Philo of Alexandria (c.20 BCE—40 CE)
Philo of Alexandria, a Hellenized Jew also called Judaeus Philo, is a figure that spans two cultures, the Greek and the Hebrew. When Hebrew mythical thought met Greek philosophical thought in the first century B.C.E. it was only natural that someone would try to develop speculative and philosophical justification for Judaism in terms of Greek philosophy. Thus Philo produced a synthesis of both traditions developing concepts for future Hellenistic interpretation of messianic Hebrew thought, especially by Clement of Alexandria, Christian Apologists like Athenagoras, Theophilus, Justin Martyr, Tertullian, and by Origen. He may have influenced Paul, his contemporary, and perhaps the authors of the Gospel of John (C. H. Dodd) and the Epistle to the Hebrews (R. Williamson and H. W. Attridge). In the process, he laid the foundations for the development of Christianity in the West and in the East, as we know it today. Philo’s primary importance is in the development of the philosophical and theological foundations of Christianity. The church preserved the Philonic writings because Eusebius of Caesarea labeled the monastic ascetic group of Therapeutae and Therapeutrides, described in Philo’s The Contemplative Life, as Christians, which is highly unlikely. Eusebius also promoted the legend that Philo met Peter in Rome. Jerome (345-420 C.E.) even lists him as a church Father. Jewish tradition was uninterested in philosophical speculation and did not preserve Philo’s thought. According to H. A. Wolfson, Philo was a founder of religious philosophy, a new habit of practicing philosophy. Philo was thoroughly educated in Greek philosophy and culture as can be seen from his superb knowledge of classical Greek literature. He had a deep reverence for Plato and referred to him as “the most holy Plato” (Prob. 13). Philo’s philosophy represented contemporary Platonism which was its revised version incorporating Stoic doctrine and terminology via Antiochus of Ascalon (ca 90 B.C.E.) and Eudorus of Alexandria, as well as elements of Aristotelian logic and ethics and Pythagorean ideas. Clement of Alexandria even called Philo “the Pythagorean.” But it seems that Philo also picked up his ancestral tradition, though as an adult, and once having discovered it, he put forward the teachings of the Jewish prophet, Moses, as “the summit of philosophy” (Op. 8), and considered Moses the teacher of Pythagoras (b. ca 570 B.C.E.) and of all Greek philosophers and lawgivers (Hesiod, Heraclitus, Lycurgus, to mention a few). For Philo, Greek philosophy was a natural development of the revelatory teachings of Moses. He was no innovator in this matter because already before him Jewish scholars attempted the same. Artapanus in the second century B.C.E identified Moses with Musaeus and with Orpheus. According to Aristobulus of Paneas (first half of the second century B.C.E.), Homer and Hesiod drew from the books of Moses which were translated into Greek long before the Septuagint.
Table of Contents
- Philo’s Works and Their Classification
- Technique of Exposition
- Emphasis on Contemplative Life and Philosophy
- Philosophy and Wisdom: a Path to Ethical Life
- Philo’s Ethical Doctrine
- Philo’s Mysticism and Transcendence of God
- Source of Intuition of the Infinite Reality
- Philo’s Doctrine of Creation
- Doctrine of Miracles: Naturalism and Comprehension
- Doctrine of the Logos in Philo’s Writings
- The Utterance of God
- The Divine Mind
- God’s Transcendent Power
- First-born Son of God
- Universal Bond: in the Physical World and in the Human Soul
- Immanent Reason
- Immanent Mediator of the Physical Universe
- The Angel of the Lord, Revealer of God
- Multi-Named Archetype
- Soul-Nourishing Manna and Wisdom
- Intermediary Power
- Summary of Philo’s Concept of the Logos
- List of abbreviations to Philo’s works
- Editions of Philo’s works and their translations
- Major Works on Philo
Very little is known about the life of Philo. He lived in Alexandria, which at that time counted, according to some estimates, about one million people and included largest Jewish community outside of Palestine. He came from a wealthy and the prominent family and appears to be a leader in his community. Once he visited Jerusalem and the temple, as he himself stated in Prov. 2.64. Philo’s brother, Alexander, was a wealthy, prominent Roman government official, a custom agent responsible for collecting dues on all goods imported into Egypt from the East. He donated money to plate the gates of the temple in Jerusalem with gold and silver. He also made a loan to Herod Agrippa I, grandson of Herod the Great. Alexander’s two sons, Marcus and Tiberius Julius Alexander were involved in Roman affairs. Marcus married Bernice, the daughter of Herod Agrippa I, who is mentioned in Acts (25:13, 23; 26:30). The other son, Tiberius Julius Alexander, described by Josephus as “not remaining true to his ancestral practices” became procurator of the province of Judea (46-48 C.E.) and prefect of Egypt (66-70 C.E.). Philo was involved in the affairs of his community which interrupted his contemplative life (Spec. leg. 3.1-6), especially during the crisis relating to the pogrom which was initiated in 38 C.E. by the prefect Flaccus, during the reign of emperor Gaius Caligula. He was elected to head the Jewish delegation, which apparently included his brother Alexander and nephew Tiberius Julius Alexander, and was sent to Rome in 39-40 B.C.E. to see the emperor. He reported the events in his writings Against Flaccus and The Embassy to Gaius.
The major part of Philo’s writings consists of philosophical essays dealing with the main themes of biblical thought that present a systematic and precise exposition of his views. One has the impression that he attempted to show that the philosophical Platonic or Stoic ideas were nothing but the deductions made from the biblical verses of Moses. Philo was not an original thinker, but he was well acquainted with the entire range of Greek philosophical traditions through the original texts. If there are gaps in his knowledge, they are rather in his Jewish tradition as evidenced by his relying on the Greek translation of the Hebrew Bible. In his attempt to reconcile the Greek way of thinking with his Hebrew tradition he had antecedents such as Pseudo-Aristeas and Aristobulus.
Philo’s works are divided into three categories:
1. The first group comprises writings that paraphrase the biblical texts of Moses: On Abraham, On the Decalogue, On Joseph, The Life of Moses, On the Creation of the World, On Rewards and Punishments, On the Special Laws, On the Virtues. A series of works include allegorical explanations of Genesis 2-41: On Husbandry, On the Cherubim, On the Confusion of Tongues, On the Preliminary Studies, The Worse Attacks the Better, On Drunkenness, On Flight and Finding, On the Giants, Allegorical Interpretation (Allegory of the Law), On the Migration of Abraham, On the Change of Names, On Noah’s Work as a Planter, On the Posterity and Exile of Cain, Who is the Heir, On the Unchangeableness of God, On the Sacrifices of Abel and Cain, On Sobriety, On Dreams. Here belong also: Questions and Answers on Genesis and Questions and Answers on Exodus (aside from fragments preserved only in Armenian).
2. A series of works classified as philosophical treatises: Every Good Man is Free (a sequel of which had the theme that every bad man is a slave, which did not survive); On the Eternity of the World; On Providence (except for lengthy fragments preserved in Armenian); Alexander or On Whether Brute Animals Possess Reason (preserved only in Armenian) and called in Latin De Animalibus (On the Animals); a brief fragment De Deo (On God), preserved only in Armenian is an exegesis of Genesis 18, and belongs to the Allegory of the Law.
3. The third group includes historical-apologetic writings: Hypothetica or Apologia Pro Judaeos which survives only in two Greek extracts quoted by Eusebius. The first extract is a rationalistic version of Exodus giving a eulogic account of Moses and a summary of Mosaic constitution contrasting its severity with the laxity of the gentile laws; the second extract describes the Essenes. The other apologetic essays include Against Flaccus, The Embassy to Gaius, and On the Contemplative Life. But all these works are related to Philo’s explanations of the texts of Moses.
