Philosophy through Film
This article introduces the main perspectives concerning philosophy through film. Film is understood not so much as an object of philosophical reflection but as a medium for engaging in philosophy. Contributions to the area have flourished since the beginning of the 21st century, along with debates over the extent to which film can really be understood to be “doing” philosophy, as opposed to merely serving as a source of illustration or example for philosophical reflection. A number of objections have their origins in perceived similarities between the cinema and Plato’s cave; other objections have their origins in more general Platonic criticisms of fictive art’s capacity to reveal truth. Against these objections are some surprisingly bold views of film’s capacity to do philosophy, to the effect that much of what can be done in the verbal medium can also be done in the cinematic one; or that there is a distinctive kind of cinematic thinking that resists paraphrasing in traditional philosophical terms. There are also more moderate views, to the effect that film can be seen as engaging in certain recognizably philosophical activities, such as the thought experiment; or that they are able to present certain kinds of philosophical material better than standard philosophical genres. This article considers these views for and against the idea of philosophy through film. It also considers the “imposition” objection—that while film may serve to provide useful illustration, any philosophizing is in fact being done by the philosopher using the film.
Table of Contents
- What is Philosophy through Film?
- Platonic Objections
- Objections: Smith, Russell
- Objecting to the ‘Bold Thesis’
- The Imposition Objection
- References and Further Reading
This article introduces the main perspectives concerning the idea of doing philosophy through film. By film here is meant, primarily, narrative fiction film. The idea of doing, or at least engaging in some way with, philosophy through film can mean at least two things. Firstly, it may mean using film as a resource, a source of example and illustration, in order to illuminate philosophical positions, ideas and questions. Secondly, it may mean that film itself is to be understood as a medium for philosophising—doing philosophy in film or philosophy as film. The latter implies a more robust engagement of film with philosophy. The extent to which a film can be philosophical or contribute to philosophical knowledge has itself been a matter of some debate. However, what is broadly accepted is that many films ‘resonate in fruitful ways with traditional and contemporary philosophical issues’ (Livingston and Plantinga 2009: xi).
Consideration of film in its philosophical significance, and of philosophical issues through film, can be distinguished from more traditional philosophy of film, though in practice the two activities overlap. Both are subfields in the area of philosophical aesthetics. Philosophy of film traditionally concerns itself with the reflective study of the nature of film, aiming to spell out what film is, whether it is an art, how it differs from other arts, and so on. It is philosophy about film. Contrasted with this is the idea of film serving as a resource, means or medium for the illumination and exploration of philosophical ideas and questions. This is philosophy through film. Historically, philosophy through film is of a more recent vintage than philosophy of film, which enjoyed significant development in the 1980s. Philosophy through film has flourished mostly since 2000, although there were a number of important forerunners who promoted the idea that film can contribute to philosophy, including Cavell (1979), Jarvie (1987), Kupfer (1999) and Freeland (2000).
Since the turn of the century a significant amount of literature has emerged, devoted to the exploration of philosophical themes and questions through narrative films or genres of narrative film. The literature in this area includes more or less popular explorations of the philosophical dimensions of particular films and genres, and of the work of specific directors or writers (for example, Irwin 2002, Abrams 2007, Sanders 2007, Eaton 2008, LaRocca 2011). Along with them there are more pedagogically-oriented introductions to philosophy through film (for example, Litch 2002, Rowlands 2004, Falzon 2007, Cox and Levine 2012). There are also the more theoretical discussions defending the idea of philosophy through film (for example, Mulhall 2002, Wartenberg 2007, Sinnerbrink 2011), or criticising it (for example, Russell 2000, Smith 2006, Livingston 2009).
This article will discuss a range of philosophical positions that have emerged both for and against the idea of philosophy through film. It will proceed by considering a number of objections to the idea.
The idea of philosophy through film most clearly contrasts with the view that film has nothing to do with philosophy; that film is in effect philosophy’s ‘bad other’, containing all that is foreign or dubious from philosophy’s point of view. Along these lines it might be argued that philosophy is the realm of reflection and debate, whereas film is restricted to experience and action; that philosophy is concerned with reality and truth, as opposed to film which is the realm of mere illusion, appearance, unreal images; or that philosophy deals with universal questions and is a serious business, whereas film is confined to particular narratives, and is designed only for entertainment and distraction. Implicit in the distinctions invoked here is a certain conception of philosophy. As might be expected, considering film to be outside the realm of the philosophical depends on having a certain view of what constitutes philosophy. In general, consideration of the question of philosophy through film inevitably raises meta-philosophical questions about the nature of philosophy itself.
