John Stuart Mill: Ethics
The ethical theory of John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) is most extensively articulated in his classical text Utilitarianism (1861). Its goal is to justify the utilitarian principle as the foundation of morals. This principle says actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote overall human happiness. So, Mill focuses on consequences of actions and not on rights nor ethical sentiments.
This article primarily examines the central ideas of his text Utilitarianism, but the article’s last two sections are devoted to Mill’s views on the freedom of the will and the justification of punishment, which are found in System of Logic (1843) and Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy (1865), respectively.
Educated by his father James Mill who was a close friend to Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill came in contact with utilitarian thought at a very early stage of his life. In his Autobiography he claims to have introduced the word “utilitarian” into the English language when he was sixteen. Mill remained a utilitarian throughout his life. Beginning in the 1830s he became increasingly critical of what he calls Bentham’s “theory of human nature”. The two articles “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833) and “Bentham” (1838) are his first important contributions to the development of utilitarian thought. Mill rejects Bentham’s view that humans are unrelentingly driven by narrow self-interest. He believed that a “desire of perfection” and sympathy for fellow human beings belong to human nature. One of the central tenets of Mill’s political outlook is that, not only the rules of society, but also people themselves are capable of improvement.
Table of Contents
- Introductory Remarks
- Mill’s Theory of Value and the Principle of Utility
- Morality as a System of Social Rules
- The Role of Moral Rules (Secondary Principles)
- Rule or Act Utilitarianism?
- Applying the Standard of Morality
- The Meaning of the First Formula
- Right in Proportion and Tendencies
- Utility and Justice
- The Proof of Utilitarianism
- Evaluating Consequences
- Freedom of Will
- Responsibility and Punishment
- References and Further Readings
Mill tells us in his Autobiography that the “little work with the name” Utilitarianism arose from unpublished material, the greater part of which he completed in the final years of his marriage to Harriet Taylor, that is, before 1858. For its publication he brought old manuscripts into form and added some new material.
The work first appeared in 1861 as a series of three articles for Fraser’s Magazine, a journal that, though directed at an educated audience, was by no means a philosophical organ. Mill planned from the beginning a separate book publication, which came to light in 1863. Even if the circumstances of the genesis of this work gesture to an occasional piece with a popular goal, on closer examination Utilitarianism turns out to be a carefully conceived work, rich in thought. One must not forget that since his first reading of Bentham in the winter of 1821-22, the time to which Mill dates his conversion to utilitarianism, forty years had passed. Taken this way, Utilitarianism was anything but a philosophical accessory, and instead the programmatic text of a thinker who for decades had understood himself as a utilitarian and who was profoundly familiar with popular objections to the principle of utility in moral theory. Almost ten years earlier (1852) Mill had defended utilitarianism against the intuitionistic philosopher William Whewell (Whewell on Moral Philosophy).
The priority of the text was to popularize the fundamental thoughts of utilitarianism within influential circles. This goal explains the composition of the work. After some general introductory comments, the text defends utilitarianism from common criticisms (“What Utilitarianism Is”). After this Mill turns to the question concerning moral motivation (“Of the Ultimate Sanction of the Principle of Utility”).This is followed by the notorious proof of the principle of utility (“Of What Sort of Proof the Principle of Utility is Susceptible”) and the long concluding chapter on the relation of utility and justice (“On the Connection Between Justice and Utility”). The last chapter is often neglected – and wrongly so, for it contains a central statement of Mill’s understanding of morals; it creates the foundation for the philosopher’s theory of moral rights that plays a preeminent role in the context of his political thought.
According to his early essay “Bentham” (1838), all reasonable moral theories assume that “the morality of actions depends on the consequences which they tend to produce” (CW 10, 111); thus, the difference between moral theories lie on an axiological plane. His own theory of morality, writes Mill in Utilitarianism, is grounded in a particular “theory of life…–namely, that pleasure, and freedom from pain, are the only things desirable as ends.” (CW 10, 210) Such a theory of life is commonly called hedonistic, and it seems appropriate to say that Mill conceives his own position as hedonistic, even if he does never use the word “hedonism” or its cognates. What makes utilitarianism peculiar, according to Mill, is its hedonistic theory of the good (CW 10, 111). Utilitarians are, by definition, hedonists. For this reason, Mill sees no need to differentiate between the utilitarian and the hedonistic aspect of his moral theory.
Modern readers are often confused by the way in which Mill uses the term ‘utilitarianism’. Today we routinely differentiate between hedonism as a theory of the good and utilitarianism as a consequentialist theory of the right. Mill, however, considered both doctrines to be so closely intertwined that he used the term ‘utilitarianism’ to signify both theories. On the one hand, he says that the “utilitarian doctrine is, that happiness is desirable, and the only thing desirable, as an end.” (CW 10, 234) On the other hand, he defines utilitarianism as a moral theory according to which “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness…” (CW 10, 210).
Utilitarians are, for him, consequentialists who believe that pleasure is the only intrinsic value.
Mill counts as one of the great classics of utilitarian thought; bu this moral theory deviates from what many contemporary philosophers consider core features of utilitarianism. This explains why the question whether Mill is a utilitarian is more serious than it may appear on first inspection (see Coope 1998). One may respond that this problem results from an anachronistic understanding of utilitarianism, and that it disappears if one abstains from imputing modern philosophical concepts on a philosopher of the nineteenth century. However, this response would oversimplify matters. For it is not clear whether Mill’s value theory was indeed hedonistic (see Brink 1992). As mentioned before, Mill maintains that hedonism is the differentia specifica of utilitarianism; if he were not a hedonist, he would be no utilitarian by his own definition. In view of the fact that Mill’s value theory constitutes the center of his ethics (Donner 1991, 2009), the problem of determining its precise nature and adequate naming has attracted considerable attention over the last 150 years.
Mill defines “utilitarianism” as the creed that considers a particular “theory of life” as the “foundation of morals” (CW 10, 210). His view of theory of life was monistic: There is one thing, and one thing only, that is intrinsically desirable, namely pleasure. In contrast to a form of hedonism that conceives pleasure as a homogeneous matter, Mill was convinced that some types of pleasure are more valuable than others in virtue of their inherent qualities. For this reason, his position is often called “qualitative hedonism”. Many philosophers hold that qualitative hedonism is no consistent position. Hedonism asserts that pleasure is the only intrinsic value. Under this assumption, the critics argue, there can be no evaluative basis for the distinction between higher and lower pleasures. Probably the first ones to raise this common objection were the British idealists F. H. Bradley (1876/1988) and T. H. Green (1883/2003).
