Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888—1975)
As an academic, philosopher, and statesman, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) was one of the most recognized and influential Indian thinkers in academic circles in the 20th century. Throughout his life and extensive writing career, Radhakrishnan sought to define, defend, and promulgate his religion, a religion he variously identified as Hinduism, Vedanta, and the religion of the Spirit. He sought to demonstrate that his Hinduism was both philosophically coherent and ethically viable. Radhakrishnan’s concern for experience and his extensive knowledge of the Western philosophical and literary traditions has earned him the reputation of being a bridge-builder between India and the West. He often appears to feel at home in the Indian as well as the Western philosophical contexts, and draws from both Western and Indian sources throughout his writing. Because of this, Radhakrishnan has been held up in academic circles as a representative of Hinduism to the West. His lengthy writing career and his many published works have been influential in shaping the West’s understanding of Hinduism, India, and the East.
Table of Contents
- Biography and Context
- Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan
- Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience
- Religious Pluralism
- Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism
- Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics
- List of Abbreviations
- References and Further Reading
Rather little detail is known of Radhakrishnan’s earliest childhood and education. Radhakrishnan rarely spoke about his personal life, and what he does reveal comes to us after several decades of reflection. Radhakrishnan was born in Tirutani, Andhra Pradesh into a brahmin family, likely smarta in religious orientation. Predominantly Hindu, Tirutani was a temple town and popular pilgrimage center, and Radhakrishnan’s family were active participants in the devotional activities there. The implicit acceptance of Śaṅkara’s Advaita by the smarta tradition is good evidence to suggest that an advaitic framework was an important, though latent, feature of Radhakrishnan’s early philosophical and religious sensibilities.
In 1896, Radhakrishnan was sent to school in the nearby pilgrimage center of Tirupati, a town with a distinctively cosmopolitan flavor, drawing bhaktas from all parts of India. For four years, Radhakrishnan attended the Hermannsburg Evangelical Lutheran Missionary school. It was there that the young Radhakrishnan first encountered non-Hindu missionaries and 19th century Christian theology with its impulse toward personal religious experience. The theology taught in the missionary school may have found resonance with the highly devotional activities connected with the nearby Tirumala temple, activities that Radhakrishnan undoubtedly would have witnessed taking place outside the school. The shared emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to Radhakrishnan a common link between the religion of the missionaries and the religion practiced at the nearby Tirumala temple.
Between 1900 and 1904, Radhakrishnan attended Elizabeth Rodman Voorhees College in Vellore, a school run by the American Arcot Mission of the Reformed Church in America. The mandate of the Mission was to preach the gospel, to publish vernacular tracts, and to educate the “heathen” masses. It was here, as Robert Minor points out, that Radhakrishnan was “introduced to the Dutch Reform Theology, which emphasized a righteous God, unconditional grace, and election, and which criticized Hinduism as intellectually incoherent and ethically unsound.” At the same time, the Mission demonstrated an active concern for education, health care, and social uplift through its participation in famine relief, the establishment of hospitals, and education for all irrespective of social status. Such activities were not inconsistent with the mandate of the Mission as they often served as incentives for conversion. In was in this atmosphere that Radhakrishnan encountered what would have appeared to him as crippling assaults on his Hindu sensibilities. He also would have witnessed the positive contributions of the social programs undertaken by the Mission in the name of propagation of the Christian gospel.
Thus, Radhakrishnan inherited from his upbringing a tacit acceptance of Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedanta and an awareness of the centrality of devotional practices associated with the smarta tradition. His experiences at Tirupati brought him into contact with Lutheran Christian missionaries whose theological emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to him a common ground between Christianity and his own religious heritage. In Vellore, the presence of a systematic social gospel was intimately bound up with the religion of those who sought to censure Radhakrishnan’s cultural norms and religious worldview.
Radhakrishnan was married to his wife of over 50 years, Sivakamuamma, in 1904 while living in Vellore. The couple went on to have six children: five daughters and a son.