The dismissal of film as inherently non-philosophical is at the heart of what can be called the ‘Platonic’ objection to philosophy through film. Many of the oppositions invoked in distinguishing the philosophical from the non-philosophical – between reflection and experience, reality and illusion, universality and particularity – find articulation in Plato. They can be discerned in Plato’s Allegory of the Cave, in The Republic (514a–520a). The famous story of prisoners mistaking for reality what are in fact mere shadows projected on the cave wall carries the message that visual images and representations are inadequate as a source of knowledge; and more broadly, that philosophical enlightenment requires thinking and critical reflection, rather than reliance on the way things appear to us. There is also an implicit rejection, developed elsewhere by Plato, of the fictive arts, which trade in unreal representations and foster illusion.
Plato’s cave story has a particular resonance for film. The scenario proposed in the cave story is itself uncannily evocative of the modern cinema (within film theory, see for example Baudry 1976), and has been seen as haunting theoretical reflection on film (Stam 2009: 10). On this model, film is a realm of seductive illusion, all too readily confused with reality by the captive audience. This view is evident, amongst other places, in the Marxist or psychoanalytical semiotic theorising that was prominent in the 1960s and 1970s, which holds that narrative films are forms of bourgeois illusionism. Their apparently realistic content is in fact determined by the dominant ideology of the time, and they imprison their audience by inculcating conformist thinking that makes people accepting of their social and political circumstances (Wilson 1986: 12-13; Stam 2009: 138-9). Philosophical insight, it would appear, requires that one look elsewhere.
Against this view, which in its monolithic dismissal of film pays scant attention to what is going on in particular films themselves, is the contention that films can do more than simply echo dominant ideologies that distort and obscure social reality. Careful examination of individual films shows how prevailing ways of thinking, social practices and institutions, can not only be illuminated but also challenged within a cinematic framework, through playfulness, irony, even downright subversion (Wilson 1986: 13; Stam 2009: 139). For example, Ridley Scott’s feminist road movie Thelma and Louise, highlights and mocks various aspects of male power. This implies that film is capable of adopting some kind of reflective attitude towards what it presents, and that it can present narrative scenarios through which such reflective activity can be pursued. If this is so, Plato’s cave scenario is no longer an adequate model for film. Indeed, the very philosophical scenario that encourages one to think critically about what one experiences, to think philosophically, itself appears in various forms in film, with similar effects. For example, Bernardo Bertolucci’s film The Conformist (1970) uses Plato’s cave image to draw attention to the central character’s imprisonment in the delusions of Fascist ideology. As such, the critical reflection on what is given to us, arguably a necessary characteristic of philosophy, is not foreign to film.
A second, though once again ultimately Platonic, objection to the idea of philosophy through film is that fiction film only deals in specific narratives, images, and scenarios, whereas philosophy concerns itself with universal truths. How can film, mired in the particular, have anything to do with philosophy? Thomas Wartenberg has developed a conception of philosophy through film that turns this objection on its head. He points out that fictional narratives can be found readily enough in philosophy itself, in the form of imaginary scenarios, hypothetical situations, in short, thought experiments. More than mere ornamentation, thought experiments play a role in arguments, initiating philosophical reflection, raising general questions, questioning existing views by posing counter-examples, exploring what is essential in a concept, confirming a theory or helping build one, and so forth. In other words they are modes of reflection, allowing general points to be made through particular stories (see Wartenberg 2007, 24, 56-65).