Which inherent qualities make one kind of pleasure better than another, according to Mill? He declares that the more valuable pleasures are those which employ “higher faculties” (CW 10, 211). The list of such better enjoyments includes “the pleasures of intellect, of the feelings and imagination, and of the moral sentiments” (CW 10, 211). These enjoyments make use of highly developed capacities, like judgment and empathy. In one of his most famous sentences, Mill affirms that it “is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied” (CW 10, 212). This seems to be a surprising thing to say for a hedonist. However, Mill thought that we have a solid empirical basis for this view. According to him, the best obtainable evidence for value claims consists in what all or almost all people judge as valuable across a vast variety of cases and cultures. He makes the empirical assertion that all or almost all people prefer a “manner of existence” (CW 10, 211) that employs higher faculties to a manner of existence which does not. The fact that “all or almost all” who are acquainted with pleasures that employ higher faculties agree that they are preferable to the lower ones, is empirical evidence for the claim that they are indeed of higher value. Accordingly, the best human life (“manner of existence”) is one in which the higher faculties play an adequate part. This partly explains why he put such great emphasis on education.
The fifth and final chapter of Utilitarianism is of unusual importance for Mill’s theory of moral obligation. Until the 1970s, the significance of the chapter had been largely overlooked. It then became one of the bridgeheads of a revisionist interpretation of Mill, which is associated with the work of David Lyons, John Skorupski and others.
Mill worked very hard to hammer the fifth chapter into shape and his success has great meaning for him. Towards the end of the book he maintains the “considerations which have now been adduced resolve, I conceive, the only real difficulty in the utilitarian theory of morals.” (CW 10, 259)
At the beginning of Utilitarianism, Mill postulates that moral judgments presume rules (CW 10, 206). In contrast to Kant who grounds his ethical theory on self-imposed rules, so-called maxims, Mill thinks that morality builds on social rules. But what makes social rules moral rules? Mill’s answer is based on a thesis about how competent speakers use the phrase “morally right” or “morally wrong”. He maintains that we name a type of action morally wrong if we think that it should be sanctioned either through formal punishment, public disapproval (external sanctions) or through a bad conscience (internal sanctions). This is the critical difference between “morality and simple expediency” (CW 10, 246). Wrong or inexpedient actions are those that we cannot recommend to a person, like harming oneself. But in contrast to immoral actions, inexpedient actions are not worthy of being sanctioned.
Mill differentiates various spheres of action. In his System of Logic he names morality, prudence and aesthetics as the three departments of the “Art of Life” (CW 8, 949). The principle of utility governs not only morality, but also prudence and taste (CW 8, 951). It is not a moral principle but a meta-principle of practical reason (Skorupski 1989, 310-313).
There is a field of action in which moral rules obtain, and a “person may rightfully be compelled to fulfill” them (CW 10, 246). But there are also fields of action, in which sanctions for wrong behavior would be inappropriate. One of them is the sphere of self-regarding acts with which Mill deals in On Liberty. In this private sphere we can act at our convenience and indulge in inexpedient and utterly useless behavior as long as we do not harm others.
It is fundamental to keep in mind that Mill looks into morality as a social practice and not as autonomous self-determination by reason, like Kant. For Kantians, moral deliberation determines those actions which we have the most reason to perform. Mill disagrees; for him, it makes sense to say that “A is the right thing to do for Jeremy, but Jeremy is not morally obliged to do A.”For instance, even if Jeremy is capable of writing a brilliant book that would improve the life of millions (and deteriorate none), he is not morally obliged to do so. According to Mill, our moral obligations result from the justified part of the moral code of our society; and the task of moral philosophy consists in bringing the moral code of a society in better accordance with the principle of utility.
In Utilitarianism, Mill designs the following model of moral deliberation. In the first step the actor should examine which of the rules (secondary principles) in the moral code of his or her society are pertinent in the given situation. If in a given situation moral rules (secondary principles) conflict, then (and only then) can the second step invoke the formula of utility (CW 10, 226) as a first principle. Pointedly one could say: the principle of utility is for Mill not a component of morality, but instead its basis. It serves the validation of rightness for our moral system and allows – as a meta-rule – the decision of conflicting norms. In the introductory chapter of Utilitarianism, Mill maintains that it would be “easy to show that whatever steadiness or consistency these moral beliefs have attained, has been mainly due to the tacit influence of a standard not recognized” (CW 10, 207), namely the principle of utility. The tacit influence of the principle of utility made sure that a considerable part of the moral code of our society is justified (promotes general well-being). But other parts are clearly unjustified. One case that worried Mill deeply was the role of women in Victorian Britain. In “The Subjection of Women” (1869) he criticizesthe “legal subordination of one sex to the other” (CW 21, 261) as incompatible with “all the principles involved in modern society” (CW 21, 280).
Moral rules are also critical for Mill because he takes human action in essence as to be guided by dispositions. A virtuous person has the disposition to follow moral rules. In his early essay “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833) he asserts that a “man is not really virtuous” (CW 10, 12), unless the mere thought of committing certain acts is so painful that he does not even consider the possibility that they may have good consequences. He repeats this point in his System of Logic (1843)and Utilitarianism:
[T]he mind is not in a right state, not in a state conformable to Utility, not in the state most conducive to the general happiness, unless it does love virtue in this manner – as a thing desirable in itself, even although, in the individual instance, it should not produce those other desirable consequences which it tends to produce, and on account of which it is held to be virtue. (CW 10, 235 and 8, 952).
It is one thing to say that it could have optimal consequences (and thus be objectively better) to break a moral rule in a concrete singular case. Another is the question as to whether it would facilitate happiness to educate humans such that they would have the disposition to maximize situational utility. Mill answers the latter in the negative. Again, the upshot is that education matters. Humans are guided by acquired dispositions. This makes moral degeneration, but also moral progress possible.
There is considerable disagreement as to whether Mill should be read as a rule utilitarian or an (indirect) act utilitarian. Many philosophers look upon rule utilitarianism as an untenable position and favor an act utilitarian reading of Mill (Crisp 1997). Under the pressure of many contradicting passages, however, a straightforward act utilitarian interpretation is difficult to sustain. Recent studies emphasize Mill’s rule utilitarian leanings (Miller 2010, 2011) or find elements of both theories in Mill (West 2004).
In Utilitarianism he seems to give two different formulations of the utilitarian standard. The first points in an act utilitarian, the second in a rule utilitarian direction. Since act and rule utilitarianism are incompatible claims about what makes actions morally right, the formulations open up the fundamental question concerning what style of utilitarianism Mill wants to advocate and whether his moral theory forms a consistent whole. It is important to note that the distinction between rule and act utilitarianism had not yet been introduced in Mill’s days. Thus Mill is not to blame for failing to make explicit which of the two approaches he advocates.