Philo uses an allegorical technique for interpretation of the Hebrew myth and in this he follows the Greek tradition of Theagenes of Rhegium (second half of the sixth century B.C.E.). Theagenes used this approach in defense of Homer’s theology against the detractors. He said that the myths of gods struggling with each other referred to the opposition between the elements; the names of gods were made to refer to various dispositions of the soul, e.g., Athena was reflection, Aphrodite, desire, Hermes, elocution. Anaxagoras, too, explained the Homeric poems as discussions of virtue and justice. The Sophist Prodicus of Ceos (b. 470 B.C.E.), contemporary of Socrates, interpreted the gods of Homeric stories as personifications of those natural substances that are useful to human life [e.g., bread and Demeter, wine and Dionysus, water and Poseidon, fire and Hephaestus]. He also employed ethical allegory. His treatise, The Seasons, contains a Parable of Heracles, paraphrased in Xenophon’s Memorabilia (2.1.21-34), which tells the story of Heracles who, at crossroad, was attracted by Virtue and Vice in the form of two women of great stature (Sacr. 20-44). The allegory was used by the cynic Antisthenes (contemporary of Plato) and Diogenes the Cynic. Stoics expanded the Cynics’ use of Homeric allegory in the interest of their philosophical system. Using this allegorical method, Philo seeks out the hidden message beneath the surface of any particular text and tries to read back a new doctrine into the work of the past. In a similar way Plutarch allegorized the ancient Egyptian mythology giving it a new meaning. But in some aspects of Jewish life Philo defends the literal interpretation of his tradition as in the debate on circumcision or the Sabbath (Mig. 89-93; Spec. leg. 1.1-11). Though he acknowledges the symbolic meaning of these rituals, he insists on their literal interpretation.
The key emphasis in Philo’s philosophy is contrasting the spiritual life, understood as intellectual contemplation, with the mundane preoccupation with earthly concerns, either as an active life or as a search for pleasure. Philo disdained the material world and physical body (Spec. leg. 3.1-6). The body was for Philo as for Plato, “an evil and a dead thing” (LA 3.72-74; Gig. 15), wicked by nature and a plotter against the soul (LA 3.69). But it was a necessary evil, hence Philo does not advocate a complete abnegation from life. On the contrary he advocates fulfilling first the practical obligations toward men and the use of mundane possessions for the accomplishment of praiseworthy works (Fug. 23-28; Plant. 167-168). Similarly he considers pleasure indispensable and wealth useful, but for a virtuous man they are not a perfect good (LA 3.69-72). He believed that men should steer themselves away from the physical aspect of things gradually. Some people, like philosophers, may succeed in focusing their minds on the eternal realities. Philo believed that man’s final goal and ultimate bliss is in the “knowledge of the true and living God” (Decal. 81; Abr. 58; Praem. 14); “such knowledge is the boundary of happiness and blessedness” (Det. 86). To him, mystic vision allows our soul to see the Divine Logos (Ebr. 152) and achieve a union with God (Deut. 30:19-20; Post. 12). In a desire to validate the scripture as an inspired writing, he often compares it to prophetic ecstasy (Her. 69-70). His praise of the contemplative life of the monastic Therapeutae in Alexandria attests to his preference of bios theoreticos over bios practicos. He adheres to the Platonic picture of the souls descending into the material realm and that only the souls of philosophers are able to come to the surface and return to their realm in heaven (Gig. 12-15). Philo adopted the Platonic concept of the soul with its tripartite division. The rational part of the soul, however, is breathed into man as a part of God’s substance. Philo speaks figuratively “Now, when we are alive, we are so though our soul is dead and buried in our body, as if in a tomb. But if it were to die, then our soul would live according to its proper life being released from the evil and dead body to which it is bound” (Op. 67-69; LA 1.108).
Philo differentiated between philosophy and wisdom. To him philosophy is “the greatest good thing to men” (Op. 53-54), which they acquired because of a gift of reason from God (Op. 77). It is a devotion to wisdom, and a way to acquire the highest knowledge, “an attentive study of wisdom.” Wisdom in turn is “the knowledge of all divine and human things, and of the respective causes of them” that is, according to Philo, contained in the Torah (Congr. 79). Hence it follows that Moses, as the author of the Torah, “had reached the very summit of philosophy” and “had learnt from the oracles of God the most numerous and important of the principles of nature” (Op. 8). Moses was also the interpreter of nature (Her. 213). By saying this Philo wanted to indicate that human wisdom has two origins: one is divine, the other is natural (Her. 182). Moreover, that Mosaic Law is not inconsistent with nature. A single law, the Logos of nature governs the entire world (Jos. 28-31) and its law is imprinted on the human mind (Prob. 46-47). Because of this we have a conscience that affects even wicked persons (QG 4.62). Wisdom is a consummated philosophy and as such has to be in agreement with the principles of nature (Mos. 2.48; Abr. 16; Op. 143; Spec. leg. 2.13; 3.46-47, 112, 137; Virt. 18). The study of philosophy has as its end “life in accordance with nature” and following the “path of right reason” (Mig. 128). Philosophy prepares us to a moral life, i.e., “to live in conformity with nature” (Prob. 160). From this follows that life in accordance with nature hastens us towards virtues (Mos. 2. 181; Abr. 60, Spec. leg. 1.155), and an unjust man is the one “who transgresses the ordinances of nature” (Spec. leg. 4.204; Cf. Decal. 132; Virt. 131-132; Plant. 49; Ebr. 142; Agr. 66). Thus Philo does not discount human reason, but contrasts only the true doctrine which is trust in God with uncertain, plausible, and unreliable reasoning (LA 3.228-229).
Philo’s ethical doctrine is Stoic in its essence and includes the active effort to achieve virtue, the model of a sage to be followed, and practical advice concerning the achievement of the proper right reason and a proper emotional state of rational emotions (eupatheia). To Philo man is basically passive and it is God who sows noble qualities in the soul, thus we are instruments of God (LA 2.31-32; Cher. 127-128). Still man is the only creature endowed with freedom to act though his freedom is limited by the constitution of his mind. As such he is responsible for his action and “very properly receives blame for the offences which he designedly commits.” This is so because he received a faculty of voluntary motion and is free from the dominion of necessity (Deus 47-48). Philo advocates the practice of virtue in both the divine and the human spheres. Lovers only of God and lovers only of men are both incomplete in virtue. Philo advocates a middle harmonious way (Decal. 106-110; Spec. leg. 4. 102). He differentiates four virtues: wisdom, self-control, courage, and justice (LA 1.63-64). Human dispositions Philo divides into three groups – the best is given the vision of God, the next has a vision on the right i.e., the Beneficent or Creative Power whose name is God, and the third has a vision on the left, i.e., the Ruling Power called Lord (Abr. 119-130). Felicity is achieved in the culmination of three values: the spiritual, the corporeal, and the external (QG 3.16). Philo adopts the Stoic wise man as a model for human behavior. Such a wise man should imitate God who was impassible (apathes) hence the sage should achieve a state of apatheia, i.e., he should be free of irrational emotions (passions), pleasure, desire, sorrow, and fear, and should replace them by rational or well-reasoned emotions (eupatheia), joy, will, compunction, and caution. In such a state of eupatheia, the sage achieves a serene, stable, and joyful disposition in which he is directed by reason in his decisions (QG 2.57; Abr. 201-204; Fug. 166-167; Mig. 67). But at the same time Philo claims that the needs of the body should not be neglected and rejects the other extreme, i.e., the practice of austerities. Everything should be governed by reason, self-control, and moderation. Joy and pleasure do not have intrinsic values, but are by-products of virtue and characterize the sage (Fug. 25-34; Det. 124-125; LA 80).