It is in this historical and hermeneutic contexts and with these experiences informing his worldview that Radhakrishnan encountered a resurgent Hinduism. Specifically, Radhakrishnan encountered the writings of Swami Vivekananda and V.D. Savarkar’s The First War of Indian Independence. The Theosophical Society was also active in the South Arcot area at this time. The Theosophists not only applauded the ancient wisdom they claimed to have found in India, but were persistent advocates of a philosophical, spiritual, and scientific meeting of East and West. Moreover, the Society’s role in the Indian nationalist movement is evidenced by Annie Besant’s involvement with the Indian National Congress. While Radhakrishnan does not speak of the Theosophists presence at this time, it is unlikely that he would have been unfamiliar with their views.
What Vivekananda, Savarkar, and Theosophy did bring to Radhakrishnan was a sense of cultural self-confidence and self-reliance. However, the affirmation Radhakrishnan received from this resurgence of Hinduism did not push Radhakrishnan to study philosophy nor to interpret his own religion. It was only after Radhakrishnan’s experiences at Madras Christian College that he began to put down in writing his own understanding of Hinduism.
In 1904, Radhakrishnan entered Madras Christian College. At this time Radhakrishnan’s academic sensibilities lay with the physical sciences, and before beginning his MA degree in 1906 his interest appears to have been law.
Two key influences on Radhakrishnan at Madras Christian College left an indelible stamp on Radhakrishnan’s sensibilities. First, it was here that Radhakrishnan was trained in European philosophy. Radhakrishnan was introduced to the philosophies of Berkeley,Leibniz, Locke, Spinoza, Kant, J.S. Mill, Herbert Spencer, Fichte, Hegel, Aristotle, andPlato among others. Radhakrishnan was also introduced to the philosophical methods and theological views of his MA supervisor and most influential non-Indian mentor, Professor A.G. Hogg. Hogg was a Scottish Presbyterian missionary who was educated in the theology of Albrecht Ritschl and studied under the philosopher Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison. As a student of Arthur Titius, himself a student of Albrecht Ritschl, Hogg adopted the Ritschlian distinction between religious value judgments, with their emphasis on subjective perception, and theoretical knowledge, which seeks to discover the nature of ultimate reality. Religious value judgments give knowledge which is different from, though not necessarily opposed to, theoretical knowledge. For Ritschl, and subsequently for Titius and Hogg, this distinction led to the conclusion that doctrines and scriptures are records of personal insights and are therefore necessary for religious, and specifically Christian, faith. This distinction left its mark on Radhakrishnan’s philosophical and religious thinking and resonates throughout his writing.
A second key factor shaping Radhakrishnan’s sensibilities during this time is that it was at Madras Christian College that Radhakrishnan encountered intense religious polemic in an academic setting. Radhakrishnan later recalled: “The challenge of Christian critics impelled me to make a study of Hinduism and find out what is living and what is dead in it… I prepared a thesis on the Ethics of the Vedanta, which was intended to be a reply to the charge that the Vedanta system had no room for ethics” (MST 19).
Upon the completion of his MA degree in 1908, Radhakrishnan found himself at both a financial and professional crossroads. His obligations to his family precluded him from applying for a scholarship to study in Britain and he struggled without success to find work in Madras. The following year, with the assistance of William Skinner at Madras Christian College, Radhakrishnan was able to secure what was intended to be a temporary teaching position at Presidency College in Madras.
At Presidency College, Radhakrishnan lectured on a variety of topics in psychology as well as in European philosophy. As a junior Assistant Professor, logic, epistemology and ethical theory were his stock areas of instruction. At the College, Radhakrishnan also learned Sanskrit.
During these years, Radhakrishnan was anxious to have his work published, not only by Indian presses but also in European journals. The Guardian Press in Madras published his MA thesis, and scarcely revised portions of this work appeared in Modern Review andThe Madras Christian College Magazine. While Radhakrishnan’s efforts met with success in other Indian journals, it was not until his article “The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant” appeared in The International Journal of Ethics in 1911 that Radhakrishnan broke through to a substantial Western audience. As well, his edited lecture notes on psychology were published under the title Essentials of Psychology.