In the first and more famous formulation of the utilitarian standard (First Formula) Mill states:
The creed which accepts as the foundation of morals, Utility, or the Greatest Happiness Principle, holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure, and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain, and the privation of pleasure. To give a clear view of the moral standard set up by the theory, much more requires to be said (…). But these supplementary explanations do not affect the theory of life on which this theory of morality is grounded….” (CW, 210, emphasis mine)
Just a few pages later, following his presentation of qualitative hedonism, Mill gives his second formulation (Second Formula):
According to the Greatest Happiness Principle (…) the ultimate end (…) is an existence exempt as far as possible from pain, and as rich as possible in enjoyments, both in point of quantity and quality; (…). This, being, according to the utilitarian opinion, the end of human action, is necessarily also the standard of morality; which may accordingly be defined, the rules and precepts for human conduct, by the observance of which an existence such as has been described might be, to the greatest extent possible, secured to all mankind; and not to them only, but, so far as the nature of things admits, to the whole sentient creation. (CW, 214, emphasis mine)
The Second Formula relates the principle of utility to rules and precepts and not to actions. It seems to say that an act is correct when it corresponds to rules whose preservation increases the mass of happiness in the world. And this appears to be a rule-utilitarian conception.
In the light of these passages, it is not surprising that the question whether Mill is an act- or a rule-utilitarian has been intensely debated. In order to understand his position it is important to differentiate between two ways of defining act and rule utilitarianism. (i) One can conceive of them as competing theories about objective rightness. An action is objectively right if it is the thing which the agent has most reason to do. Act utilitarianism would say that an action is objectively right, if it actually promotes happiness. For rule utilitarianism, in contrast, an action would be objectively right, if it actually corresponds to rules that promote happiness.
(ii) One can also conceive of act- and rule utilitarianism as theories about moral obligation. Act utilitarianism requires us to aim for the maximization of happiness; rule utilitarianism, in contrast, requires us to observe rules that facilitate happiness. Understood as a theory about moral obligation, act utilitarianism postulates: Act in a way that promotes happiness the most. Rule utilitarianism claims, on the other hand: Follow a rule whose general observance promotes happiness the most.
Mill is in regard to (i) an act utilitarian and in regard to (ii) a rule utilitarian. This way the seeming contradiction between the First and the Second Formula can be resolved. The First Formula states what is right and what an agent has most reason to do. It points to the “foundation of morals”. In contrast, the Second Formula tells us what our moral obligations are. We are morally obliged to follow those social rules and precepts the observance of which promotes happiness in the greatest extent possible.
In “Whewell on Moral Philosophy” (1852), Mill rejects an objection raised by one of his most competent philosophical adversaries. Whewell claimed that utilitarianism permits murder and other crimes in particular circumstances and is therefore incompatible with our considered moral judgments. Mill’s discussion of Whewell’s criticism is exceedingly helpful in clarifying his ethical approach:
Take, for example, the case of murder. There are many persons to kill whom would be to remove men who are a cause of no good to any human being, of cruel physical and moral suffering to several, and whose whole influence tends to increase the mass of unhappiness and vice. Were such a man to be assassinated, the balance of traceable consequences would be greatly in favour of the act. (CW 10, 181)
Mill gives no concrete case. Since he wrote – together with his wife Harriet Taylor –a couple of articles on horrible cases of domestic violence in the early 1850s, he might have had the likes of Robert Curtis Bird in mind, a man who tortured his servant Mary Ann Parsons to death [see CW 25 (The Case of Mary Ann Parsons), 1151-1153].Does utilitarianism require us to kill such people who are the “cause of no good to any human being, of cruel physical and moral suffering to several”? Mill answers in the negative. His main point is that nobody’s life would be safe if people were allowed to kill others whom they believe to be a source of unhappiness (CW 10, 182). Thus, a general rule that would allow to “remove men who are a cause of no good” would be worse than a general rule that does not allow such acts. People should follow the rule not to kill other humans because the general observance of this rule tends to promote the happiness of all.
This argument can be interpreted in a rule utilitarian or an indirect act utilitarian fashion. Along indirect act utilitarian lines, one could maintain that we would be cognitively overwhelmed by the task of calculating the consequences of any action. We therefore need rules as touchstones that point us to the path of action which tends to promote the greatest general happiness. Mill compares, in a critical passage, the core principles of our established morality (which he also calls “secondary principles”) with the Nautical Almanack, a companion for navigating a voyage (CW 10, 225). Just as the Nautical Almanackis not first calculated at sea, but instead exists as already calculated, the agent must not in individual cases calculate the expected utility. In his moral deliberation the agent can appeal to secondary principles, such as the prohibition of homicide, as an approximate solution for the estimated problem.
Apparently, the act utilitarian interpretation finds further support in a letter Mill wrote to John Venn in 1872. He states:
I agree with you that the right way of testing actions by their consequences, is to test them by their natural consequences of the particular actions, and not by those which would follow if everyone did the same. But, for the most part, considerations of what would happen if everyone did the same, is the only means we have of discovering the tendency of the act in the particular case. (CW 17, 1881)
Mill argues that in many cases we can assess the actual, expected consequences of an action, only if we hypothetically consider that all would act in the same manner. This means we recognize that the consequences of this particular action would be damaging if everyone acted that way. A similar consideration is found in the Whewell essay. Here Mill argues: If a hundred breaches of rule (homicides, in this case) led to a particular harm (murderous chaos), then a single breach of rule is responsible for a hundredth of the harm. This hundredth of harm offsets the expected utility of this particular breach of rule (CW 10, 182). Mill believes that the breach of the rule is wrong because it is actually harmful. The argument is questionable because Mill overturns the presumption he introduces: that the actual consequences of the considered action would be beneficial. If the breach of the rule is actually harmful, then it is to be rejected in every conceivable version of utilitarianism. The result is trivial then and misses the criticism that act utilitarianism has counter-intuitive implications in particular circumstances.
There is one crucial difficulty with the interpretation of Mill as an indirect act utilitarian regarding moral obligation. If the function of rules was in fact only epistemic, as suggested by indirect act utilitarianism, one would expect that the principle of utility – when the epistemic conditions are satisfactory – can be and should be directly applied. But Mill is quite explicit here. The utilitarian principle should only be applied when moral rules conflict:“We must remember that only in these cases of conflict between secondary principles is it requisite that first principles should be appealed to.” (CW 10, 226). From an act utilitarian view regarding moral obligation, this is implausible. Why should one be morally obliged to follow a rule of which one positively knows that its observance in a particular case will not promote general utility?