Plato’s cave story is itself such a thought experiment, a narrative embodying a memorable image or scenario, designed to raise general questions about the role of sense experience, the nature of knowledge, the character of philosophical enlightenment itself. Ironically enough, Plato resorts to a narrative, embodying a memorable image, in order to argue that images have no place in philosophical discourse; and indeed, he makes use of a narrative that helps to establish a larger narrative in which philosophy itself is seen as arising through the rejection of narrative in favour of a rational discourse devoted to universal truths (Wartenberg 2007: 21; see also Derrida 1993). As it happens, philosophical discourse is filled with such narrative thought experiments; from Plato’s Ring of Gyges to Descartes’ dream or evil demon hypotheses; from Locke’s prince and the cobbler; to Nozick’s experience machine. At the very least, one can say that concrete narratives and scenarios in the form of thought experiments are not foreign to philosophy; and equally, there is no reason why fiction film, which deals with such narratives, should not be able to pursue general points, or raise philosophical questions, through them. Wartenberg argues that it makes sense to think of some fiction films as working in ways that thought experiments do, and to the extent they may be seen as doing philosophy (Wartenberg 2007, 67). For example, Gondry’s 2004 film Eternal Sunshine of the Spotless Mind may be interpreted as a thought experiment that provides a counterexample to the ethical theory of utilitarianism (Wartenberg 2007, 76-93; see also Grau 2006).
It might be added that even within philosophical discourse, many of these experiments have a dramatic and decidedly cinematic quality about them; and film-makers have not been slow in translating them into visual form. For example, by appropriating skeptical thought experiments involving the possibility of global illusion – the cinematic appropriation of Descartes’ dream hypothesis or evil demon thought experiment in various forms, most famously in the Wachowski Brothers’ much discussed 1999 film The Matrix. The capacity of films to explicitly appropriate philosophical material also suggests a further, and comparatively straightforward way in which one might speak of philosophy through film: the film may be about philosophy in various ways. It may be about a philosopher who in the course of the film expounds their views, as in Derek Jarman’s Wittgenstein (1993); or it may have characters who articulate or discuss philosophical positions, such as Eric Rohmer’s Ma Nuit Chez Maud (1969) or Richard Linklater’s Waking Life (2001); or it may be an adaptation of a philosophically interesting text, as in Jean-Jacques Annaud’s The Name of the Rose (1986). However, this in itself only amounts to a recording of particular views and positions, which find expression in the film. It needs to be distinguished from the idea of film as a medium for philosophising, film as philosophy; and doing philosophy in film.
A third objection to the idea of philosophy through film can be found in Murray Smith, who argues that film may appropriate or employ philosophically interesting scenarios, but can never really engage with philosophy because it ultimately has very different structuring interests. Whereas philosophy presents thought experiments—narratives in which philosophical concerns, for example, epistemological issues, are at the forefront; in film it is artistic concerns—dramatic or comic ones—that dominate and trump any philosophical concerns (see Smith 2006). In this way film becomes once more the ‘bad other’ of philosophy. Against this it may be argued that it is artificial to acknowledge similarities between film and philosophical texts ‘only to insist that these similarities are subordinate to important differences between them’ (Wartenberg 2007: 16-17). In addition, it may of course be acknowledged that films do much more than simply engage with philosophical questions and concerns, but this does not in itself preclude the possibility that amongst other things, they might do precisely that.
Smith also supplements his argument by reinstating Plato’s denial of the capacity of fictive works to reveal truth. Smith claims that works of art like films are inherently ambiguous, and cannot present the sort of precision that is necessary for articulating and defending philosophical claims (Smith 2006; Wartenberg 2007: 17). A similar claim is made by Bruce Russell, for whom narrative films lack explicitness to the extent that it is not true that there is some particular argument to be found in them; they lack the explicitness necessary for philosophy (Russell 2000; Wartenberg 2007, 19). Against this it can be argued that philosophical claims and arguments attributed to films may not have always been formulated by philosophical interpreters as precisely as they should be, but ‘this does not establish the claim that the films themselves are inherently ambiguous and their arguments incapable of precise formulation’ (Wartenberg 2007: 20).
Here, once again, an a priori dismissal of the idea that film can be philosophical shows itself to be informed by Platonic considerations, in this case Plato’s dismissal of the artists from the city of philosophy. By the same token the notion of philosophy through film amounts to a repudiation of the Platonic prejudice against art, of the view, at least implicit in the cave scenario, that the fictive arts trade in unreal representations and foster illusion, and cannot be philosophically enlightening (see Wartenberg 2007:15,17; Sinnerbrink 2011: 4-5). Philosophy through film may not amount to an entirely anti-Platonic enterprise, however. As with Plato’s repudiation of image and narrative which he nonetheless makes use of in his own work, Plato’s dismissal of the artists is paradoxical, given that, as Iris Murdoch notes, Plato himself is a great artist (Murdoch 1977: 87).