Mysticism is a doctrine that maintains that one can gain knowledge of reality that is not accessible to sense perception or to reason. It is usually associated with some mental and physical training and in the theistic version it involves a sensation of closeness to or unity with God experienced as temporal and spatial transcendence. According to Philo, man’s highest union with God is limited to God’s manifestation as the Logos. It is similar to a later doctrine of intellectual contact of our human intellect with the transcendent intellect developed by Alexander of Aphrodisias and Ibn Rushd and different from the Plotinian doctrine of the absorption into the ineffable one. The notion of the utter transcendence of the First Principle probably goes back as far as Anaximander who postulated the Indefinite (apeiron) as this Principle (arche) and could be found in Plato’s concept of the Good, but the formulation is accredited to Speusippus, the successor of Plato in the Academy. Philo’s biblical tradition in which one could not name or describe God was the major factor in accepting the Greek Platonic concepts and emphasis on God’s transcendence. But this position is rather alien to biblical and rabbinical understanding. In the Bible, God is represented in a “material” and “physical” way. Philosophically, however, Philo differentiated between the existence of God, which could be demonstrated, and the nature of God which humans are not able to cognize. God’s essence is beyond any human experience or cognition, therefore it can be described only by stating what God is not (via negativa) or by depriving him of any attribute of sensible objects and putting God beyond any attribute applicable to a sensible world (via eminentiae) because God alone is a being whose existence is his essence (Det. 160). Philo states in many places that God’s essence is one and single, that he does not belong to any class or that there is in God any distinction of genus and species. Therefore, we cannot say anything about his qualities “For God is not only devoid of peculiar qualities, but he is likewise not of the form of man” (LA 1.36); he “is free from distinctive qualities” (LA 1.51; 3.36; Deus 55). Strictly speaking, we cannot make any positive or negative statements about God: “Who can venture to affirm that … he is a body, or that he is incorporeal, or that he has such and such distinctive qualities, or that he has no such qualities? … But he alone can utter a positive assertion respecting himself, since he alone has an accurate knowledge of his own nature” (LA 3.206). Moreover, since the essence of God is single, therefore its property must be one which Philo denotes as acting “Now it is an especial attribute of God to create, and this faculty it is impious to ascribe to any created being” (Cher. 77). The expression of this act of God, which is at the same time his thinking, is his Logos (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283). Though God is hidden, his reality is made manifest by the Logos that is God’s image (Somn. 1.239; Conf. 147-148) and by the sensible universe, which in turn is the image of the Logos, that is “the archetypal model, the idea of ideas” (Op. 25). Because of this we can perceive God’s existence, though we cannot fathom his essence. But there are degrees and levels to our cognizance of God. Those at the summit and the highest level may grasp the unity of the powers of God, at the lower level people recognize the Logos as the Regent Power, and those still at the lowest level, immersed in the sensible world are unable to perceive the intelligible reality (Fug. 94; Abr. 124-125). Steps in mystic experience involve a realization of human nothingness, a realization that the one who acts is God alone, and abandonment of our sense of perception (Her. 69-71; Plant. 64; Conf. 95; Ebr. 152). A mystic state will produce a sensation of tranquility, and stability; it appears suddenly and is described as a sober intoxication (Gig. 49; Sacr. 78; Somn. 1.71; Op. 70-71).
According to Philo the highest knowledge man may have is the knowledge of infinite reality which is not accessible by the normal senses, but by unmediated intuition of divinity. Humans were endowed with the mind, i.e., ability to reason and the outward senses. We received the first in order that we might consider the things that are discernable only by the intellect, the end of which is truth, and the second for the perception of visible things the end of which is opinion. Opinions are unstable, based on probability, and untrustworthy. Thus by this divine gift men are able to come to a conclusion about the existence of the divinity. They can do it in two ways: one is the apprehension of God through contemplation of his creation and forming a “conjectural conception of the Creator by a probable train of reasoning”(Praem. 43). And in the process the soul may climb the ladder to perfection by using natural means i.e., natural dispositions, instruction, i.e., being educated to virtue, or by meditation. The other is a direct apprehension by being instructed by God himself when the mind elevates itself above the physical world and perceives the uncreated One through a clear vision (Praem. 28-30, 40-66; LA 97-103). This vision is accessible to the “purified mind” to which God appears as One. To the mind uninitiated in the mysteries, unable to apprehend God alone by himself, but only through his actions, God appears as a triad constituted by him and his two powers, Creative and Royal (Abr. 97-103). Such a direct vision of God is not dependent on revelation but is possible because we have an impression of God in our mind, which is nothing but a tiny fragment of the Logos pervading the whole universe, not separated from its source, but only extended (Det. 90; Gig. 27; LA 1.37; Mut. 223; Spec. leg. 4.123). And we receive this portion of the Divine Mind at birth being endowed with a mind which makes us resemble God (Op. 65-69). At birth two powers enter every soul, the salutary (Beneficent) and the destructive (Unbounded). The world is created through these same powers. The creation is accomplished when ” the salutary and beneficent (power) brings to an end the unbounded and destructive nature.” Similarly, one or the other power may prevail in humans, but when the salutary power “brings to an end the unbounded and destructive nature” humans achieve immortality. Thus both the world and humans are a mixture of these powers and the prevailing one has the moral determination: “For the souls of foolish men have the unbounded and destructive rather than the powerful and salutary [power], and it is full of misery when it dwells with earthly creatures. But the prudent and noble [soul] receives the powerful and salutary [power] and, on the contrary, possesses in itself good fortune and happiness” (QE 1.23). Philo evidently analyzes these two powers on two levels. One is the divine level in which the Unlimited or the Unbounded is a representation of God’s infinite and immeasurable goodness and creativity. The Logos keeps it in balance through the Limit. The other level is the human one where the Unlimited or the Unbounded represents destruction and everything morally abhorrent. Human reason is able, however, to maintain in it some kind of balance. This mind, divine and immortal, is an additional and differentiating part of the human soul which animates man just like the souls of animals which are devoid of mind. The notion of God’s existence is thus imprinted in our mind that needs only some illumination to have a direct vision of God (Abr. 79-80; Det. 86-87; LA 1.38). Thus we can arrive at it through the dialectical reasoning as apprehension of the First Principle. Philo differentiates two modes for perceiving God, an inferential mode and a direct mode without mediation: “As long, therefore, as our mind still shines around and hovers around, pouring as it were a noontide light into the whole soul, we, being masters of ourselves, are not possessed by any extraneous influence” (Her. 264). Thus this direct mode is not in any way a type of inspiration or inspired prophecy; it is unlike “inspiration” when a “trance” or a “heaven-inflicted madness” seizes us and divine light sets as it happens “to the race of prophets” (Her. 265).
Philo attempts to bridge the Greek “scientific” or rational philosophy with the strictly mythical ideology of the Hebrew scriptures. As a basis for the “scientific” approach he uses the worldview presented by Plato in Timaeus which remained influential in Hellenistic times. The characteristic feature of the Greek scientific approach is the biological interpretation of the physical world in anthropocentric terms, in terms of purpose and function that may apply to biological and psychological realities but may not be applied to the physical world. Moreover, Philo operates often on two levels: the level of mythical Hebraic religious tradition and the level of philosophical speculation in the Greek tradition. Nevertheless, Philo attempts to harmonize the Mosaic and Platonic accounts of the generation of the world by interpreting the biblical story using Greek scientific categories and concepts. He elaborates a religious-philosophical worldview that became the foundation for the future Christian doctrine. Philo’s doctrine of creation is intertwined with his doctrine of God and it answers two crucial questions: 1. Was the world created ex nihilo or from primordial matter? 2. Was creation a temporal act or is it an eternal process?
