving mind conceives “kaleidoscopically” a multiplicity of contingent pictures (Bilder) (1843, p. 72). Only then comes thinking, which consists in going through the ideas a second time, producing in this way “secondary thoughts” (Nebengedanken). The latter connect only those ideas which intrinsicallybelong together.
Lotze describes his “secondary thoughts” as constituting “a critical stand towards an idea.” This conception assumes that we have a kind of intuition that helps us to judge is the connection of ideas that lie before us—in our perception—true, or false.
Some authors have claimed that this idea is a further transformation of Hegel’s method of dialectical self-development of the truth (Misch 1912, p. xxvii). But it would be more correct to say that Lotze’s secondary thoughts are an incorporation into logic of the old Platonic–Aristotelian idea of peirastic (tentative, experimental) inquiry that tests different opinions and decides which connection of ideas they make is true and which false. (This interpretation was supported by Lotze’s pupils, Julius Bergmann and Wilhelm Windelband.) Indeed, Lotze is adamant that “this inner regularity of the content sought-after, being unknown yet, is not open to us in specific realistic definitions of thought. However, being present in the form of opinion, it really has [...] the defensive [intuitive] force to negotiate what is not suitable to her” (Lotze 1841a, p. 33).
The concept of the judgment and its content (Urteilsinhalt) played a central role in Lotze’s logic. He claimed that the content of judgment is not an interrelation of ideas, as Hume and Mill believed, but an interrelation of objective contents, or things: it is a state of affairs (a concept introduced by Lotze and later also used by Husserl and Wittgenstein—cf. Milkov 2002). Since there is no difference between the content of judgments and reality, the state of affairs has the structure of the substance or of the minimal composite unity. This position was another expression of Lotze’s objectivism (see the summary).
But the content of judgment has also two other dimensions which have little to do with its structural characteristics:
First, the content of the judgment is asserted by the judgment. Thus, the judgment has w an assertoric quality, and what Lotze calls its affirmation (Bejahung), or “positing” (Setzung). In somewhat different sense, this idea was further developed by Hans Reichenbach. For Lotze, this is the ultimate quality of a judgment—it is what makes a judgment a judgment, as opposed to complex of terms. Later, this conception was also adopted by Frege who assumed that the judgment acknowledges the truth of its content so that only this acknowledgement makes the combination of ideas a judgment. In other words, the judgment is an acceptance, or assumption of content as true, or rejecting it as false.
This characteristic of judgment was connected with a variant of the context principle, according to which a word has a meaning not in isolation but in the context of a proposition in which it occurs: “The affirmation of a single notion has no meaning which we can specify; we can affirm nothing but a judgment in which the content of one notion is brought into relation with that of another” (Lotze 1864, p. 465; Lotze 1885 ii. p. 582).Frege followed Lotze also on this point.
Second, the content of judgment has a value: this is a point that connects Lotze’s logic with his ethics(cf. section 2.c, above). To be more specific, Lotze claimed that concepts have meaning (Bedeutung), but not value. They can have a value only through the proposition in which they occur—in its context (Lotze 1874, § 321). In 1882 Lotze’s closest pupil, Wilhelm Windelband, introduced the concept of truth-value in the wake of this idea. Nine years later, this concept was also embraced by Frege in his “Function and Concept.”
Following Herbart, and developing further the idea of content of judgment, Lotze also explored the idea of the “given” (Gegebene) in philosophy. More especially, Lotze understood the given as an “experienced content of perception” that was different from the content of judgment, or the state of affairs. Later this conception of the given was instrumental by coining the concept of sense-data (see Milkov 2001).
As was shown in the explanation of the principle of teleomechanism (section 2.b), Lotze was adamant that the way in which phenomena are explained in physics is not appropriate for the mental or psychical world. For instance, mechanical descriptions do not explain why we experience the effects of light-waves as color, or of sound-waves as tones. In this regard, Lotze criticized Herbart’s view that the interaction of ideas in a person’s mind (such as how ideas compete to capture a person’s attention or compel belief) is to be explained on analogy with the physical conception of force. On Lotze’s view, the content of ideas is more important than their intensity(1856a, pp. 238 ff.).