Paisley Livingston argues that film may certainly be used for philosophically interesting purposes, as a resource for philosophy. It can serve to illustrate views about scepticism, wisdom and so on, and even give expression to philosophically informed positions and perspectives. But to do more, to be able to be said to be philosophising, film would have to ‘make independent, innovative and significant contributions to philosophy by means unique to the cinematic medium…where such contributions are independent in the sense that they are inherent in the film, and not based on verbally articulated philosophising’ (Livingston 2008: 12). This is what Livingston calls the ‘bold thesis’ of film as philosophy, the view that films engage in creative philosophical thinking and the formation of new philosophical concepts. Livingston rejects this bold thesis, because either the philosophical content of a film can be paraphrased verbally, in which case it has no special connection with film, or it cannot be paraphrased, in which case one may wonder whether this supposed content exists at all.
Against this kind of view, a number of positions have been formulated to the effect that film is more than merely a resource for philosophy, a useful way of illustrating philosophical positions and themes. At one extreme, there is Stephen Mulhall’s classic formulation of film as philosophy, in the introduction to his book on the Alien films:
I do not look to these films as handy or popular illustrations of views and arguments properly developed by philosophers; I see them rather as themselves reflecting on and evaluating such views and arguments, as thinking seriously and systematically about them in just the same ways that philosophers do. Such films are not philosophy’s raw material, are not a source for its ornamentation; they are philosophical exercises, philosophy in action – film as philosophising (Mulhall 2002: 2).
This formulation implies that there can be a cinematic performance of philosophy—that what is done in the verbal medium of philosophy can also be done in the cinematic medium. However, by the same token it might be argued that on this view, everything done cinematically could also be done in purely verbal philosophical form; it could be entirely paraphrased, or re-expressed in verbal terms. The problem with this conception of philosophy through film is that film here may no longer be philosophy’s ‘bad other’, but in so far as it can be said to philosophize, it seems to have been effectively reduced to philosophy. On this conception, film as a philosophical exercise is too similar to philosophy to be doing anything distinctively cinematic; which also means that it presumably could be dispensed with in favour of purely verbal philosophical argument without any loss. The cinematic setting for this reflective activity is purely accidental. As such, philosophy through film simply turns out to be more philosophy.
At the other extreme, Robert Sinnerbrink argues that films are able to engage in a distinctively cinematic kind of thinking that resists philosophical translation or paraphrase. Such films cannot be reduced to a philosophical thesis or theoretical problem, or translated into a ready-made position or argument; they confront existing categories and open up new ways of thinking (Sinnerbrink 2011:10). By concretely showing rather than arguing, these films question aspects of our practices or normative frameworks, challenge established ways of seeing, disclose new aspects of experience, and open up new paths of thinking (Sinnerbrink, 2011: 141, 142). Thus, for example, rather than exploring scenarios of global illusion that draw attention to a distinction between appearance and underlying reality, a film like David Lynch’s Mulholland Drive (2001) can be seen as bringing into question the very distinction between the real and the illusory, in order to explore an indeterminate zone between fantasy and reality (see Sinnerbrink 2005).
By the same token, however, it might be argued that the more distinctively cinematic the reflection, that is, the more it resists translation into a philosophical thesis or form, the less recognisably philosophical it is going to be. In other words, the less it will constitute philosophy through film. Whereas in Mulhall’s formulation, filmic reflection was too similar to philosophy to do anything distinctively cinematic; now filmic reflection is too different from philosophy to do anything recognisably philosophical. In a sense this view does not oppose Livingston’s rejection of the bold thesis regarding philosophy through film—not only because there cannot be a uniquely cinematic form of reflection, but because to the extent that there is, it is no longer philosophical. In this form, film would be philosophy’s ‘good other’. It would embody a form of thinking or of reflection—something other than philosophy. Film, so understood, would neither be a mere resource or instrument for philosophy, nor a form of reflection that could be translated into existing philosophical categories. Rather, it would be an autonomous mode of reflection that transcends philosophy. Here, one would be escaping from philosophy through film; though it might also be argued that this represents the transformation of philosophical reflection into something new.