Though Philo’s model of creation comes from Plato’s Timaeus, the direct agent of creation is not God himself (described in Plato as Demiurge, Maker, Artificer), but the Logos. Philo believes that the Logos is “the man of God” (Conf. 41) or the shadow of God that was used as an instrument and a pattern of all creation (LA 3.96). The Logos converted unqualified, unshaped preexistent matter, which Philo describes as “destitute of arrangement, of quality, of animation, of distinctive character and full of disorder and confusion,” (Op. 22) into four primordial elements:
For it is out of that essence that God created everything, without indeed touching it himself, for it was not lawful for the all-wise and all-blessed God to touch materials which were all misshapen and confused, but he created them by the agency of his incorporeal powers, of which the proper name is Ideas, which he so exerted that every genus received its proper form (LA 1.329).
According to Philo, Moses anticipated Plato by teaching that water, darkness, and chaos existed before the world came into being (Op. 22). Moses, having reached the philosophy summit, recognized that there are two fundamental principles of being, one, “an active cause, the intellect of the universe.” The other is passive, “inanimate and incapable of motion by any intrinsic power of its own” (Op. 8-9), matter, lifeless and motionless. But Philo is ambiguous in such statements as these: “God, who created all things, not only brought them all to light, but he has even created what before had no existence, not only being their maker, but also their founder” (Somn. 1.76; Op. 81); “God who created the whole universe out of things that had no previous existence…” (LA 3.10). It seems that Philo does not refer here to God’s creation of the visible world ex nihilo but to his creation of the intelligible Forms prior to the formation of the sensible world (Spec. leg. 1.328). Philo reasons that by analogy to the biblical version of the creation of man in the image of God, so the visible world as such must have been created in the image of its archetype present in the mind of God. “It is manifest also, that that archetypal seal, which we call that world which is perceptible only to the intellect, must itself be the archetypal model, the Idea of Ideas, the Logos of God” (Op. 25). In his doctrine of God Philo interprets the Logos, which is the Divine Mind as the Form of Forms (Platonic), the Idea of Ideas or the sum total of Forms or Ideas (Det. 75-76). The Logos is an indestructible Form of wisdom. Interpreting the garment of the high priest (Exod. 28:34; 36) Philo states: “But the seal is an Idea of Ideas, according to which God fashioned the world, being an incorporeal Idea, comprehensible only by the intellect” (Mig. 103). The invisible intelligible world which was used by the Logos as a model for creation or rather formation of the visible world from the (preexisting) unformed matter was created in the mind of God: “The incorporeal world then was already completed, having its seat in the Divine Logos and the world, perceptible by the external senses, was made on the model of it” (Op. 36). Describing Moses’ account of the creation of man, Philo states also that Moses calls the invisible Divine Logos the Image of God (Op. 24; 31; LA 1.9). Forms, though inapprehensible in essence, leave an impress and a copy and procure qualities and shapes to shapeless things and unorganized matter. Mind can grasp the Forms by longing for wisdom. “The desire for wisdom alone is continual and incessant, and it fills all its pupils and disciples with famous and most beautiful doctrines” (Spec. leg. 1-45-50). Creation thus took place from preexistent shapeless matter (Plato’s Receptacle) which is “the nurse of all becoming and change” and for this creation God used the Forms which are his powers (Spec. leg. 1.327-329). This may seem a controversial point whether the primordial matter was preexistent or was created ex nihilo. Philo’s view is not clearly stated and there are seemingly contradictory statements. In some places Philo states, “for as nothing is generated out of nothing, so neither can anything which exists be destroyed as to become non-existence” (Aet. 5-6). The same is repeated in his De Specialibus legibus: “Being made of us [i.e. elements] when you were born, you will again be dissolved into us when you come to die; for it is not the nature of any thing to be destroyed so as to become nonexistent, but the end brings it back to those elements from which its beginnings come” (Spec. 1.266). The resolution of this seeming controversy is to be found in Philo’s theory of eternal creation, which is described next in connection with the Logos as the agent of creation. Philo, being a strict monist, could not accept the existence of independent and eternal preexistent matter (however disorganized and chaotic) as Plato did.
Philo denies the Aristotelian conclusion coming, according to him, from the superficial observation that the world existed from eternity, independent of any creative act. “For some men, admiring the world itself rather than the Creator of the world, have represented it as existing without any maker, and eternal, and as impiously and falsely have represented God as existing in a state of complete inactivity” (Op. 7). He elaborates instead his theory of the eternal creation (Prov. 1.6-9), as did Proclus (410-485 C.E.) much later in interpreting Plato. Proclus brilliantly demonstrated that even in the theistic system the world though generated must be eternal, because the “world is always fabricated … is always becoming to be.” Proclus believed, as did Philo, that the corporeal world is always coming into existence but never possesses real being. Thus God, according to Philo, did not begin to create the world at a certain moment, but he is “eternally applying himself to its creation” (Prov. 1.7; Op. 7; Aet. 83-84).
But God is the creator of time also, for he is the father of his father, and the father of time is the world, which made its own mother the creation of time, so that time stands towards God in the relation of a grandson; for this world is a younger son of God, inasmuch as it is perceptible by the outward sense, for the only son he speaks of as older than the world, is Idea, and this is not perceptible by the intellect, but having thought the other worthy of the rights of primogeniture, he has decided that it should remain with him; therefore, this younger son, perceptible by the external senses being set in motion, has caused the nature of time to shine forth, and to become conspicuous, so that there is nothing future to God, who has the very boundaries of time subject to him; for their life is not time, but the beautiful model of eternity; and in eternity nothing is past and nothing is future, but everything is present only (Deus. 31-32).
Philo contends that God thinks simultaneously with his acting or creating. “For God while he spake the word, did at the same moment create; nor did he allow anything to come between the Logos and the deed; and if one may advance a doctrine which is pretty nearly true, His Logos is his deed” (Sacr. 65; Mos.1.283). Thus any description of creation in temporal terms, e.g., by Moses, is not to be taken literally, but rather is an accommodation to the biblical language (Op. 19; Mut. 27; LA 2.9-13):
God is continuously ordering matter by his thought. His thinking was not anterior to his creating and there never was a time when he did not create, the Ideas themselves having been with him from the beginning. For God’s will is not posterior to him, but is always with him, for natural motions never give out. Thus ever thinking he creates, and furnishes to sensible things the principle of their existence, so that both should exist together: the ever-creating Divine Mind and the sense-perceptible things to which beginning of being is given (Prov. 1.7).
Thus Philo postulates a crucial modification to the Platonic doctrine of the Forms, namely that God himself eternally creates the intelligible world of Ideas as his thoughts. The intelligible Forms are thus the principle of existence to the sensible things which are given through them their existence. This simply means in mystical terms that nothing exists or acts except God. On this ideal model God then orders and shapes the formless matter through the agency of his Logos (Her. 134, 140) into the objects of the sensible world:
Now we must form a somewhat similar opinion of God [Philo makes an analogy to a plan of the city in the mind of its builder], who, having determined to found a mighty state, first of all conceived its form in his mind, according to which form he made a world perceptible only by the intellect, and then completed one visible to the external senses, using the first one as a model (Op. 19).