Coming back to the example, it is important to remember that “the balance of traceable consequences would be greatly in favour of the act [of homicide].” (CW 10, 181) Thus, according to an act utilitarian approach regarding moral obligation it would be morally allowed, if not required, to kill the man.
As mentioned, Mill arrives at a different conclusion. His position can be best understood with recourse to the distinction between the theory of objective rightness and the theory of moral obligation introduced in the last section. Seen from the perspective of an all-knowing and impartial observer, it is – in regard to the given description – objectively right to perpetrate the homicide. However, moral laws, permissions, and prohibitions are not made for omniscient and impartial observers, but instead for cognitively limited and partial beings like humans whose actions are mainly guided by acquired dispositions. Their capacity to recognize what would be objectively right is imperfect; and their ability to motivate themselves to do the right thing is limited. As quoted before in his “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833),he states that some violations of the established moral code are simply unthinkable for the members of society: people recoil “from the very thought of committing” (CW 10, 12) particular acts. Because humans cannot reliably recognize objective rightness and, in critical cases, cannot bring themselves to act objectively right, they are not obliged to maximize happiness. For ought implies can. In regard to the given description, the fact that the assassination of a human would be objectively right does not imply that the assassination of this human would be morally imperative or allowed. In other words: Mill differentiates between the objectively right act and the morally right act. With this he can argue that the assassination would be forbidden (theory of moral obligation). To enact a forbidden action is morally wrong. As noted, Mill’s theory allows for the possibility that an action is objectively right, but morally wrong (prohibited). An action can be wrong (bearing unhappiness), but its enactment would be no less morally right (Lyons 1978/1994, 70).
Thus, Mill’s considered position should be interpreted in the following way: First, the objective rightness of an act depends upon actual consequences; second, in order to know what we are morally obliged to do we have to draw on justified rules of the established moral code.
What has been said about Mill’s conception of morality as a system of social rules is relevant for the interpretation of Mill’s First Formula of utilitarianism. The Formula says that actions are right “in proportion as they tend to promote happiness” and wrong “as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness” (CW 10, 210). Roughly said, actions are right insofar as they facilitate happiness, and wrong insofar as they result in suffering. Mill does not write “morally right” or “morally wrong”, but simply “right” and “wrong”. This is important. Mill emphasizes in many places that virtuous actions can exhibit a negative balance of happiness in a singular case. If the word “moral” occurred in the First Formula, then the noted virtuous actions would be, for Mill, morally wrong. But as we have seen, this is not his view. Virtuous actions are morally right, even if they are objectively wrong under particular circumstances.
Accordingly, the First Formula is not to be interpreted as drafting a moral duty. It is a general statement about what makes actions right (reasonable, expedient) or wrong. The First Formula gives a general characterization of practical reason. It says that the promotion of happiness makes an action objectively right (but not necessarily morally right); or, as Mill says in his System of Logic, “the promotion of happiness is the ultimate principle of Teleology” (CW 8, 951) An action is objectively right if it maximizes happiness; however, an action is morally right if it is in accordance with social rules which are protected by internal and external sanctions and which tend to promote general utility. Subsets of right ones are morally right actions; subsets of wrong actions are morally wrong.
Mill’s differentiation between a moral and a non-moral sphere of action is not far from our everyday understanding. We generally believe that not all actions must be judged in regard to a moral point of view. This does not exclude us from valuing actions, which are not in the moral realm, in regard to prudence. Less evident is how one should take Mill’s claim that the promotion of happiness can be understood as a general principle of rightness even with respect to artistic production. Many artists would presumably not be comfortable with the thesis that good art arises from the goal of facilitating the happiness of humankind. This however is not what Mill means. Apart from cases of conflict between secondary principles, the First Formula does not guide action. Just as Mill speaks in a moral context about how noble characters will not strive to maximize general happiness (CW 8, 952), he could argue in an aesthetic context that artists should work from a purely aesthetic point of view. The rules of artistic judgments, nonetheless, are justified through their contribution to the flourishing of human life.
To summarize the essential points: Mill can be characterized as an act utilitarian in regard to the theory of objective rightness, but as a rule utilitarian in regard to the theory of moral obligation. He defines morality as a system of rules that is protected by sanctions. The principle of utility is not a part of this system, but its fundamental justification (the “foundation of morality” (CW 10, 205)).
(i) For contemporary readers it is striking that Mill’s First Formula does not explicitly relate to maximization. Mill does not write, as one might expect, that only the action which leads to the best consequences is right. In other places in the text we hear of the “promotion” or “multiplication” of happiness, and not of the “maximization”. Alone does the “Greatest Happiness Principle” explicitly refer to maximization. The actual formula, in contrast, has to do with gradual differences (right in proportion). Actions which add to the sum of happiness in the world but fail to maximize happiness thus can be right, even if to a lesser degree.
This is confusing insofar as it would be unreasonable to prefer that which is worse to that which is better. For every good there is a better that one should reasonably choose until one succeeds to the best. If the First Formula expresses the ideal of practical reason, then one should expect that it requires maximization. Maybe Mill’s point is that the search for a global best option would exceed the cognitive capabilities of humans. He probably does not want to suggest that an agent should not choose the best local option. But the local best option must not represent the objective (global) best. This may be the reason why Mill does not refer to maximization in the formula of utility.
(ii) A further complication arises with the word “tend”. According to the formula of utility, actions are more or less correct insofar as they facilitate happiness (CW 10, 210). It is doubtlessly not the same to say that an action is right if it actually facilitates happiness, or to say that it is right if it tends to facilitate happiness. The model seems to be roughly this: At the neutral point of the preference scale, actions have the tendency – in regard to the status quo – to neither increase nor decrease the mass of utility in the world. All actions that tend to facilitate happiness are right, all actions that tend to be harmful are wrong, but all are not in the same measure. An action has a high positive value on the scale of preference, if its tendency to facilitate happiness is high. An action has highly negative value on the preference scale, if its tendency to evoke unhappiness is high. But what does the concept “tendency” mean precisely?
In everyday language, we often use the word “tend” in the sense of “will probably lead to”. That an action tends to produce a particular consequence means that this consequence has a high probability. Mill could have wanted to say that an action is right in proportion to the probability with which it promotes happiness. This makes sense when we compare options that produce the same amount of happiness. But what about cases in which two actions produce different amounts of pleasure? One plausible answer is that both dimensions must be regarded: the amount of happiness and the probability of its occurrence. Action A is better than action B, if the expected happinessfor Ais greater than the expected happiness for B. If one reads Mill this way, then “in proportion” relates to “promote” and to “tend”. The best action is one that maximizes the amount of expected happiness.