By 1914, Radhakrishnan’s reputation as a scholar was beginning to grow. However, the security of a permanent academic post in Madras eluded him. For three months in 1916 he was posted to Anantapur, Andhra Pradesh, and in 1917 he was transferred yet again, this time to Rajahmundry. Only after spending a year in Rajahmundry did Radhakrishnan find some degree of professional security upon his acceptance of a position in philosophy at Mysore University. This hiatus in his occupational angst would be short lived. His most prestigious Indian academic appointment to the George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University in February of 1921 would take him out of South India for the first time only two and a half years later.
Between 1914 and 1920, Radhakrishnan continued to publish. He authored eighteen articles, ten of which were published in prominent Western journals such as The International Journal of Ethics, The Monist, and Mind. Throughout these articles, Radhakrishnan took it upon himself to refine and expand upon his interpretation of Hinduism.
There is a strong polemical tenor to many of these articles. Radhakrishnan was no longer content simply to define and defend Vedanta. Instead, he sought to confront directly not only Vedanta’s Western competitors, but what he saw as the Western philosophical enterprise and the Western ethos in general.
Radhakrishnan’s polemical sensibilities during these years were heightened in no small part by the political turmoil both on the Indian as well as on the world stage. Radhakrishnan’s articles and books during this period reflect his desire to offer a sustainable philosophical response to the unfolding discontent he encountered. World War One and its aftermath, and in particular the events in Amritsar in the spring of 1919, further exacerbated Radhakrishnan’s patience with what he saw as an irrational, dogmatic, and despotic West. Radhakrishnan’s 1920 The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy is indicative of his heightened polemical sensibilities during this period.
A more positive factor in Radhakrishnan’s life during these years was his reading of Rabindranath Tagore, the Bengali poet. Radhakrishnan joined the rest of the English-speaking world in 1912 in reading Tagore’s translated works. Though the two had never met at this time, Tagore would become perhaps Radhakrishnan’s most influential Indian mentor. Tagore’s poetry and prose resonated with Radhakrishnan. He appreciated Tagore’s emphasis on aesthetics as well as his appeal to intuition. From 1914 on, both of these notions — aesthetics and intuition — begin to find their place in Radhakrishnan’s own interpretations of experience, the epistemological category for his philosophical and religious proclivities. Over the next five decades, Radhakrishnan would repeatedly appeal to Tagore’s writing to support his own philosophical ideals.
In 1921, Radhakrishnan took up the prestigious George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University. As an honored, though hesitant, heir to Brajendranath Seal, Radhakrishnan’s appointment to the chair was not without its dissenters who sought a fellow Bengali for the position. In Calcutta, Radhakrishnan was for the first time out of his South Indian element — geographically, culturally, and linguistically.
However, the isolation Radhakrishnan experienced during his early years in Calcutta allowed him to work on his two volume Indian Philosophy, the first of which he began while in Mysore and published in 1923 and the second followed four years later. Throughout the 1920s, Radhakrishnan’s reputation as a scholar continued to grow both in India and abroad. He was invited to Oxford to give the 1926 Upton Lectures, published in 1927 as The Hindu View of Life, and in 1929 Radhakrishnan delivered theHibbert Lectures, later published under the title An Idealist View of Life. The later of these two Views is Radhakrishnan’s most sustained, non-commentarial work. An Idealist View of Life is frequently seen as Radhakrishnan’s mature work and has undoubtedly received the bulk of scholarly attention on Radhakrishnan.