Philo claims a scriptural support for these metaphysics saying that the creation of the world was after the pattern of an intelligible world (Gen. 1:17) which served as its model. During the first day God created Ideas or Forms of heaven, earth, air (= darkness), empty space (= abyss), water, pneuma (= mind), light, the intelligible pattern of the sun and the stars (Op. 29). There are, however, differences between Philo and Plato: according to Plato, there is no Form of space (chora). In Plato space is not apprehended by reason; rather it had its own special status in the world. Also pneuma as a Form of soul does not exist in the system of Plato. Plato designates this primordial unorganized state of matter a self-existing Receptacle; it is most stable and a permanent constituent: “It must be called always the same, for it never departs at all from its own character” (Plato, Timaeus 50b-c). Philo, being a strict monist could not allow even for a self-existing void so he makes its pattern an eternal idea in the divine mind. Before Philo there was no explicit theory of creation ex nihilo ever postulated in Jewish or Greek traditions. Both Philo and Plato do not explain how the reflections (eidola) of Forms are made in the world of senses. They do not attribute them to God or the Demiurge because it would be contrary to their conception of God as “good” and “desiring that all things should come as near as possible to being like himself.” God could not create the copies of the Forms which should be “disordered.” It seems then that the primordial unorganized matter was spontaneously produced on the pattern of the Ideas. The Logos would shape the elements from this preexistent matter, first into heavy (or dense) and light (or rare) elements which were differentiated properly into water and earth, and air and fire (Her. 134-140; 143). As in Plato certain geometrical descriptions characterize Philo’s elements. Fire was characterized by a pyramid, air by an octahedron, water by an icosahedron, and earth by a cube (QG 3.49). In Plato’s theory too, one can envision a sort of automatic reflection of the Forms in the Receptacle due to the properties of Forms. God could not, according to Philo’s philosophy, create the preexistent matter. “And what God praised was not the materials which he had worked up in creation, destitute of life and melody, and easily dissolved, and moreover in their own intrinsic nature perishable, and out of proportion and full of iniquity, but rather his own skillful work, completed according to one equal and well-proportioned power and knowledge always alike and identical.” (Her. 160). Logically, God is for Philo indirectly the source of preexistent matter but Philo does not ascribe to God even the shaping of matter directly. In fact this unorganized matter never existed because it was simultaneously ordered into organized matter – the four elements from which the world is made.
Closely connected with Philo’s doctrine of creation is his doctrine of miracles. His favorite statement is that “everything is possible with God.” This, however, does not mean that God can act outside the natural order of things or his own nature. Thus Philo emphasizes that God’s miraculous works are within the realm of the natural order. Doing this he extends the natural order to encompass the biblical miracles and tries to explain them by their coincidence with natural events. For example, the miracle at the Red Sea which he characterizes as a “mighty work of nature” (Mos. 1.165), or the plague of darkness as a total eclipse (Mos. 1.123), or the story of Balaam as an allegorical one (Cher. 32-35). This was the tendency inherited from some Stoics who attempted to explain miracles of divination as events preordered in nature by the divine power pervading it. Similarly Philo considers the biblical miracles as a part of the eternal pattern of the Logos acting in nature. Augustine considers miracles as implanted in the destiny of the cosmos since the time of its creation. Philo and rabbinic literature emphasize the miraculous and marvelous character of nature itself. All natural things are wonderful, but are “despised by us by reason of our familiarity with them” and all things with which we are unaccustomed, make an impression on us “for the love of novelty”(Mos. 1.2-213). Even in modern Jewish teaching there is a tendency to explain the miraculous by the natural. Thus the one can find a certain discrepancy in Philo’s writing: on one hand Philo is rationalist and naturalist in the spirit of Greek philosophical tradition, on the other, he follows popular religion to preserve the biblical tradition. Philo emphasizes, however, that we are limited in our human capabilities to “comprehend everything” about the physical world, and it is better to “suspend our judgment” than to err:
But since we are found to be influenced in different manners by the same things at different times, we should have nothing positive to assert about anything, inasmuch as what appears has no settled or stationary existence, but is subject to various, and multiform, and ever-recurring changes. For it follows of necessity, since the imagination is unstable, that judgment formed by it must be unstable; and there are many reasons for this (Ebr. 170).
But we are able to comprehend things by comparing them with their opposites and thus arriving at their true nature. The same applies to what is virtue and to what is vice, and to what is just and good and to what is unjust and bad.
And, indeed, if any one considers everything that is in the world, he will be able to arrive at a proper estimate of its character, by taking it in the same manner; for each separate thing is by itself incomprehensible, but by a comparison with another thing, is easy to understand (Ebr. 187).
The same reasoning he extends to differences between national customs and ancient laws which vary according to countries, nations, cities, different villages, even private houses and instruction received by people from childhood.
And since this is the case, who is foolish enough and ridiculous as to affirm positively that such and such a thing is just, or wise, or honorable, or expedient? For whatever this man defines as such, some one else, who from his childhood has learnt a contrary lesson, will be sure to deny (Ebr. 197).
The pivotal and the most developed doctrine in Philo’s writings on which hinges his entire philosophical system, is his doctrine of the Logos. By developing this doctrine he fused Greek philosophical concepts with Hebrew religious thought and provided the foundation for Christianity, first in the development of the Christian Pauline myth and speculations of John, later in the Hellenistic Christian Logos and Gnostic doctrines of the second century. All other doctrines of Philo hinge on his interpretation of divine existence and action. The term Logos was widely used in the Greco-Roman culture and in Judaism. Through most schools of Greek philosophy, this term was used to designate a rational, intelligent and thus vivifying principle of the universe. This principle was deduced from an understanding of the universe as a living reality and by comparing it to a living creature. Ancient people did not have the dynamic concept of “function,” therefore, every phenomenon had to have an underlying factor, agent, or principle responsible for its occurrence. In the Septuagint version of the Old Testament the term logos (Hebrew davar) was used frequently to describe God’s utterances (Gen. 1:3, 6,9; 3:9,11; Ps. 32:9), God’s action (Zech. 5:1-4; Ps. 106:20; Ps. 147:15), and messages of prophets by means of which God communicated his will to his people (Jer. 1:4-19, 2:1-7; Ezek. 1:3; Amos 3:1). Logos is used here only as a figure of speech designating God’s activity or action. In the so-called Jewish wisdom literature we find the concept of Wisdom (hokhmah and sophia) which could be to some degree interpreted as a separate personification or individualization (hypostatization), but it is contrasted often with human stupidity. In the Hebrew culture it was a part of the metaphorical and poetic language describing divine wisdom as God’s attribute and it clearly refers to a human characteristic in the context of human earthly existence. The Greek, metaphysical concept of the Logos is in sharp contrast to the concept of a personal God described in anthropomorphic terms typical of Hebrew thought. Philo made a synthesis of the two systems and attempted to explain Hebrew thought in terms of Greek philosophy by introducing the Stoic concept of the Logos into Judaism. In the process the Logos became transformed from a metaphysical entity into an extension of a divine and transcendental anthropomorphic being and mediator between God and men. Philo offered various descriptions of the Logos.
Following the Jewish mythical tradition, Philo represents the Logos as the utterance of God found in the Jewish scripture of the Old Testament since God’s words do not differ from his actions (Sacr. 8; Somn. 1.182; Op. 13).