Finally, a ‘moderate’ position, standing effectively between those of Mulhall and Sinnerbrink, which acknowledges both the philosophical and the necessarily cinematic character of cinematic thinking, is argued for by Damien Cox and Michael Levine. This is the view that films are capable of performing philosophical activities that can also be pursued in standard verbal philosophical form, but they can sometimes do some things better than written texts can. That is, precisely as films, they are capable of presenting certain kinds of philosophical material better than standard philosophical genres. This dovetails with the view developed by Wartenberg, discussed earlier, that film is able to explore philosophical issues and questions through concrete thought experiments. What Cox and Levine argue is that cinematic thought experiments can be presented with greater richness, nuance and perspective than may be found within the genres of professional philosophy (the book, the journal article), where these experiments are typically abstract, thin and context-free (Cox and Levine 201: 10-12).
This position joins with those critiques of philosophy to the effect that the peculiar abstractness of standard philosophical genres can be a source of distortion, and which argue that some areas of philosophy, like ethics, are sometimes more at home in literature and the arts (Cox and Levine 2012: 11-12; see Murdoch 1970, 1977; Nussbaum 1990). Clearly evident once again, in this affirmation of art in general and film in particular, is the rejection of the Platonic view that the fictive arts, trading in unreal representations only foster illusion, and have nothing to contribute to philosophy.
The idea of philosophy through film, then, can cover a number of things, including: using film as a resource, providing useful examples and illustrations of philosophical ideas; and the idea of film as philosophizing, at least in the sense of evoking or enacting philosophically interesting thought experiments that remind us of various aspects of our concrete experience of life. In addition, it can cover the idea of film as being explicitly about philosophers or philosophy, giving explicit expression to philosophical positions and perspectives.
This brings us to one more possible objection to the idea of philosophy through film, in particular film as doing philosophy, namely, what has been termed by Wartenberg the imposition objection. This is the claim that film may certainly be used for philosophically interesting purposes, such as providing useful illustrations, but that any philosophizing is done by the philosopher using the film, rather than by the film itself. On this view, to think that the film itself is doing anything philosophical is a mistake; any philosophical significance one imagines to be discernible in the film itself is in fact only a projection of the philosopher’s views onto the film. A film may raise interesting questions, but only a philosophical interpreter can organize those into a coherent position or argument (Wartenberg 2007: 25). This view in effect requires that film be once again viewed as the ‘bad other’ of philosophy, with any philosophical significance necessarily being imposed from outside. At best, we are back with the view that film may serve as a useful resource for philosophy, a source of example and illustration, but that it cannot be said in any way to do philosophy.
Obviously, to the extent that film can be said to do philosophy, the imposition view has to be rejected. A general point to make here is that any engagement with film requires interpretation on the part of the onlooker, who is, after all, at the most basic level, required to organise and make sense of a multiplicity of images in a certain way. Engagement with film in its philosophical aspects is no different; it requires a certain reading or interpretation of the film on the part of the onlooker. At the very least, engaging with the philosophical dimension of a film involves singling out a particular aspect of that film and ignoring others, since there is always much more going on in a film than a concern with philosophically relevant matters. As far as responding to the imposition objection is concerned, the important issue is not whether there is interpretation but whether or not the interpretation, the philosophical reading, is imposed on the film; that is, whether it is appropriate or inappropriate to the film. With regard to what renders an interpretation appropriate, both author and audience -centred positions have been argued for in the literature. These alternatives recall broader debates in aesthetics and literary theory over how far a work of art is to be judged by reference to the purposes of its creator, and to what extent a text may yield more than the creator of the work could have conceived.