Concerning the relation between soul and body, the so-called “mind-body problem,” Lotze did not offer a positive theory—in fact, he denies that we can understand this relation—but adopted a version of occasionalism. Occasionalism is the view that events in the mental realm are synchronized with events in the material realm in such a way that it seems that the two realms are interacting, even though they do not in fact interact. To adopt this as a methodological stance was Lotze’s way of saying that, even though the two realms may interact, we do not need to understand how they do in order to have a perfectly good, practical theory about the relation between mind and body (1852, pp. 77 f.).
To the extent that Lotze develops a solution to the “mind-body problem,” he does so by introducing his famous conception of local-signs (Localzeichen), which explains the relation between mind and matter in terms of our perception of space and movement. According to Lotze, what we directly see when perceiving a movement are only patches of color. What helps us to perceive the fact of movement is the effort that we ourselves make in perceiving the movement. Lotze calls this stimulus a “local-sign.” It is a means of transforming sense-perceptions into space-values.
This means that our knowledge of the connection of mind to matter is not a fruit of reflection but of activity (in this assumption Lotze followed J. G. Fichte); it is not simply a matter of grasping. Indeed, the process of space-perceiving is an activity of reconstruction of the external objects, and events, in consciousness (1856a, pp. 328 f.). This conception was another critique of the purely mechanical understanding in philosophy.
Lotze’s theory of logical signs was further developed by Hermann von Helmholtz in the conception that sense-organs do not supply isomorphic pictures of the outer world, but only signals which perception transforms further into pictures. Helmholtz’s theory, in turn, was later embraced by the logical empiricists Moritz Schlick and Hans Reichenbach.
Lotze further claimed that thoughts are tools (organa) for deciphering messages of reality. This deciphering takes place in realizing of values. The aim of human thought is not to serve as a lens for immediate grasping reality, but to be valid. This means that the structure of thoughts has scarcely anything to do with the structure of the facts. Nevertheless, their effects coincide (1874, § 342). Thus, despite the fact that there are no general ideas in reality, we understand reality only through general ideas.
Lotze did not believe that this conception leads to epistemological pessimism. It is true that “reality may be more extensive than our capacities for representing it (whether by knowledge, feeling, etc.)” can assimilate (Cuming 1917, p. 163). Lotze insisted, however, that these features of reality are beyond the interests of philosophers, since beyond their (human) reach (in essence, along the lines of the saying: “what the eye does not see, the heart does not grieve over”).
As a young man Lotze was befriended with Ernst Friedrich Apelt, a pupil of Fries. (cf. section 1.b) Through Apelt, Lotze became familiar with Friesian philosophy, which he later used as a convenient foil in the development of some of his own views. Fries’ philosophy followed Kant formally, but in fact was more mechanical and calculative than Kant’s. In truth, it was even more mechanical and calculative than the philosophy of Herbart, who himself was a well-known mechanistic Kantian.
Lotze criticized Fries for being too formal and forgetting the “deep problems” of philosophy. Specifically, Lotze attacked Fries’ (and arguably Kant’s) dynamic understanding of matter, which represents it as simply the interplay of powers. Thus construed, the standard, empirical properties of matter (such as extension, solidity, place, and so on) disappear. Against this conception, Lotze embraced a form of atomism, which he saw as necessary for the individuation of material objects. Indeed, humans understand something only when the content of their judgment is articulated, and there cannot be an articulation without individuation; furthermore, individuation is best carried out when we accept that there are atoms. Besides, Lotze was convinced that the order in the world cannot come into being from a purposeless and planless beginning—from what today is called an “atomless gunk.” The point is that the order presupposes an articulation and individuation: it is order between individuals—between Lotze’s variables A, B, and R (cf. section 3.b).
Apparently, Lotze did not understand atoms as they were understood in antiquity: as ultimate elements of reality which have different forms, but the same substance . He did conceive of them as the ultimate building blocks of the material world, but he saw them as idiosyncratic and as remaining unmodified in all compositions and divisions. In other words, whereas the ancient atomism saw each atom as made out of the same kind of substance , Lotze saw each atom as being made of a unique kind of substance , so that each atom is sui generis.
Further difference with the atomism of the antiquity was that Lotze’s atoms were punctual (i.e., point-like), without extension (unräumlich). Indeed, extension is possible only where there are many points which can be easily identified and differentiated. The extensionless atoms find their mutual place in space through their powers. To be more specific, we conceive of them as impermeable, filling up the space, only because of their demonstrated reciprocal resistance (1856a, p. 402).