Philo accepts the Platonic intelligible Forms. Forms exist forever though the impressions they make may perish with the substance on which they were made (Det. 75-77; Mut. 80, 122. 146; Cher. 51). They are not, however, beings existing separately, only exist in the mind of God as his thoughts and powers. Philo explicitly identifies Forms with God’s powers. Those powers are his glory, though invisible and sensed only by the purest intellect. “And though they are by nature inapprehensible in their essence, still they show a kind of impression or copy of their energy and operation”(Spec. leg. 1.45-50). In his doctrine of God Philo interprets the Logos, which is the Divine Mind, as the Form of Forms (Platonic), the Idea of Ideas or the sum total of Forms or Ideas. Logos is the indestructible Form of wisdom comprehensible only by the intellect (Det. 75-76; Mig. 103).
The Logos which God begat eternally because it is a manifestation of God’s thinking-acting (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283), is an agent that unites two powers of the transcendent God. Philo relates that in an inspiration his own soul told him:
…that in the one living and true God there were two supreme and primary powers, Goodness [or Creative Power] and Authority [or Regent Power]; and that by his Goodness he had created every thing; and that by his Authority he governed all that he had created; and that the third thing which was between the two, and had the effect of bringing them together was the Logos, for it was owing to the Logos that God was both a ruler and good (Cher. 1.27-28).
And further, Philo finds in the Bible indications of the operation of the Logos, e.g., the biblical cherubim are the symbols of the two powers of God but the flaming sword (Gen. 3.24) is the symbol of the Logos conceived before all things and before all manifest (Cher. 1.27-28; Sacr. 59; Abr. 124-125; Her. 166; QE 2.68). Philo’s description of the Logos (the Mind of God) corresponds to the Greek concept of mind as hot and fiery. Philo obviously refers in these powers to the Unlimited (apeiron) and the Limited (peras) of Plato’s Philebus and earlier Pythagorean tradition, and they will later reappear in Plotinus as Nous. In Plato these two principles or powers operate at the metaphysical, cosmic (cosmic soul) and human (human soul) levels. Philo considers these powers to be inherent in transcendental God, and that God himself may be thought of as multiplicity in unity. The Beneficent (Creative) and Regent (Authoritative) Powers are called God and Lord, respectively. Goodness is Boundless Power, Creative, and God. The Regent Power is also Punitive Power and Lord (Her. 166). Creative Power, moreover, permeates the world, the power by which God made and ordered all things. Philo follows the ideas of the Stoics that nous pervades every part of the universe as it does the soul in us. Therefore, Philo asserts that the aspect of God which transcends his powers (which we have to understand to be the Logos) cannot be conceived of in terms of place but as pure being, “but that power of his by which he made and ordered all things called God, in accordance with the etymology of that name, enfolds the whole and passes through the parts of the universe” (Conf. 136-137). According to Philo, the two powers of God are separated by God himself who is standing above in the midst of them (Her. 166). Referring to Genesis 18: 2 Philo claims that God and his two Powers are in reality one. To the human mind they appear as a Triad, with God above the powers that belong to him: “For this cannot be so keen of spirit that, it can see Him who is above the powers that belong to Him, (namely) God, distinct from everything else. For so soon as one sets eyes on God, there also appear together with His being, the ministering powers, so that in place of one he makes the appearance of a triad (QG 4.2).” In addition to these two main powers, there are other powers of the Father and his Logos, including merciful and legislative (Fug. 94-95).
The Logos has an origin, but as God’s thought it also has eternal generation. It exists as such before everything else all of which are secondary products of God’s thought and therefore it is called the “first-born.” The Logos is thus more than a quality, power, or characteristic of God; it is an entity eternally generated as an extension, to which Philo ascribes many names and functions. The Logos is the first-begotten Son of the Uncreated Father: “For the Father of the universe has caused him to spring up as the eldest son, whom, in another passage, he [Moses] calls the first-born; and he who is thus born, imitating the ways of his father, has formed such and such species, looking to his archetypal patterns” (Conf. 63). This picture is somewhat confusing because we learn that in the final analysis the Creative Power is also identified with the Logos. The Creative Power is logically prior to the Regent Power since it is conceptually older. Though the powers are of equal age, the creative is prior because one is king not of the nonexistent but of what has already come into being (QE 2.62). These two powers thus delimit the bounds of heaven and the world. The Creative Power is concerned that things that come into being through it should not be dissolved, and the Regent Power that nothing either exceeds or is robbed of its due, all being arbitrated by the laws of equality through which things continue eternally (QE 2.64). The positive properties of God may be subdivided into these two polar forces; therefore, the expression of the One is the Logos that constitutes the manifestation of God’s thinking, acting (Prov. 1.7; Sacr. 65; Mos. 1.283). According to Philo these powers of the Logos can be grasped at various levels. Those who are at the summit level grasp them as constituting an indivisible unity. At the two lower levels, respectively, are those who know the Logos as the Creative Power and beneath them those who know it as the Regent Power (Fug. 94-95; Abr. 124-125). The next level down represents those limited to the sensible world, unable to perceive the intelligible realities (Gig. 20). At each successively lower level of divine knowledge the image of God’s essence is increasingly more obscured. These two powers will appear again in Plotinus. Here Undefined or Unlimited Intelligible Matter proceeds from the One and then turns back to its source (Enneads 2.4.5; 5.4.2; 6.7.17)
The Logos is the bond holding together all the parts of the world. And as a part of the human soul it holds the body together and permits its operation. In the mind of a wise man thoroughly purified, it allows preservation of virtues in an unimpaired condition (Fug. 112). “And the Logos, which connects together and fastens every thing, is peculiarly full itself of itself, having no need whatever of any thing beyond” (Her. 188).
The reasoning capacity of a human mind is but a portion of the all-pervading Divine Logos. Mind is a special gift to humans from God and it has divine essence, therefore, as such, it is imperishable. By receiving this humans received freedom and the power of spontaneous will free from necessity (Deus. 47). Philo emphasizes that man “has received this one extraordinary gift, intellect, which is accustomed to comprehend the nature of all bodies and of all things at the same time.” Thus humanity resembles God in the sense of having free volition for unlike plants and other animals, the soul of man received from God the power of voluntary motion and in this respect resembles God (Deus. 48). This concept, that it is chiefly in the intellect and free volition that makes humans differ from other life forms, has a long history which can be traced to Anaxagoras and Aristotle. Philo calls “men of God” those people who made God-inspired intellectual life their dominant issue. Such men “have entirely transcended the sensible sphere, and migrated to the intelligible world, and dwell there enrolled as citizens of the Commonwealth of Ideas, which are imperishable, and incorporeal … those who are born of God are priests and prophets who have not thought fit to mix themselves up in the constitutions of this world….”(Gig. 61). Philo writes in reference to the Old Testament expression that God “breathed into” (equivalent of “inspired” or “gave life to”) inanimate things that through this act God extended his spirit into humans (LA 1.37). Though his spirit is distributed among men it is not diminished (Gig. 27). The nature of the reasoning power in men is indivisible from the Divine Logos, but “though they are indivisible themselves, they divide an innumerable multitude of other things.” Just as the Divine Logos divided and distributed everything in nature (that is, it gave qualities to undifferentiated, primordial matter), so the human mind by exertion of its intellect is able to divide everything and everybody into an infinite number of parts. And this is possible because it resembles the Logos of the Creator and Father of the universe: “So that, very naturally, the two things which thus resemble each other, both the mind which is in us and that which is above us, being without parts and invisible, will still be able in a powerful manner to divide and distribute [comprehend] all existing things” (Her. 234-236; Det. 90). Uninitiated minds are unable to apprehend the Existent by itself; they only perceive it through its actions. To them God appears as a Triad — himself and his two Powers: Creative and Ruling. To the “purified soul,” however, God appears as One.