In the final chapter of Utilitarianism, Mill turns to the sentiment of justice. Actions that are perceived as unjust provoke outrage. The spontaneity of this feeling and its intensity makes it impossible for it to be ignored by the theory of morals. Mill considers two possible interpretations of the source of the sentiment of justice: first of all, that we are equipped with a sense of justice which is an independent source of moral judgment; second, that there is a general and independent principle of justice. Both interpretations are irreconcilable with Mill’s position, and thus it is no wonder that he takes this issue to be of exceptional importance. He names the integration of justice the only real difficulty for utilitarian theory (CW 10, 259).
Mill splits this problem of integration into three tasks: The first consists in explaining the intensity and spontaneity of the sentiment of justice. The second task is to make plausible that the various types of judgments about justice can be traced back to a systematic core; and the third task consists in showing that the principle of utility constructs this core.
In a nutshell, Mill explains the sentiment of justice as the sublimation of the impulse to take revenge for perceived mortifications of all kinds. Mill sees vengeance as “an animal desire” (CW 10, 250) that operates in the service of self-preservation. If it is known that one will not accept interventions in spheres of influence and interest, the probability of such interventions dwindles. The preparedness to take revenge tends to deter aggression in the first place. Thus, a reputation for vindictiveness – at first glance an irrational trait – arguably has survival value. This helps to explain why the sentiment is so widespread and vehement.
Our sentiment of justice, for Mill, is based on a refinement and sublimation of this animal desire. Humans are capable of empathizing such that the pleasure of others can instill one’s own pleasure, and the mere sight of suffering can cause own suffering. The hurting of another person or even an animal may therefore produce a very similar affect as the hurting of one’s own person. Mill considers the extension of the animal impulse of vengeance on those with whom we have sympathy as “natural” (CW 10, 248), because the social feelings are for him natural. This natural extension of the impulse of revenge with the help of the social feelings represents a step in the direction of cultivating and refining human motivation. People begin to feel outrage when the interests of the members of their tribe are being violated or when shared social rules are being disregarded.
Gradually, sympathy becomes more inclusive. Humans discover that co-operation with people outside the tribe is advantageous. The “human capacity of enlarged sympathy” follows suit (CW 10, 248).
As soon as humans begin to think about which parts of the moral code of a society are justified and which parts are not, they inevitably begin to consider consequences. This often occurs in non-systematic, prejudiced or distorted ways. Across historical periods of times, the correct ideas of intrinsic good and moral rightness will gradually gain more influence. Judgments about justice approximate progressively the requirements of utilitarianism: The rules upon which the judgments about justice rest will be assessed in light of their tendency to promote happiness. To summarize: Our sentiment of justice receives its intensity from the “animal desire to repel or retaliate a hurt or damage to oneself”, and its morality from the “human capacity of enlarged sympathy” and intelligent self-interest (CW 10, 250).
According to Mill, when we see a social practice or a type of action as unjust, we see that the moral rights of persons were harmed. The thought of moral rights is the systematic core of our judgments of justice. Rights breed perfect obligations, says Mill. Moral rights are concerned with the basic conditions of a good life. They protect an “extraordinarily important and impressive kind of utility.” (CW 10, 250-251). Mill subsumes this important and impressive kind of utility under the term security, “the most vital of all interests” (CW 10, 251). It comprises such things as protection from aggression or starvation, the possibility to shape one’s own life unmolested by others and enforcement of contracts. Thus, the requirements of justice “stand higher in the scale of social utility” (CW 259).To have a moral right means to have something that society is morally required to guard either through the compulsion of law, education or the pressure of public opinion (CW 10, 250). Because everyone has an interest in the security of these conditions, it is desirable that the members of society reciprocally guarantee each other “to join in making safe for us the very groundwork of our existence” (CW 10, 251).Insofar as moral rights secure the basis of our existence, they serve our natural interest in self-preservation – this is the reason why their harm calls forth such intense emotional reactions. The interplay of social feelings and moral education explains, in turn, why we are not only upset by injustices when we personally suffer, but also when the elemental rights of others are harmed. This motivates us to sanction the suffering of others as unjust. Moral rights thus form the “most sacred and binding part of all morality” (CW 10, 255). But they do not exhaust the moral realm. There are imperfect obligations which have no correlative right (CW 10, 247).
The thesis that moral rights form the systematic core of our judgments of justice is by no means unique to utilitarianism. Many people take it to be evident that individuals have absolute, inalienable rights; but they doubt that these rights can be grounded in the principle of utility. Intuitionists may claim that we recognize moral rights spontaneously, that we have intuitive knowledge of them. In order to reject such a view, Mill points out that our judgments of justice do not form a systematic order. If we had a sense of justice that would allow us to recognize what is just, similar to how touch reveals forms or sight reveals color, then we would expect that our corresponding judgments would exhibit a high degree of reliability, definitude and unanimity. But experience teaches us that our judgments regarding just punishments, just tax laws or just remuneration for waged labor are anything but unanimous. The intuitionists must therefore mobilize a first principle that is independent of experience and that secures the unity and consistency of our theory of justice. So far they have not succeeded. Mill sees no suggestion that is plausible or which has been met with general acceptance.
What Mill names the “proof” of utilitarianism belongs presumably to the most frequently attacked text passages in the history of philosophy. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord once remarked that Mill seems to answer by example the question of how many serious mistakes a brilliant philosopher can make within a brief paragraph (Sayre-McCord 2001, 330). Meanwhile the secondary literature has made it clear that Mill’s proof contains no logical fallacies and is less foolish than often portrayed.
It is found in the fourth part, “Of What Sort of Proof the Principle of Utility is Susceptible”, of Utilitarianism. For the assessment of the proof two introductory comments are helpful. Already at the beginning of Utilitarianism, Mill points out that “questions of ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof.” (CW 10, 207). Notwithstanding, it is possible to give reasons for theories about the good, and these considerations are “equivalent to proof” (CW 10, 208). These reasons are empirical and touch upon the careful observation of oneself and others. More cannot be done and should not be expected in a proof re ultimate ends.
