The Lyceum

The Lyceum was a gymnasium near Athens and the site of a philosophical school founded by Aristotle.

Table of Contents

  1. Location, Structures, and Layout of the Lyceum
    1. Apodyterion
    2. Dromoi and Peripatoi
    3. Gymnasium Building
    4. Palaistra
    5. Sanctuaries
    6. Seats
    7. Stoas
    8. Trees and Streams
  2. History of the Use of the Lyceum
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Location, Structures, and Layout of the Lyceum

Archaeological exploration of the topography of the Lyceum has been hampered by the sprawl of buildings in modern Athens. The general location of the Lyceum outside and East of the ancient city wall is well-attested (Strabo 9.1.24, Cleidemus, FGrH 323F18, and Pausanias 1.19.3). Ancient literary and epigraphic sources and modern archaeological investigation provide an occasional glimpse into the layout and use of the Lyceum area in antiquity. While most often connected with philosophical teaching and discourse, the Lyceum was used for military exercises, meetings of the Athenian assembly, and cult practice as well as athletic training.

This multiplicity of use had a direct impact on the types of structures in the area and on the general development of the Lyceum. From the earliest times, the area was characterized by large open spaces and shady groves of trees, bounded roughly by the Ilissos river to the south and the Eridanus river and Mt. Lykabettos to the north. A series of roads led to the Lyceum from in and around the city. From the sixth century BC to the sixth century AD the area saw ever increasing numbers of buildings constructed to serve its multiple functions.

Some literary references to the Lyceum give a fuller picture. For example, in the first lines of Plato’sLysis, Socrates is walking along a road from the Academy to the Lyceum that ran under the city wall when he meets his friends Hippothales and Ktesippos near the Panops springhouse (Lysis203a-204a). This springhouse may be the one mentioned by Strabo (9.1.19), who adds that these springs were “near the Lyceum.” Strabo also tells us that the Ilissus river flowed down “from above Agrai and the Lyceum” (9.1.24). In addition, Xenophon records that during a raid by the Spartans against the city from their encampment at Dekeleia to the East of the city, the Athenians came out and drew up their troops “immediately near the Lyceum gymnasium” (Hellenica 1.1.33).

Recent excavations by the Greek Archaeological Service in the area of modern Syntagma have revealed that the area immediately to the East of the ancient city wall was filled with ancient cemeteries and factories, and an immense bathing complex of the Roman period. In addition, sections of a broad, ancient road running East -West through this area have been uncovered. These finds merely add to the list of similar buildings, baths, and graves previously found in the Syntagma area.

In 1996 excavations in the area of modern Rigillis Street uncovered a structure that has been identified by the excavator as a palaistra in the Lyceum. The site continues to be excavated and studied and has not yet been fully published.

In sum, the ancient literary, epigraphic, and archaeological evidence indicates that the area known as the “Lyceum” probably covered a large area to the East of the ancient city wall, but was not immediately adjacent to the wall. It may have begun just to the West of the modern Amalias Blvd. and continued East through the modern National Gardens with the Olympieion and Ilissos river forming its southern boundaries; it may have extended northward as far as modern Kolonaki plateia. If further excavation at the site near Rigillis St. confirms the excavator’s assertions that the ancient buildings there were located in the Lyceum, then we may at least have an indication of the eastern extent of the gymnasium area.

A number of different types of construction are mentioned in the literary and epigraphic sources as being in the Lyceum: an apodyterion (dressing room), dromoi (roads or running tracks) andperipatoi (walks), a gymnasium building, and a palaistra (wrestling school), cult sanctuaries, seating areas, and stoas. Irrigation channels were constructed to keep the area green and wooded.

a. Apodyterion

Literally an “an undressing room.” The building in which the scene of Plato’s Euthydemus (272e-273b) begins. This structure may be either a part of the gymnasium building or the palaistra, or it may have stood independently to serve the covered dromos (racetrack) mentioned in the passage.

b. Dromoi and Peripatoi

Dromoi and Peripatoi: The sources refer to two different types of dromoi: 1) the main East-West road leading up to the city wall through the Lyceum (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.4.27, Xenophon, The Cavalry Commander 3.6, Callimachus, fr. 261 Pfeiffer), and 2) the running tracks (Plato,Euthydemus 272e-273b). Stretches of the main road, which ran through modern Syntagma square and past the modern Parliament building parallel to the present Vasilis Sophias Blvd. have been uncovered and should be the main dromos to which our sources refer. Excavation has not produced any evidence for the location of the dromoi for foot or horse races.

c. Gymnasium Building

An honorary decree for the Athenian statesman Lycurgus (IG II2 457) states that this building was repaired in the 330s BC. The original structure may have been built either by Pericles (Philochoros,FGrH 328F37) in the fifth century BC or Pisistratus (Theopompus, FGrH 115F136) in the sixth century BC. It is the only gymnasium building that is attested in Athens during the Classical period.

d. Palaistra

The scene of Plato’s Euthydemus, which was also perhaps repaired in the 330s BC by Lycurgus ([Plutarch], Lives of the Orators 841d).