While Radhakrishnan enjoyed a growing scholarly repute, he was also confronted in Calcutta with growing conflict and confrontation. The events of Amritsar in 1919 did little to encourage positive relations between Indians and the British Raj; and Gandhi’s on again-off again Rowlatt satyagraha was proving ineffective in cultivating a united Indian voice. The ambiguity of the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms with their olive branch for “responsible government” further fragmented an already divided Congress. The Khalifat movement splintered the Indian Muslim community, and aggravated the growing animosity between its supporters and those, Muslim or otherwise, who saw it as a side issue to swaraj (self-rule). But the racial paternalism of the 1927 Simon Commission prompted a resurgence of nationalist sentiment. While Indian solidarity and protest received international attention, due in no small part to the media coverage of Gandhi’s Salt March, such national unity was readily shaken. Indian political consensus, much less swaraj, proved elusive. Communal division and power struggles on the part of Indians and a renewed conservatism in Britain crippled the London Round Table Conferences of the early 1930s, reinforcing and perpetuating an already highly fragmented and politically volatile India.
With the publication of An Idealist View of Life, Radhakrishnan had come into his own philosophically. In his mind, he had identified the “religious” problem, reviewed the alternatives, and posited a solution. An unreflective dogmatism could not be remedied by escaping from “experiential religion” which is the true basis of all religions. Rather, a recognition of the creative potency of integral experience tempered by a critical scientific attitude was, Radhakrishnan believed, the only viable corrective to dogmatic claims of exclusivity founded on external, second-hand authority. Moreover, while Hinduism (Advaita Vedanta) as he defined it best exemplified his position, Radhakrishnan claimed that the genuine philosophical, theological, and literary traditions in India and the West supported his position.
Radhakrishnan was knighted in 1931, the same year he took up his administrative post as Vice Chancellor at the newly founded, though scarcely constructed, Andhra University at Waltair. Sir Radhakrishnan served there for five years as Vice Chancellor, when, in 1936, not only did the university in Calcutta affirm his position in perpetuity but Oxford University appointed him to the H.N. Spalding Chair of Eastern Religions and Ethics. In late 1939, Radhakrishnan took up his second Vice Chancellorship at Benares Hindu University (BHU), and served there during the course of the second world war until mid-January 1948, two weeks before Gandhi’s assassination in New Delhi.
Shortly after his resignation from BHU, Radhakrishnan was named chairman of the University Education Commission. The Commission’s 1949 Report assessed the state of university education and made recommendations for its improvement in the newly independent India. Though co-authored by others, Radhakrishnan’s hand is felt especially in the chapters on The Aims of University Education and Religious Education.
During these years, the question of nationalism occupied Radhakrishnan’s attention. The growing communalism Radhakrishnan had witnessed in the 1920s was further intensified with the ideological flowering of the Hindu Mahasabha under the leadership of Bhai Parmanand and his heir V.D. Savarkar. Likewise, Muhammad Iqbal’s 1930 poetic vision and call for Muslim self-assertion furnished Muhammad Jinnah with an ideological template in which to lay claim to an independent Pakistan. This claim was given recognition at the Round Table Conferences in London early that decade. If the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms had in the 1920s served to fracture already fragile political alliances, its 1935 progeny as the Government of India Act with its promise for greater self-government further crowded the political stage and divided those groups struggling for their share of power. During these years, the spectrum of nationalist vision was as broad as Indian solidarity was elusive.
The issues of education and nationalism come together for Radhakrishnan during this period. For Radhakrishnan, a university education which quickened the development of the whole individual was the only responsible and practical means to the creation of Indian solidarity and clarity of national vision. Throughout the 1930s and 1940s, Radhakrishnan expressed his vision of an autonomous India. He envisioned an India built and guided by those who were truly educated, by those who had a personal vision of and commitment to raising Indian self-consciousness.
The years following Indian independence mark Radhakrishnan’s increasing involvement in Indian political as well as in international affairs. The closing years of the 1940s were busy ones. Radhakrishnan had been actively involved in the newly incorporated UNESCO (United Nations Educational, Scientific, and Cultural Organization), serving on its Executive Board as well as leading the Indian delegation from 1946-1951. Radhakrishnan also served for the two years immediately following India’s independence as a member of the Indian Constituent Assembly. Radhakrishnan’s time and energy to UNESCO and the Constituent Assembly had also to be shared by the demands of the University Commission and his continuing obligations as Spalding Professor at Oxford.