An important characteristic of matter is its passivity, i.e. its ability to be affected from the outside. True to his anthropological stance, Lotze accepted that only if two essences mutually produce their respective “sufferings” (Leiden) can they be their respective interacting causes. (1864, p. 574) (The concept of “suffering” shows influence on Lotze of his countryman Jacob Böhme – both were born in Upper Lusatia, Saxony.) At the same time, Lotze was adamant that the concepts of suffering, effecting, and interaction are only—although inescapable—scientific metaphors. We must not conceive of them literally. However, they help us to grasp the nature of the problem.
In questions of space, Lotze used his teacher Weiße, rather than Fries, as a foil. Weiße had distinguished between space and interaction (Wechselwirkung) of substance. Moreover, for Weiße, interaction is the condition of space. (2003, pp. 85 f.) In contrast, Lotze differentiated, not between interaction and space (he was convinced that the two coincide), but between extension and place. “Extension” refers to an infinite multiplicity of directions. Only place, however, makes these possibilities concrete, putting them into three coordinated directions (Pester 1997, p. 110).
Starting with his lesser Logic, Lotze made great efforts to elaborate a convincing philosophy of language. His first step in this direction was to connect language with logic by claiming that logic begins with exploring language forms (1843, p. 40). The reason for this assumption was that the living, unconscious “spirit of [ordinary] language” makes a connection between what one experiences concretely in sense perception, and the abstract forms that one extracts from sense perception (p. 82). (This idea was also adopted—via Frege—in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, 3.1: “In a proposition a thought finds expression that can be perceived by the senses.”) Indeed, our language functions on the level of perceptions. This, however, is not a hindrance to our using it to convey truths of a higher order: truths of science, mathematics, logic, etc (1856a, p. 304).
Lotze criticized the idea—later made famous by Wittgenstein—that language has meaning by picturing reality. According to Lotze, not even the pictures formed by perceiving are pictures proper (cf. section 3.e, above)—much less, therefore, pictures supposedly embedded in the structures of language. Rather than performing a picturing function, language provides something of a method. To be more specific, it provides rules for transforming signals from the sensual world into the phenomena of our mental world, and vice-versa: from our perception into the meanings we formulate and communicate with the help of the language. In fact, the whole relation between microcosm and macrocosm was understood by Lotze in this way. The microcosm can be characterized as a “language of the macrocosm”, and at the same time, a place for understanding the possibilities of speaking about the macrocosm (Orth 1986, p. 48).
Lotze was adamant that we cannot prefer logical forms over facts, as Hegel had once done. In particular, he criticized Hegel’s ladder-model of natural history, which claimed that we can deduce the value and importance of every particular species from its place on the ladder of evolution. Instead of formal (logical) rankings of living species, Lotze promoted a comparison of their natural figures (Gestalten). (From this perspective he also criticized Darwin’s evolution theory.) The difference between the mind of animals and that of man arises not because of a difference in the elements which they contain; in fact, here and there the same building blocks, or “mosaic-stones” (Mosaikstifte), enter into the scene. (This point was recently confirm Rather, that variation results from the way in which they are combined and used (1858, p. 266).
Lotze also criticized the intellectualism of the German Idealists. Instead, he sided with the German Enlightenment’s tendency to emphasize the importance of sensuality, of feelings and imagination (Phantasie). In this key, he classified animals not according to their capacity to think (as Herder did), but according to their physical performance and forms of consumption (genießen). On this point he was criticized by many of his contemporaries, including his friends, the “speculative theists” I. H. Fichte and C. H. Weiße. These two found in the Microcosm too little idealism and too much realism (Weiße 1865, pp. 289 ff.).
This reproach was scarcely justified; for Lotze endorsed the essential difference between the human mind and that of other animals. The difference was that all human thought has reference to, or is at least formed from within, traditions: in language, science, skills, morals, as well as in practical habits and in judgments of everyday life (1858, p. 262). Moreover, Lotze claimed that “to know man means, above all, to know his vocation [Bestimmung], the means which he has in disposition to achieve it, as well as the hindrances that he must overcome in this effort” (p. 72). In this kind of anthropology, the ability to use the arm, and later also instruments was most important.
Lotze treated every epoch of human culture as developed around a particular value: (i) the Orient developed a taste for the colossal, (ii) the Jews for the elevated, (iii) the Greeks for the beautiful, (iv) the Romans for dignity and elegance, (v) the Middle Ages for the fantastic and emblematic, and (vi) Modernity for the critical and inventive. These orientations and achievements are on a par with one another (1864, pp. 124 ff.). The acceptance of the plurality of values was unique in German philosophy at the time: for instance, whereas we can easily find anti-Semitic judgments from Herder and Kant, not so from Lotze.