On the one hand there is the ‘author-centred’ view argued for by Wartenberg, that a philosophical interpretation of a film may be considered appropriate because it is grounded in the intentions of the authors of the film (Wartenberg 2007: 26). That is, it is necessary that the film’s creators intend to present the views or pose the questions that are being attributed to the film. As a result there are constraints as to what interpretations may be made. Specifically, one should never attribute to the film a meaning that could not be intended by the creator of that work. For a philosophical film interpretation to be plausible, it needs to posit a meaning the filmmaker at least could have intended. To that extent, the meaning discerned is not simply imposed or projected onto the film, but rather is inherent in the film, as part of its creators’ intention. Certainly, the filmmaker may not necessarily have an explicit conception of the philosophical views that are embedded in the film; but it is enough that they have some conception of the relevant idea, and what might be questionable about it. (Wartenberg 2007: 26, 91). A problem with the ‘author-centred’ view is that it may be difficult or impossible to establish what the director’s or writer’s intention might have been; and moreover, since films are collaborative endeavours it may not be possible even to identify a particular author.
On the other hand, there is the view that the philosophical views and questions presented in films can be assessed independently of authorial intention. For Cox and Levine, ‘[A]n interesting aspect of film, like other forms of narrative art (such as novels) is that it often lets us see and surmise a great deal more than its creators intended’ (Cox and Levine 2012: 13). In this spirit they argue that philosophical views may be embedded in a film without it being the director’s or writer’s intention that the view be manifest, or without them even being aware that it is a view they hold. That is, ‘it is often possible to distinguish authorial intention from what is revealed in film narrative, visual effect, or performance.’ (Cox and Levine 2012: 14-15) Here, the emphasis changes from a concern with the author’s intentions to how the film is received—an audience-centred interpretation. Films have ‘lives and meanings of their own,’ and these will vary over time and are relative to a degree to particular audiences (Cox and Levine 2012: 15).
What these views have in common is that they acknowledge that engagement with a film involves some interpretation on the part of the onlooker; but also that this interpretation is not arbitrary, such that one could read any kind of significance whatsoever into the film. That would indeed imply that any philosophical significance is simply being imposed on the film from outside. However, even an audience-centred interpretation is subject to constraints arising from the film itself. Not any kind of interpretation is appropriate; some interpretations work better than others. This is so even if one views the film merely as providing a handy illustration of a pre-existing philosophical position or issue, where the film is being used as a resource for philosophical purposes, and the concern is primarily to illuminate certain philosophical ideas. Even here the interpretation is not arbitrary. There are better or worse cinematic illustrations that one can appeal to; More or less effective cinematic resources one can make use of. Some films lend themselves more readily to the task than others; and to the extent that they do so, being able to make use of the film in this way is also saying something about the film itself, and reflects the reality of the film itself in so far as it engages with philosophical ideas. For example, one sees philosophical ideas like Locke’s memory-based conception of personal identity concretely illustrated in a film like Paul Verhoeven’s Total Recall (1990); the film also invites this interpretation, and thereby reveals itself to have strong philosophical resonances.
Furthermore, if film even as illustration can be said to be engaging with philosophy, it seems to follow that a sharp distinction cannot really be drawn between film as illustration for philosophy, and as doing philosophy. It would instead be a matter of degrees of engagement, of film being more or less engaged with philosophical positions, issues and questions. By the same token, if film does indeed have a capacity to do philosophy, in particular by presenting certain philosophical material with greater richness, nuance and perspective than is possible within the genres of professional philosophy, we would expect something of this to also be present in film as mere illustration. Certainly, Wartenberg has argued to this effect, that films which illustrate previously articulated philosophical positions can, despite their status as illustrations, deepen understanding of those positions by providing a concrete version of an abstract theory, and to that extent they can be said to embody philosophical thinking. For example, Charlie Chaplin’s Modern Times (1936) can be seen as offering a concrete illustration of Marx’s conception of the alienating mechanisation of human beings under the factory system, a concrete representation of an abstract account that clarifies and extends it, and shows its human significance (Wartenberg 2007: 32, 44-54).
Finally, if film even as illustration engages with philosophy, and there is no sharp distinction between film as illustration, and film as doing philosophy; it will no longer be possible to accept the former while rejecting the latter. The imposition objection allows that film may be used for illustration, but rejects the idea of film as philosophising, dismissing this as no more than a projection on the part of the onlooker. However, without a sharp distinction between the two, it is not possible to accept the former while rejecting the latter. Or to put it in more positive terms, accepting the former implicates one in the latter because far from being mere illustration, film as illustration can already be said, to an extent, to be doing philosophy.
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Last updated: August 12, 2013 | Originally published: August 12, 2013