With the Report of the Universities Commission complete in 1949, Radhakrishnan was appointed by then Prime Minister Jawaharlal Nehru as Indian Ambassador to Moscow, a post he held until 1952. The opportunity for Radhakrishnan to put into practice his own philosophical-political ideals came with his election to the Raja Sabha, in which he served as India’s Vice-President (1952-1962) and later as President (1962-1967).
Radhakrishnan saw during his terms in office an increasing need for world unity and universal fellowship. The urgency of this need was pressed home to Radhakrishnan by what he saw as the unfolding crises throughout the world. At the time of his taking up the office of Vice-President, the Korean war was already in full swing. Political tensions with China in the early 1960s followed by the hostilities between India and Pakistan dominated Radhakrishnan’s presidency. Moreover, the Cold War divided East and West leaving each side suspicious of the other and on the defensive.
Radhakrishnan challenged what he saw as the divisive potential and dominating character of self-professed international organizations such as the League of Nations. Instead, he called for the promotion of a creative internationalism based on the spiritual foundations of integral experience. Only then could understanding and tolerance between peoples and between nations be promoted.
Radhakrishnan retired from public life in 1967. He spent the last eight years of his life at the home he built in Mylapore, Madras. Radhakrishnan died on April 17, 1975.
Radhakrishnan located his metaphysics within the Advaita (non-dual) Vedanta tradition (sampradaya). And like other Vedantins before him, Radhakrishnan wrote commentaries on the Prasthanatraya (that is, main primary texts of Vedanta ): the Upanisads (1953),Brahma Sutra (1959), and the Bhagavadgita (1948).
As an Advaitin, Radhakrishnan embraced a metaphysical idealism. But Radhakrishnan’s idealism was such that it recognized the reality and diversity of the world of experience (prakṛti) while at the same time preserving the notion of a wholly transcendent Absolute (Brahman), an Absolute that is identical to the self (Atman). While the world of experience and of everyday things is certainly not ultimate reality as it is subject to change and is characterized by finitude and multiplicity, it nonetheless has its origin and support in the Absolute (Brahman) which is free from all limits, diversity, and distinctions (nirguṇa). Brahman is the source of the world and its manifestations, but these modes do not affect the integrity of Brahman.
In this vein, Radhakrishnan did not merely reiterate the metaphysics of Śaṅkara (8th century C.E.), arguably Advaita Vedanta’s most prominent and enduring figure, but sought to reinterpret Advaita for present needs. In particular, Radhakrishnan reinterpreted what he saw as Śaṅkara’s understanding of maya strictly as illusion. For Radhakrishnan, maya ought not to be understood to imply a strict objective idealism, one in which the world is taken to be inherently disconnected from Brahman, but rather mayaindicates, among other things, a subjective misperception of the world as ultimately real. [See Donald Braue, Maya in Radhakrishnan's Thought: Six Meanings Other Than Illusion(1985) for a full treatment of this issue.]
This section deals with Radhakrishnan’s understanding of intuition and his interpretations of experience. It begins with a general survey of the variety of terms as well as the characteristics Radhakrishnan associates with intuition. It then details with how Radhakrishnan understands specific occurrences of intuition in relation to other forms of experience — cognitive, psychic, aesthetic, ethical, and religious.
Radhakrishnan associates a vast constellation of terms with intuition. At its best, intuition is an “integral experience”. Radhakrishnan uses the term “integral” in at least three ways. First, intuition is integral in the sense that it coordinates and synthesizes all other experiences. It integrates all other experiences into a more unified whole. Second, intuition is integral as it forms the basis of all other experiences. In other words, Radhakrishnan holds that all experiences are at bottom intuitional. Third, intuition is integral in the sense that the results of the experience are integrated into the life of the individual. For Radhakrishnan, intuition finds expression in the world of action and social relations.