According to Lotze, achieving social progress is not a matter of quantitative growth but of reaching a “systematic complete harmony” in this or that particular culture. This state could be attained, for example, if the rules of social conduct are conceived of as a system of rights and duties of an objective spiritual (geistiges) organism (p. 424). Such a society could be considered a work of Nature, “or rather not simply of Nature, but of the Moral World Order [sittliche Weltordnung] which is independent of the individual” (p. 443).
Lotze was not convinced that the scientific and technological progress of the human race through the first half of the nineteenth century had increased its humaneness. For, the increase in humanity’s power over nature was accompanied by a proportional increase in our dependence upon it. The new ways of life afforded by developing technologies created new consumption needs, but many of these new needs were superfluous—not needs at all, but only desires—and some of them could be positively harmful. (Think, by way of comparison, of the relation between the various culinary technologies that in the last decades made fast-food possible, the growth of desires/felt-need for fast-food, and the negative effects of fast-food upon public health). Thus it is not unreasonable to think that we might have been better-off without the technologies that, although they enabled humanity to solve certain practical problems, created others that were previously unknown.
However, such felt-needs/desires cannot be eliminated through mere insight into truth, e.g., by recognizing that they are superfluous and harmful. The disapproving stance on this matter, taken by Diogenes of Sinope or Rousseau, is attractive and plausible mainly as a critique. Indeed, the natural state, which they propagated, can be seen as a state of innocence, but also as one of barbarism.
As a solution to this problem Lotze accepted that there is a constant human way of life which repeats itself practically unchanged: its purposes, motives and habits have the same form. This is the course of the world (der Weltlauf), an ever-green stalk from which the colorful blossoms of history cyclically emerge. In fact, the true goods of our inner life increase either only slowly, or perhaps they do not increase at all (1858, p. 345).
Perhaps the most interesting development of our modern time is the introduction of division of work and the new (Protestant) phenomenon of “profession.” (This idea was further developed by Max Weber.) An important effect of this process is that life is now divided into work and leisure (1864, p. 281; pp. 245–7).
Every profession stimulates the heart to embody a specific direction of imagination, a perspective on the world, and a way of judging. This state of affairs produced different forms of existence (Existenzarten) which makes modernity one of the most interesting epochs of human history. The main disadvantage of the professional life, Lotze says, is its monotony (1858, pp. 437–8).
The history of human society is a central subject of Lotze’s Microcosm. Lotze’s views on this topic are best presented in contrast with what was then the standard or “mainstream” approach to history, which he faulted for lacking realism, and therefore for failing to generate genuine historical knowledge.
Mainstream history was inspired by two chief sources: Hegelianism, and what may loosely be described as positivism. Although radically different in their guiding assumptions, these two movements overlapped in their consequences for history.
Hegel believed that history is produced by the movements of an arcane entity called “the world-spirit” (Weltgeist) and of its interaction with humanity. Specifically, Hegel believed that the Weltgeist’s goal was to bring the human race into the full realization of the idea of humanity, i.e., into an ideal state of being. To this end, it leads certain humans—by means of which they are unaware—to advance the race in various ways. These humans (heroes) turn out to be the great figures in history, and their movements and achievements, as Hegel saw it, constitute history. That is, history consists not of everything that happens, but above all of great movements that advance humanity significantly toward its ideal, of those events that constitute a substantial realization of the ideal.
In short, the Hegelian approach requires commitment to an inevitably contentious idealization of humanity, an assumption about what counts as the highest realization of human nature. Lotze claimed that such theories have their place in Philosophy, but they can only skew our perceptions when allowed to control our search for fundamental data in History. In Hegel’s case, for instance, his ideal of humanity led him to neglect both the contributions of women to history (1864, pp. 47 ff.; in this regard Lotze appears as a precursor of the modern feminism), and the role played by the mundane aspects of individuals’ lives—which of course constitutes the lager part of human history. (This claim of Lotze shows him as a predecessor of the nouvelle histoire school of Marc Bloch which accentuated discussions in history of past facts of la vie quotidienne.)