e. Sanctuaries

The Lyceum itself was a sanctuary to Apollo, but it also contained a shrine to the Muses that housed many dedications and a portrait bust of Aristotle (Diogenes Laertius 5.51, also cf. IG II2 2613). There was also a cult of Hermes on the Lyceum grounds (IG II2 1357b4).

f. Seats

There were seats for the athlothetai (judges in an athletic contest) somewhere in the Lyceum grounds (Aischin. Soc. fr. 2.2 Dittmar=Demetr. Elocut. 205).

g. Stoas

A small stoa stood near the sanctuary to the Muses, and another stoa had maps of the earth displayed on tablets on the walls (Diogenes Laertius 5.51-52; Lucian, Anachar. 33).

h. Trees and Streams

Parts of the Lyceum were apparently wooded, and channels were dug from the Ilissus and Eridanus rivers to keep the area green. Theophrastus notes one enormous plane tree in particular that “sent out roots a distance of 33 cubits” (Theophrastus, On Plants 1.7.1). The woods were said to have been chopped down during the siege by Sulla in 86 BC (Plutarch, Sulla 12.3).

2. History of the Use of the Lyceum

The Lyceum, like the other famous Athenian gymnasia (the Academy and Cynosarges) was more than a space for physical exercise and philosophical discussion, reflection, and study. It contained cults of Hermes, the Muses, and Apollo, to whom the area was dedicated and belonged. It was also used for military exercises, the marshaling of troops, and for military displays. The Lyceum thus encompassed a fairly large area, including large open spaces, buildings, and cult sites.

The Lyceum was named after Apollo Lyceus, Apollo “the wolf-god.” From at least the sixth-century BC the Lyceum is said to have been the place where the polemarch (head of the army) had his office (Hesychius, “Epilykeion” and Suda, “ArchÙn”). The area was also used for military exercises (Suda, “Lykeion”) and for the marshaling of troops before departing on campaign (Aristophanes, Peace 351-357); it was also the site of cavalry displays (Xenophon, The Cavalry Commander 3.1). The Lyceum was also the place for meetings of the Athenian assembly before the establishment of a permanent meeting area on the Pnyx hill during the fifth century BC (IG I3 105).

The Lyceum was a place of philosophical discussion and debate well before Aristotle founded his school there in 335 BC. Socrates (Euthydemus 271a, Euthyphro 2a, Symposium 223d), Prodicus of Chios ([Plato], Eryxias 397c-d), and Protagoras (Diogenes Laertius 9.54) all apparently frequented the Lyceum to debate, discuss, and teach during the last third of the fifth-century BC. Plato’s great rival Isocrates taught rhetoric in the Lyceum during the first half of the fourth century BC, as did other sophists and philosophers. Rhapsodes were said to teach there as well (Alexis, PCG fr. 25, Antiphanes, PCG fr. 120, and Isocrates, Panathenaecus 33.5).

Upon his return to Athens in 335 BC, Aristotle rented some buildings in the Lyceum and established a school there. For nearly the remainder of his life, it was here that Aristotle lectured, wrote most of his philosophical treatises and dialogues, and systematically collected books for the first library in European history. After Aristotle’s death in 322 BC the headship of the school passed to Theophrastus, who continued his master’s program of research and teaching in the Lyceum. Theophrastus also purchased buildings and land that he bequeathed to the school in his will. However, the quality of the school’s library may have declined after Theophrastus’ death in 287 BC with the apparent loss of many of Aristotle’s works to Neleus of Scepsis (Strabo 13.1.54).

From the time of Aristotle until 86 BC there was a continuous succession of philosophers in charge of the school in the Lyceum. The common name for the school, Peripatetic, was derived either from the peripatos in the Lyceum grounds or from Aristotle’s habit of lecturing while walking. The school was a part of the military/educational institution for the city’s elite, the ephebeia. This program of study and military service provided eighteen- to twenty-year-old Athenian males with a curriculum of philosophy, knowledge of the ancestral cults, and instruction in the art of war. The Lyceum’s fame-and the fame of other schools in Athens-attracted increasing numbers of philosophers and students from all over the Mediterranean world.

The brutal sack of Athens by the Roman general Sulla in 86 BC destroyed much of the Lyceum and disrupted the life of the school considerably. The school may have been refounded later in the first century BC by Andronicus of Rhodes, but this is uncertain. By the second century AD, the Lyceum was again a flourishing center of philosophical activity. The Roman emperor Marcus Aurelius appointed teachers to all the main philosophical schools in Athens, including the Lyceum. The utter destruction of Athens in AD 267 probably ended this renaissance of scholarly activity. The work of Peripatetic philosophers continued elsewhere, but it is unclear whether they returned to the Lyceum. Nothing certain is known about the Lyceum during the remainder of the third through early sixth centuries AD. Any remaining philosophical activity would certainly have ended in AD 529, when the emperor Justinian closed all the philosophical schools in Athens.

3. References and Further Reading

  • J.P. Lynch, Aristotle’s School: A Study of a Greek Educational Institution. Berkeley 1972.
  • C.E. Ritchie, “The Lyceum, the Garden of Theophrastos and the Garden of the Muses. A Topographical Reevaluation”
  • J. Travlos, Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Department of History

Categories: Ancient Philosophy