A further introductory comment concerns the basis of observation through which Mill seeks to support utilitarianism. In moral philosophy the appeal to intuitions plays a prominent role. They are used to justify moral claims and to check the plausibility of moral theories. The task of thought-experiments in testing ethical theories is analogous to the observation of facts in testing empirical theories. This suggests that intuitions are the right observational basis for the justification of first moral principles. Mill, however, was a fervent critic of intuitionism throughout his philosophical work. In his Autobiography he calls intuitionism “the great intellectual support of false doctrines and bad institutions.” (CW 1, 232). Mill considered the idea that truths can be known a priori, independently of observation and experience, to be a stronghold of conservatism.
His argument against intuitionistic approaches to moral philosophy has two parts. The first part points out that intuitionists have not been able to bring our intuitive moral judgments into a system. There is neither a complete list of intuitive moral precepts nor a basic principle of morality which would found such a list(CW 10, 206).
The second part of the Millian argument consists in an explanation of this result: What some call moral intuition is actually the result of our education and present social discourse. Society inculcates us with our moral views, and we come to believe strongly in their unquestionable truth. There is no system, no basic principle in the moral views of the Victorian era though. In The Subjection of Women, Mill caustically criticizes the moral intuitions of his contemporaries regarding the role of women. He finds them incompatible with the basic principles of the modern world, such as equality and liberty. Because the first principle of morality is missing, intuitionist ethics is in many regards just a decoration of the moral prejudices with which one is brought up –“(…) not so much a guide as a consecration of men’s actual sentiments” (CW 10, 207).
What we need, Mill contends, is a basis of observation that verifies a first principle, a principle that is capable of bringing our practice of moral judgments into order. This elemental observational basis – and this is the core idea in Mill’s proof – is human aspiration.
His argument for the utilitarian principle – if not a deductive argument, an argument all the same – involves three steps. First, Mill argues that it is reasonable for humans to aspire to one’s own well-being; second, that it is reasonable to support the well-being of all persons (instead of only one’s own); and third, that well-being represents the only ultimate goal and the rightness of our actions is to be measured exclusively in regard to the balance of happiness to which they lead (CW 10, 234).
Let us turn to the first step of the argument. Upon an initial reading it seems in fact to have little success. Mill argues that one’s own well-being is worthy of striving for because each of us strives for his or her own well-being. Here he leans on a questionable analogy: “The only proof capable of being given that an object is visible, is that people actually see it. […] In like manner, I apprehend, the sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable, is that people do actually desire it.” (CW 10, 234).
Can a more evident logical fallacy be given than the claim that something is worthy of striving for because it is factually sought? But Mill in no way believes that the relation between desirable and desired is a matter of definition. He is not saying that desirable objects are by definition objects which people desire; he writes instead that what people desire is the only evidence for what is desirable. If we want to know what is ultimately desirable for humans, we have to acquire observational knowledge about what humans ultimately strive for.
Mill’s argument is simple: We know by observation that people desire their own happiness. With a conclusion that Mill calls “inductive”, and to which he ascribes a central role in regard to our acquisition of knowledge, we succeed to the general thesis that all humans finally aspire to their happiness. This inductive conclusion serves as evidence for the claim that one’s own happiness is not only desired, but desirable, worthy of aspiration. Mill thus supports the thesis that one’s own happiness is an ultimate good to oneself with the observation that every human ultimately strives for his or her own well-being.
On this basis, Mill concludes in the second step of his proof that the happiness of all is also a good: “…each person’s happiness is a good to that person, and the general happiness, therefore, a good to the aggregate of all persons.” (CW 10, 234).
The “therefore” in the cited sentence above has evoked many a raised eyebrows. Does Mill claim here that each person tries to promote the happiness of all? This seems to be patently wrong. In a famous letter to a Henry Jones, he clarifies that he did not mean that every person, in fact, strives for the general good. “I merely meant in this particular sentence to argue that since A’s happiness is a good, B’s a good, C’s a good, &c., the sum of all these goods must be a good.” (CW 16, 1414, Letter 1257).
Indeed, in the “particular sentence” he just concludes that general happiness is a “good to the aggregate of all persons.” Nonetheless, one may doubt that Mill adequately responds to Jones’ reservations. It is unclear what it means that general happiness is the good of the aggregate of all persons. Neither each person, nor the aggregate of all persons seem to strive for the happiness of all. But Mill’s point in the second step of the argument is arguably a more modest one.
He simply wanted to vindicate the claim that if each person’s happiness is a good to each person, then we are entitled to conclude that general happiness is also a good. As he says in the letter to Jones: “the sum of all these goods must be a good.” Similar to the first step of the argument we have here an epistemic relationship: The fact that each person is striving for his or her own happiness is evidence that happiness as such (regardless to whom) is valuable. If happiness as such is valuable, it is not unreasonable to promote the well-being of all sentient beings. With this, the second step of the argument is complete. The result may seem meager at first. That it is not unreasonable to promote the happiness of all appears to be no particularly controversial claim. On closer inspection, however, Mill’s conclusion is quite interesting since it imposes pressure on self-interest theories of practical rationality. The “notion that self-interest possesses a special, underived rationality (…) seems suddenly to require justification.” (Skorupski 1989, 311).What Mill fails to show is that each person has most reason to promote the general good. One should note, however, that the aim of the proof is not to answer the question why one should be moral. Mill does not want to demonstrate that we have reason to prefer general happiness to personal happiness.
Hedonism states not only that happiness is intrinsically good, but also that it is the only good and thus the only measure for our action. To show this, is the goal of the third step of the proof. Mill’s reflections in this step are based on psychological hedonism and the principle of association. According to Mill, humans cannot desire anything except that which is either aninstrument to or a component of happiness. He concedes that people seem to strive for every possible thing as ultimate ends. Philosophers may pursue knowledge as their ultimate goal; others value virtue, fame or wealth. Corresponding to his basic thesis that “the sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable, is that people do actually desire it” (CW 10, 234), Mill must consider the possibility that knowledge, fame or wealth have intrinsic value.
He blocks this inference with the thesis that humans do not “naturally and originally” (CW 10, 235) desire other goods than happiness. That knowledge, virtue, wealth or fame is seen as intrinsically valuable is due to the operation of the principle of association. In the course of our socialization, goods, like knowledge, virtue, wealth or fame acquire value by their association with pleasure. A philosopher came to experience knowledge as pleasurable, and this is why he desires it. Humans strive for virtue and other goods only if they are associated with the natural and original tendency to seek pleasure and avoid pain. Virtue, knowledge or wealth can thus become parts of happiness. At this point, Mill declares that the proof is completed.
According to Mill’s Second Formula of the utilitarian standard, a good human life must be rich in enjoyments, in both quantitative and qualitative respects. A manner of existence without access to the higher pleasures is not desirable: “It is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied.” (CW 10, 212).