The positivist approach to history, exemplified by Leopold von Ranke and Johann Gustav Droysen, had similar consequences. Focusing too much on “objective” facts and formal considerations, and too little on the concrete, embodied, and emotional aspects of human life, historically significant but “ordinary” elements of human life were eliminated from consideration.
Lotze rejected both the idealism of Hegel and the demand for “objective faciticity” that came from the positivists. Against Hegel, Lotze argued that human progress does not proceed linearly nor ladder-wise: many achievements of human society disappear without a trace, while others disappear for a time, only to be reintroduced by new generations. Rather, Lotze saw humanity developing in a spiral pattern, in which moments of progress are offset by moments of regress. To be sure, this perspective appears rather gloomy alongside the mainstream approach, but it is clearly more realistic, and better suited to teaching humanity about itself.
Lotze agreed with Lessing’s thesis that the purpose of history is the education of humanity. (This point coheres with Lotze’s claim, discussed in section 2.b–c above, that we can understand philosophy and science starting from the history of human education and schooling.) That assumption helps to draw a more realistic picture of human progress than what Hegelian and positivist history provided. Seeing history as a didactic tool, Lotze’s desiderata for good historical work were shaped by his ideals for education. In particular, they were modeled by his conviction that the purpose of human spiritual life consists in the richness of an education capable of harmonizing all the aspects of a concrete, embodied person’s life. This is what drove Lotze to reject the positivists’ “objective facticity” as inadequate for history.
Lotze’s alternative was an aesthetic, or poetic, approach to history. (1864, p. 46) As he saw it, poetry and history are both creative, setting up new life-worlds. The task of the historian was to present concepts as they were understood in their original contexts, exactly as they were embraced, felt, and consumed in the past—not anachronistically, as they might be understood in the present, through the “lens” of a different form of life. This task required both the focus on empirical fact characteristic of positivist history, but also an element of poetic imagination—for only the latter could add flesh to the dry bones of empirical fact. By combining both modes of cognition, the historian was to determine how the concept fitted into the total form of life characteristic of the period in which it originated, as well as those that inherited the concept—in effect, to re-create the life-world of the people whose concept it was. This line of thought was later developed by R. G. Collingwood.
Lotze’s political philosophy discussed such themes as social rationalization, power, bureaucracy, national values, sovereignty, and international relations. Above all, he defended the enlightened, hereditary monarchy. He saw it as offering “the greatest security for steady development”—and, as he saw it, this is of greatest value in political life. (p. 444) Further, being a philosopher of the concrete, full-blooded man, with his feelings and imagination, Lotze defended paternal patriotism; he preferred the love for the concrete fatherland over the love for the state with its institutions. In particular, Lotze criticized the view (defended by his contemporary Jacob Burckhardt) that the State should exist for its own sake. He also distrusted parliamentary representation and party politics.
Lotze repudiated Plato’s model of the state as an analog of the human person, and accepted instead a model of political equilibrium construed as “the result of the reciprocal action of unequal forces” (p. 423). In matters of international law, he was an advocate of a balance of power of sovereign states. He believed that “the increasing relations between the different divisions of humankind changed in great measure the significance of the political boundaries and gave new stimulus to the idea of cosmopolitanism” (p. 436).
Lotze disparaged those critics of modernity who claimed that its proponents only defend their desire for material well-being. Moreover, although he did not use the term “liberalism,” Lotze adhered to the principles of what we would now call “classical bourgeois liberalism;” but he criticized “Manchester liberalism” (cf. the “turbo-capitalism” of the “roaring 1990s”) that followed ideas of such philosophers as Thomas Malthus, referring, among other things, to what today is called “the paradox of liberalism:” liberalism fails to show how an isolated human being can be a subject of rights. Indeed, right is a reciprocal, and so collective, concept: “one’s right is what the others feel for us as a duty” (p. 427).
Lotze criticized the concept of natural law employed by the mainstream Western philosophers like Aristotle and Hobbes who claim that law is set by nature. Instead, Lotze had sympathies with the historicist conception of law developed by Leopold von Ranke and Friedrich von Savigny who defended the thesis that the notions of law are coined in human practice. Lotze used to say that “the beginning of all legitimacy is illegitimate, although it need not be at the same time illegal” (p. 417).