When, therefore, the soul is shone upon by God as if at noonday, and when it is wholly and entirely filled with that light which is appreciable only by the intellect, and by being wholly surrounded with its brilliancy is free from all shackle or darkness, it then perceives a threefold image of one subject, one image of the living God, and others of the other two, as if they were shadows irradiated by it …. but he claims that the term shadow is just a more vivid representation of the matter intended to be intimated. Since this is not the actual truth, but in order that one may when speaking keep as close to the truth as possible, the one in the middle is the Father of the universe, who in the sacred scripture is called by his proper name, I am that I am; and the beings on each side are those most ancient powers which are always close to the living God, one of which is called his Creative Power, and the other his Royal Power. And the Creative Power is God, for it is by this that he made and arranged the universe; and the Royal Power is the Lord, for it is fitting that the Creator should lord it over and govern the creature. Therefore, the middle person of the three, being attended by each of his powers as by body-guard, presents to the mind, which is endowed with the faculty of sight, a vision at one time of one being, and at another time of three; of one when the soul being completely purified, and having surmounted not only the multitude of numbers, but also the number two, which is the neighbour of the unit, hastens onward to that idea which is devoid of mixture, free from all combination, and by itself in need of nothing else whatever; and of three, when, not being as yet made perfect as to the important virtues, it is still seeking for initiation in those of less consequence, and is not able to attain to a comprehension of the living God by its own unassisted faculties without the aid of something else, but can only do so by judging of his deeds, whether as creator or as governor. This then, as they say, is the second best thing; and it no less partakes in the opinion which is dear to and devoted to God. But the first-mentioned disposition has no such share, but is itself the very God-loving and God-beloved opinion itself, or rather it is truth which is older than opinion, and more valuable than any seeming (Abr. 119-123).
The one category of enlightened people is able to comprehend God through a vision beyond the physical universe. It is as though they advanced on a heavenly ladder and conjectured the existence of God through an inference (Praem. 40). The other category apprehends him through himself, as light is seen by light. For God gave man such a perception “as should prove to him that God exists, and not to show him what God is.” Philo believes that even the existence of God “cannot possibly be contemplated by any other being; because, in fact, it is not possible for God to be comprehended by any being but himself ” (Praem. 39-40). Philo adds, “Only men who have raised themselves upward from below, so as, through the contemplation of his works, to form a conjectural conception of the Creator by a probable train of reasoning” (Praem. 43) are holy, and are his servants. Next Philo explains how such men have an impression of God’s existence as revealed by God himself, by the similitude of the sun (Mut. 4-6) a concept which he borrowed from Plato. As light is seen in consequence of its own presence so, “In the same manner God, being his own light, is perceived by himself alone, nothing and no other being co-operating with or assisting him, a being at all able to contribute to pure comprehension of his existence; But these men have arrived at the real truth, who form their ideas of God from God, of light from light” (Praem. 45-46). As Plato and Philo had done, Plotinus later used this image of the sun. Thus the Logos, eternally created (begotten), is an expression of the immanent powers of God, and at the same time, it emanates into everything in the world.
In certain places in his writings Philo accepts the Stoic theory of the immanent Logos as the power or Law binding the opposites in the universe and mediating between them, and directing the world. For example, Philo envisions that the world is suspended in a vacuum and asks, how is it that the world does not fall down since it is not held by any solid thing. Philo then gives the answer that the Logos extending himself from the center to its bounds and from its extremities to the center again, runs nature’s course joining and binding fast all its parts. Likewise the Logos prevents the earth from being dissolved by all the water contained within. The Logos produces a harmony (a favorite expression of the Stoics) between various parts of the universe (Plant. 8-10). Thus Philo sees God as only indirectly the Creator of the world: God is the author of the invisible, intelligible world which served as a model for the Logos. Philo says Moses called this archetypal heavenly power by various names: “the beginning, the image, and the sight of God”(LA 1.43). Following the views of Plato and the Stoics, Philo believed that in all existing things there must be an active cause, and a passive subject; and that the active cause Philo designates as the Logos. He gives the impression that he believed that the Logos functions like the Platonic “Soul of the World” (Aet. 84).
Philo describes the Logos as the revealer of God symbolized in the Scripture (Gen. 31:13; 16:8; etc) by an angel of the Lord (Somn. 1.228-239; Cher. 1-3). The Logos is the first-born and the eldest and chief of the angels.
Philo’s Logos has many names (Conf. 146). Philo identifies his Logos with Wisdom of Proverbs 8:22 (Ebr. 31). Moreover, Moses, according to Philo called this Wisdom “Beginning,” “Image,” “Sight of God.” And his personal wisdom is an imitation of the archetypal Divine Wisdom. All terrestrial wisdom and virtue are but copies and representations of the heavenly Logos (LA 1.43, 45-46).
God sends “the stream” from his Wisdom which irrigates God-loving souls; consequently they become filled with “manna.” Manna is described by Philo as a “generic thing” coming from God. It does not come from God directly, however: “the most generic is God, and next is the Logos of God, the other things subsist in word (Logos) only” (LA 2.86). According to Philo, Moses called manna “the most ancient Logos of God (Det. 118).” Next Philo explains that men are “nourished by the whole word (Logos) of God, and by every portion of it … Accordingly, the soul of the more perfect man is nourished by the whole word (Logos); but we must be contented if we are nourished by a portion of it” (LA 3.175-176). And “the Wisdom of God, which is the nurse and foster-mother and educator of those who desire incorruptible food … immediately supplies food to those which are brought forth by her … but the fountain of divine wisdom is borne along, at one time in a more gentle and moderate stream, and at another with greater rapidity and a more exceeding violence and impetuosity….(Det. 115-117). This Wisdom as the Daughter of God “has obtained a nature intact and undefiled both because of her own propriety and the dignity of him who begot her.” Having identified the Logos with Wisdom, Philo runs into a grammatical problem: in the Greek language “wisdom” (sophia) is feminine and “word” (logos) is masculine; moreover, Philo saw Wisdom’s function as masculine. So he explains that Wisdom’s name is feminine, but her nature is masculine:
Indeed all the virtues have women’s designations, but powers and activities of truly perfect men. For that which comes after God, even if it were the most venerable of all other things, holds second place, and was called feminine in contrast to the Creator of the universe, who is masculine, and in accordance with its resemblance to everything else. For the feminine always falls short and is inferior to the masculine, which has priority. Let us then pay no attention to the discrepancy in the terms, and say that the daughter of God, Wisdom, is both masculine and the father, inseminating and engendering in souls a desire to learn discipline, knowledge, practical insight, notable and laudable actions (Fug. 50-52).
The fundamental doctrine propounded by Philo is that of Logos as an intermediary power, a messenger and mediator between God and the world.
And the father who created the universe has given to his archangel and most ancient Logos a pre-eminent gift, to stand on the confines of both, and separate that which had been created from the Creator. And this same Logos is continually a suppliant to the immortal God on behalf of the mortal race, which is exposed to affliction and misery; and is also the ambassador, sent by the Ruler of all, to the subject race. And the Logos rejoices…. saying “And I stood in the midst, between the Lord and you” (Num. 16:48); neither being uncreated as God, nor yet created as you, but being in the midst between these two extremities, like a hostage, as it were, to both parties (Her. 205-206).