The life of Socrates is better because no person who is familiar with higher pleasures will trade the joy of philosophizing against an even infinite amount of lower pleasures, Mill suggests. This does not amount to a modern version of Aristotle’s’ view that only a life completely devoted to theoretical activity is desirable. One must not forget that Mill is a hedonist after all. What kind of life is joyful and therefore good for a particular person depends upon many factors, such as tastes, talents and character. There are a great variety of lifestyles that are equally good. But Mill insists that a human life that is completely deprived of higher pleasures is not as good as it could be. It is not a desirable “mode of existence”, nothing a “competent judge” would choose.
Utilitarianism demands that we establish and observe a system of social, legal and moral rules that enables all mankind to have the best life possible, a life that is “as rich as possible in enjoyments, both in point of quantity and quality” (CW 10, 214). Mill’s statement that every human has an equal claim “to all the means of happiness” (CW 10, 258), belongs in this context. Society must make sure that the social-economic preconditions of a non-impoverished life prevail. In one text passage, Mill even includes the happiness of animals. Animals, too, should have the best possible life, “so far as the nature of things admits” (CW 10, 214).
The Second Formula maintains that a set of social rules A is better than the set B, if in A less humans suffer from an impoverished, unhappy life and more enjoy a fulfilled, rich life than in B.
More difficult is the question how to evaluate scenarios that involve unequal population sizes. With Mill there is no explicit unpacking of this problem; but his advocacy of the regulation of birth gives us at least an indication of the direction in which his considerations would go. Let us consider the following example: Which world would be better: world X in which 1000 humans have a fulfilled life and 100 a bad one, or world Y in which 10000 humans have a fulfilled life and 800 an impoverished one? The answer to this question depends on whether we focus on the minimizing the number of bad lives or on maximizing the number of good lives, and whether we measure this absolutely or relatively to the total population.
(i) One possible answer concerns the minimization of the number of bad lives. This can mean the absolute number of humans with joyless or impoverished lives. If one answers this way, then world X would be better than world Y because in this world the absolute number of humans with bad lives would be less. But it is also possible to think of the Second Formula as a statement about the relative number of humans with bad lives; in this case world Y would be preferable.
(ii) Another possible answer emphasizes the maximization of fulfilled lives. If one follows this interpretation, then world Y is better than world X because in this world absolute and relative measurements suggest that more humans have fulfilled lives.
Under the influence of Malthus, Mill insisted throughout his work that the problem of poverty is to be resolved only through a reduction of the population number – as noted, he encouraged the regulation of birth. This proposal is reconcilable with all three interpretations, but does not bear any relation to the question concerning which of the interpretations he could have preferred. One can speculate how Mill would answer, but there is not clear textual basis.
A further theme that Mill does not address concerns the problem of measurement and the interpersonal comparison of quantities of happiness. From an utilitarian point of view, other things being equal, it makes no moral difference whether A or B experiences an equal quantity of happiness (CW 10, 258). A quantity of happiness for A bears precisely as much value as a quantity of happiness for B. But this answers neither the question of measurement nor the question of the comparison of interpersonal utility. Can quantities of happiness be measured like temperatures? The philosopher and economist Francis Edgeworth spoke in his 1881 Mathematical Psychics of a fictitious instrument of measurement, a hedonimeter, with whose help the quantities of pleasure and pain could be determined with scientific accuracy.
Or do amounts of happiness have to be assessed approximately, such that Harriet Taylor for example can say that she is happier today than she was yesterday. Interpersonal comparisons of utility are confronted with the related question whether and under which conditions one can say that, for instance, Harriet Taylor and John Stuart Mill experience an equal amount of happiness.
Mill gave both themes little attention. But probably he was convinced that precise measurement and comparison of interpersonal utility would not be needed, maybe not even possible. One often does not need a thermometer to discern whether or not an object is warmer than another. Similarly, in many cases we do not need something like a hedonimeter to judge whether the condition of world A is better than that of world B. We need only a reasonable degree of experience and the capacity to empathize. Often, though, we may be unsure what to say. Which of two systems of income tax, for instance, promotes general happiness more? Mill’s position here seems to be that we have to decide questions like these by means of public debate and not by means of a hedonimeter.
Regarding moral rights, “the most sacred and binding part of all morality” (CW 10, 255), all competent judges seem to agree that they promote general happiness. Our capacity to estimate quantities and qualities of happiness is thus sufficiently good in order to conclude that a society that does protect “the most vital of all interests” (CW 10, 251) is better than a society that does not.
In various places of his work John Stuart Mill occupied himself with the question of the freedom of the human will. The respective chapter in the System ofLogic he later claimed was the best part of the entire book. Here Mill presents the solution to a problem with which he wrestled not only intellectually. In his Autobiography he calls it a “heavy burden” and reports: “I pondered painfully on the subject.” (CW 1, 177)
Freedom of the will is a traditional philosophical problem whose roots stretch back to antiquity. The problem results from the conflict of two positions: On the one hand, that all events – and thus also all actions – have causes from which they necessarily follow; on the other hand, that humans are free. Both claims cannot be reconciled, or so it seems, and this is the problem.
Mill is a determinist and assumes that human actions follow necessarilyfrom antecedent conditions and psychological laws. This apparently commits him to the claim that humans are not free; for if their actions occurred necessarily and inevitably, then they could not act otherwise. With perfect knowledge of antecedent conditions and psychological laws, we could predict human behavior with perfect accuracy.
But Mill is convinced that humans are free in a relevant sense. In modern terminology, this makes him a compatibilist, someone who believes in the reconcilability of determinism and free will. Part of his solution to the problem of compatibility is based on the discovery of a “misleading association”, which accompanies the word “necessity”. We have to differentiate between the following two statements: On the one hand, that actions occur necessarily; on the other hand, that they are predetermined and agents have no influence on them. Corresponding to this is the differentiation of the doctrine of necessity (determinism) and the doctrine of fatalism. Fatalism is indeed not compatible with human freedom, says Mill, but determinism is.
He grounds his thesis that determinism is reconcilable with a sense of human freedom, first, (i) with a repudiation of common misunderstandings regarding the content of determinism and, second, (ii) with a presentation of what he takes to be the appropriate concept of human freedom.
(i) With regard to human action, the “doctrine of necessity” claims that actions are determined by the external circumstances and the effective motives of the person at a given point in time. Causal necessity means that events are accompanied not only factually without exception by certain effects, but would also be under counter-factual circumstances. Given the preconditions and laws, it is necessary that a person acts in a certain way, and a well-informed observer would have predicted precisely this. As things were, this had to happen.