The religion of the modern man was for Lotze a feeling of life (Lebensgefühl) in which the awareness of the fragility of the human race is connected with a sense of conscience about a lay profession. (The latter point was extensively discussed by Max Weber.) Men know how modest their life-tasks are and nevertheless are happy to pursue them. This is a belief which follows the consciousness and the inner voice, and which, nevertheless, is exactly as certain as the knowledge we receive through the senses (1858, pp. 447 f.).
Lotze criticizes the Enlightenment claim that religion is only a product of human reason. If that was true, then it would be possible to replace religion with philosophy. However, for Lotze, reason alone is not enough to grasp religious truth: we learn it through revelation which can be thought of as the historical action of God (1864, p. 546). Lotze also criticizes Fries who compared religion, which starts from unproven truths, to science which is also ultimately based on unproved axioms we believe. Rather, whereas the axioms of science are general and hypothetical judgments, the propositions of religion are apodictic.
A leading idea of Lotze’s philosophy of religion was that “all the processes in nature are understandable only through the continuing involvement of God; only this involvement arranges the passing of the interaction [Übergang des Wechselwirkungs] between different parts of the world” (p. 364). This claim can be best interpreted with reference to Lotze’s concept of idealities(discussed in section 2b–c, above) Idealities are magnitudes, identifiable in experience, and are constitutive for all academic fields: science, mathematics, metaphysics. More especially, they help to orient our concepts and studies.
In more concrete terms, Lotze hung the intelligibility of natural processes on the concept of God because of his anthropological stance—of the role the concept of humanity played in his philosophy. Important point, however, is that, to him, that concept does not have a generic character; we can grasp it only in terms of particular individuals, or persons (p. 52). This explains why Lotze claimed that the kind of purposive, creative power seen in natural processes is unthinkable except in relation to a living personality with its will; and, since the process of nature emanate from no human will, we are left with the person of God (pp. 587 ff.).
Lotze’s use of God as a necessary explanatory category is reminiscent of Kant, and has a somewhat “methodological” quality about it—we cannot prove the existence of God, Lotze thought, but we must nonetheless believe in Him; for only thus is our world ultimately intelligible. This point of Lotze was interpreted by the religious liberals of the fin de siècle (by the Congregationalists, in particular) as supporting the claim that religion is a matter of judgment of value in the Kingdom of God—a thesis made popular by Lotze’s contemporary Albrecht Ritschl (1822–1889) who fought against the conservative-Lutheran and confessional theology of the time.
Lotze understood world-religions to have started in the Orient, with the picture, familiar from the Old Testament, of the world as a system developing according to general laws. Later, the West accepted this belief in the form of Christianity. In the Age of Enlightenment, however, it started to consider the universe as something unfinished, giving opportunities to the individuals to form it according to the specific purposes of everyone. (This stance was theoretically grounded by Kant.) The future was seen as formless in principle, so that human action can change reality in an absolutely new way (Lotze 1864, p. 331). Embracing this view, the believers abandoned quietism and embraced vita activa. Reducing the horizons of human imagination to the practical tasks of the earthy world, the need to connect it with the transcendental waned. The result was the belief in progress and a turn away from God. From now on Godhood was considered mainly in moral terms.
Pagans, in their most developed form of antiquity, believed in reason, in self-respect, and in the sublime. (Lotze called this stance “heroism of the pure reason”.) Unfortunately, pagans failed to foster humaneness. This was the historical achievement of Christianity which developed a totally new understanding of the moral duties. Of course, pagans recognized moral duties too. However, they understood them as having the same necessity as natural laws have. To be more specific, Christianity—especially Protestantism—taught its believers to carry out duties following their personal conscience. In consequence, Christianity: (i) established an immediate connection to God; (ii) it made it possible for individual Christians to pursue their own values of preference which are independent from the social background of the individual and from her actual place in the society. In this way, the respect for human dignity was secured.
Historically, Christianity placed importance on the activity of teaching and learning through the establishment of schools. . Christianity, however, is not simply a teaching. It requires faithfulness to the historical God, realized through revelation. That is why Christian dogmatics must be preserved and cultivated.
Lotze’s conclusion was that we must look upon Christian dogmatics as posing questions about the purpose of human life, not as giving answers. Lotze was confident that every new generation would return to these questions. Of course, dogmatics can be criticized: indeed, the critical Protestant theology was, historically, the best example of such criticism. But, according to Lotze, we must not cast Christian dogmatics away as obsolete.
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Last updated: March 15, 2010 | Originally published: March 14, 2010
Categories: 19th Century European