When speaking of the high priest, Philo describes the Logos as God’s son, a perfect being procuring forgiveness of sins and blessings: “For it was indispensable that the man who was consecrated to the Father of the world [the high priest] should have as a paraclete, his son, the being most perfect in all virtue, to procure forgiveness of sins, and a supply of unlimited blessings” (Mos. 2.134). Philo transforms the Stoic impersonal and immanent Logos into a being who was neither eternal like God nor created like creatures, but begotten from eternity. This being is a mediator giving hope to men and who “was sent down to earth.” God, according to Philo, sends “the stream of his own wisdom” to men “and causes the changed soul to drink of unchangeable health; for the abrupt rock is the wisdom of God, which being both sublime and the first of things he quarried out of his own powers.” After the souls are watered they are filled with the manna which “is called something which is the primary genus of everything. But the most universal of all things is God; and in the second place is the Logos of God”(LA 2.86). Through the Logos of God men learn all kinds of instruction and everlasting wisdom (Fug. 127-120). The Logos is the “cupbearer of God … being itself in an unmixed state, the pure delight and sweetness, and pouring forth and joy, and ambrosial medicine of pleasure and happiness” (Somn. 2.249). This wisdom was represented by the tabernacle of the Old Testament which was “a thing made after the model and in imitation of Wisdom” and sent down to earth “in the midst of our impurity in order that we may have something whereby we may be purified, washing off and cleansing all those things which dirty and defile our miserable life, full of all evil reputation as it is” (Her. 112-113). “God therefore sows and implants terrestrial virtue in the human race, being an imitation and representation of the heavenly virtue” (LA 1.45).
In three passages Philo describes the Logos even as God:
a.) Commenting on Genesis 22:16 Philo explains that God could only swear by himself (LA 3.207).
b.) When the scripture uses the Greek term for God ho theos, it refers to the true God, but when it uses the term theos, without the article ho, it refers not to the God, but to his most ancient Logos (Somn. 1.229-230).
c.) Commenting on Genesis 9:6 Philo states the reference to creation of man after the image of God is to the second deity, the Divine Logos of the Supreme being and to the father himself, because it is only fitting that the rational soul of man cannot be in relation to the preeminent and transcendent Divinity (QG 2.62).
Philo himself, however, explains that to call the Logos “God” is not a correct appellation (Somn.1.230). Also, through this Logos, which men share with God, men know God and are able to perceive Him (LA 1.37-38).
Philo’s doctrine of the Logos is blurred by his mystical and religious vision, but his Logos is clearly the second individual in one God as a hypostatization of God’s Creative Power – Wisdom. The supreme being is God and the next is Wisdom or the Logos of God (Op. 24). Logos has many names as did Zeus (LA 1.43,45,46), and multiple functions. Earthly wisdom is but a copy of this celestial Wisdom. It was represented in historical times by the tabernacle through which God sent an image of divine excellence as a representation and copy of Wisdom (Lev. 16:16; Her. 112-113). The Divine Logos never mixes with the things which are created and thus destined to perish, but attends the One alone. This Logos is apportioned into an infinite number of parts in humans, thus we impart the Divine Logos. As a result we acquire some likeness to the Father and the Creator of all (Her. 234-236). The Logos is the Bond of the universe and mediator extended in nature. The Father eternally begat the Logos and constituted it as an unbreakable bond of the universe that produces harmony (Plant. 9-10). The Logos, mediating between God and the world, is neither uncreated as God nor created as men. So in Philo’s view the Father is the Supreme Being and the Logos, as his chief messenger, stands between Creator and creature. The Logos is an ambassador and suppliant, neither unbegotten nor begotten as are sensible things (Her. 205). Wisdom, the Daughter of God, is in reality masculine because powers have truly masculine descriptions, whereas virtues are feminine. That which is in the second place after the masculine Creator was called feminine, according to Philo, but her priority is masculine; so the Wisdom of God is both masculine and feminine (Fug. 50-52). Wisdom flows from the Divine Logos (Fug. 137-138). The Logos is the Cupbearer of God. He pours himself into happy souls (Somn. 2.249). The immortal part of the soul comes from the divine breath of the Father/Ruler as a part of his Logos.
Abr. De Abrahamo;
Aet. De Aeternitate Mundi;
Agr. De Agricultura;
Anim. De Animalibus;
Cher. De Cherubim;
Conf. De Confusione Linguarum;
Congr. De Congressu Eruditionis Gratia;
Cont. De Vita Contemplativa;
Decal. De Decalogo;
Det. Quod Deterius Potiori Insidiari Soleat;
Deus. Quod Deus Sit Immutabilis;
Ebr. De Ebrietate;
Flac. In Flaccum;
Fug. De Fuga et Inventione;
Gig. De Gigantibus;
Her. Quis Rerum Divinarum Heres Sit;
Jos. De Josepho;
LA Legum Allegoriarum;
Legat. Legatio ad Gaium;
Mig. De Migratione Abrahami;
Mut. De Mutatione Nominum;
Op. De Opificio Mundi;
Plant. De Plantatione;
Post. De Posteritate Caini;
Praem. De Praemiis et Poenis;
Prob. Quod Omnis Probus Liber Sit;
Prov. De Providentia;
QE Quaestiones et Solutiones in Exodum;
QG Quaestiones et Solutiones in Genesim;
Sacr. De Sacrificiis Abelis et Caini;
Sobr. De Sobrietate;
Somn. De Somniis;
Spec. leg. De Specialibus Legibus;
Virt. De Virtutibus.
The Greek texts of Philo’s works:
- Philonis Judaei Opera Omnia. Textus editus ad fidem optimarum editionum. (Lipsiae: Sumptibus E.B. Schwickerti, 1828-1829), Vol. 1-6.
- Philonis Alexandrini Opera Quae Supersunt. Ediderunt Leopoldus Cohn et Paulus Wendland (Berolini: Typis et impensis Georgii Reimeri/ Walther de Gruyter & Co., MDCCCLXXXXVI – MCMXXX, reprinted in 1962). Vols. 1-7.
The Armenian text and its English translation:
- A. Terian, Philonis Alexandrini De Animalibus: The Armenian Text with an Introduction, Translation, and Commentary. Studies in Hellenistic Judaism, Supplements to Studia Philonica 1. (Chico: Scholars Press, 1981).
Translations of complete works:
- The Works of Philo. Complete and Unabridged. Translated by Charles Duke Yonge, New Updated Edition. (Hedrickson Publishers, 1995).
- F. H. Colson and G. H. Whitaker, eds., The Works of Philo (Cambridge, Mass: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann, 1929-1953), Vols. 1-10. Ralph Marcus, ed, Vols 10-12, containing works of Philo available only in Armenian.
Selections of works of Philo in translation:
- Philo, Selections ed., Hans Lewy in Three Jewish Philosophers (Cleveland, New York, Philadelphia, 1961).
- Philo of Alexandria, The Contemplative Life, The Giants, and Selections. Translation and Introduction by David Winston. Preface by John Dillon. (New York/ Ramsey/Toronto: Paulist Press, 1981).
- Ronald Williamson, Jews in the Hellenistic World: Philo (Cambridge: Cambridge
University Press, 1989).
- T. H. Billings, The Platonism of Philo Judaeus (Chicago, 1919).
- H. A. Wolfson, Philo (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1947), Vols 1-2.
- C. H. Dodd, The Interpretation of the Fourth Gospel (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1963).
- Ronald Williamson, Philo and the Epistle to the Hebrews (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1970).
- R. C. Baer, Philo’s Use of the Categories Male and Female (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1970).
- S. Sandmel, Philo of Alexandria: An Introduction (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979).
- Harold W. Attridge, The Epistle to the Hebrews (Hermeneia; Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1989).
- Dorothy Sly, Philo’s Perception of Women (Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1990).
- Ross Shepard Kraemer, Her Share of the Blessings: Women’s religions among Pagans, Jews, and Christians in the Greco-Roman World (NewYork /Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992).
- John M. Dillon, The Middle Platonists (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1977, 1996).
Center for Philosophy and Socinian Studies