Fatalism advocates a completely different thesis. It claims that all essential events in life are fixed, regardless of antecedent conditions or psychological laws. Nothing could change their occurrence. If someone’s fate is to die on a particular day, there is no way of changing it. One finds this kind of fatalism in Sophocles “Oedipus”. Oedipus is destined to kill his father and marry his mother and his desperate attempts to avoid his foretold fate are in vain. The determinists of his day, Mill suggests, were “more or less obscurely” also fatalists – and he thought that this explains the predominance of the belief that human will can be free only if determinism is false.
(ii) Mill now turns to the question of whether determinism – correctly understood – is indeed incompatible with the doctrine of free will. His central idea is, firstly, that determinism in no way excludes the possibility that a person can influence his or her character; and secondly, that the ability to have influence on one’s own character is what we mean by free will.
(1) Actions are determined by one’s character and the prevailing external circumstances. The character of a person is constituted by his or her motives, habits, convictions and so forth. All these are governed by psychological laws. A person’s character is not given at birth. It is being formed through education; the goals that we pursue, the motives and convictions that we have depend to a large degree on our socialization. But if it is possible to form someone’s character by means of education, then it is also possible to form one’s own character through self-education: “We are exactly as capable of making our own character, if we will, as others are of making it for us.”
If we have the wish to change ourselves, then we can. Experience teaches us that we are capable of having influence on our habits and attitudes. The desire to change oneself resides, for Mill, in the individual, thus in our selves. Discontent with oneself and one’s own life, or the admiration for another lifestyle may be reasons why one wants to change (CW 8, 841).
(2) The ability to influence the formation of one’s own character, for Mill, is the substance of the doctrine of free will: “(…) that what is really inspiring and ennobling in the doctrine of freewill, is the conviction that we have real power over the formation of our own character; that our will, by influencing some of our circumstances, can modify our future habits or capabilities of willing. All this was entirely consistent with the doctrine of circumstances, or rather, was that doctrine itself, properly understood.” (CW 1, 177). Nothing more is intended by the doctrine of free will: We are capable of acting in a way that corresponds to our own desires; and we are, if we want, capable of shaping our desires. More precisely said, Mill advocates the idea that we are in a measure free, insofar as we can become those who we want to be.
One may object here that Mill’s theory presumes the desire to change. But what about those who do not want to change? If one does not want to change, then one could not change. And with this, not all humans are free. But such an objection presumes that those who do not have the desire to change themselves are missing something (namely, the desire to change), and that, because of this lack, they are less free. But Mill contends that persons in certain ways “are their desires”. If someone is lacking the desire to change, he or she is no less free than a person who has this desire. It is not as if one were simply missing an entry upon a list of choices. The “I” does not choose between various desires and options; instead it is rather that “one’s self” is identified with one’s desires: “…it is obvious that ‘I’ am both parties in the contest; the conflict is between me and myself; between (for instance) me desiring a pleasure, and me dreading self-reproach. What causes Me, or, if you please, my Will, to be identified with one side rather than with the other, is that one of the Me’s represents a more permanent state of feelings than the other one does.” (CW 9, 452).
The thought that there is no “I” is also the reason why Mill rejects the idea that freedom presupposes the capacity to refrain from an act in a given situation (“I could have done otherwise”). Mill finds the idea utterly curious that someone’s will was only free if he could have acted differently. For what does it mean to say that “(o)ne could have acted differently?” Is it supposed to mean that one could have chosen what one did not want to choose (CW 9, 450)?According to Mill’s analysis, what we mean by the phrase (that we could have acted differently) is this: If the circumstances, or my character or my mood or my knowledge and so forth, would have been different, I would have acted differently. Without such variations, the thought that one could have acted differently seems strange to Mill:“I dispute therefore altogether that we are conscious of being able to act in opposition to the strongest present desire or aversion.” (CW 9, 453). Because a person cannot counteract an effective desire, he is necessarily determined by it – just as things are.
Mill variously examines the thesis that punishment is only justified if the perpetrator could have acted differently. A contemporary of Mill’s, the social reformer Robert Owen, claimed that punishment of the breaking of social norms is unjustified, because the character of a person is the result of social influences. No one is the author of himself. Because actions follow from the character and one is not responsible for this, it is not just to punish people for the violation of norm which they could not help violating. It was not within their power to act differently. And it is unjust to punish someone for something, if he could not do anything to hinder its occurrence (CW 9, 453).
Mill responds to Owen’s criticism that persons could very well have influence on their characters, if they wanted. But does this satisfy us as a defence of punishment for the breaking of norms? It might be right that someone who does not want to change will not become depressed about his inability to change (CW 8, 841). Probably the thought will not even occur to him. But the point here is not whether one’s inability is a source of depression or not. The point is whether it is fair to punish people for actions which they could not control. If one lacks the respective desire, then one cannot change one’s character. It seems unfair to blame a person for her rotten character if there is no “I” that we can accuse of failing to have the desire to change.
Mill’s solution to this problem is somewhat surprising. We have to be clear as to what it means to say that a person “could not have acted differently”. Certainly, it does not mean that a person would have performed a particular act under all conceivable circumstances. This would be the case, if humans were programmed like robots to act in certain ways, regardless of the external conditions. In actual fact, one can in almost all cases imagine variations in circumstances that would effectively hold a person back from acting how he or she acted. Someone with criminal tendencies might not be able to keep himself from acting criminally, because he does not consider the possibility that he will be severely punished if caught. “If, on the contrary, the impression is strong in his mind that a heavy punishment will follow, he can, and in most cases does, help it.” (CW 9, 458)
It is the purpose of punishments to reduce anti-social behavior, in particular the violation of moral rights, “the most vital of all interests” (CW 10, 251). The justification of punishment consists in the fact that it serves this justified goal (CW 9, 459-460). If someone cannot be restrained from breaking the norm through the threat of punishment, then the threat of punishment was ineffective in regard to this individual. It was not enough – seen in the light of his character and his perception of the situation – to discourage him from violating the norm. But that the criminal inclinations of an individual is higher than average and that it had therefore needed a stronger incentive in order to bring him to respect the norm makes neither the punishment nor the threat of punishment unjust or illegitimate.
According to Mill, conceiving oneself as a morally responsible agent does not mean to see oneself as an “I” who could have acted differently. It means to consider oneself as member of a moral community entitled to sanction the violation of justified social norms. This idea of moral responsibility does not seem far-fetched. A person may well agree that it is appropriate to punish him for the violation of moral rights, even if he “could not have done otherwise” under the given circumstances.
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