At times Radhakrishnan prefers to emphasize the “mystical” and “spiritual” quality of intuition as attested to by the expressions “religious experience” (IVL 91), “religious consciousness” (IVL 199), “mystical experience” (IVL 88), “spiritual idealism” (IVL 87), “self-existent spiritual experience” (IVL 99), “prophetic indications” and “the real ground in man’s deepest being” (IVL 103), “spiritual apprehension” (IVL 103), “moments of vision” (IVL 94), “revelation” (IVL 210), “supreme light” (IVL 206), and even “faith” (IVL 199). But it is the creative potency of intuition, designated by Radhakrishnan’s reference to the “creative center” of the individual (IVL 113), “creative intuition” (IVL 205), “creative spirit” (IVL 206), and “creative energy” (IVL 205), that is the lynchpin for Radhakrishnan’s understanding of intuition. As Radhakrishnan understands it, all progress is the result of the creative potency of intuition.
For Radhakrishnan, intuition is a distinct form of experience. Intuition is of a self-certifying character (svatassiddha). It is sufficient and complete. It is self-established (svatasiddha), self-evidencing (svāsaṃvedya), and self-luminous (svayam-prakāsa) (IVL 92). Intuition entails pure comprehension, entire significance, complete validity (IVL 93). It is both truth-filled and truth-bearing (IVL 93). Intuition is its own cause and its own explanation (IVL 92). It is sovereign (IVL 92). Intuition is a positive feeling of calm and confidence, joy and strength (IVL 93). Intuition is profoundly satisfying (IVL 93). It is peace, power and joy (IVL 93).
Intuition is the ultimate form of experience for Radhakrishnan. It is ultimate in the sense that intuition constitutes the fullest and therefore the most authentic realization of the Real (Brahman). The ultimacy of intuition is also accounted for by Radhakrishnan in that it is the ground of all other forms of experience.
Intuition is a self-revelation of the divine. Intuitive experience is immediate. Immediacy does not imply in Radhakrishnan’s mind an “absence of psychological mediation, but only non-mediation by conscious thought” (IVL 98). Intuition operates on a supra-conscious level, unmediated as it is by conscious thought. Even so, Radhakrishnan holds that there is “no such thing as pure experience, raw and undigested. It is always mixed up with layers of interpretation” (IVL 99). One might object here that Radhakrishnan has conflated the experience itself with its subsequent interpretation and expression. However, Radhakrishnan’s comment is an attempt to deny the Hegelian interpretation of Hinduism’s “contentless” experience, affirming instead that intuition is the plenitude of experience.
Finally, intuition, according to Radhakrishnan, is ineffable. It escapes the limits of language and logic, and there is “no conception by which we can define it” (IVL 96). In such experiences “[t]hought and reality coalesce and a creative merging of subject and object results” (IVL 92). While the experience itself transcends expression, it also provokes it (IVL 95). The provocation of expression is, for Radhakrishnan, testimony to the creative impulse of intuition. All creativity and indeed all progress in the various spheres of life is the inevitable result of intuition.
Radhakrishnan recognizes three categories of cognitive experience: sense experience, discursive reasoning, and intuitive apprehension. For Radhakrishnan all of these forms of experience contribute, in varying degrees, to a knowledge of the real (Brahman), and as such have their basis in intuition.
Of the cognitive forms of knowledge, Radhakrishnan suggests that sensory knowledge is in one respect closest to intuition, for it is in the act of sensing that one is in “direct contact” with the object. Sense experience “helps us to know the outer characters of the external world. By means of it we acquire an acquaintance with the sensible qualities of the objects” (IVL 134). “Intuitions,” Radhakrishnan believes, “are convictions arising out of a fullness of life in a spontaneous way, more akin to sense than to imagination or intellect and more inevitable than either” (IVL 180). In this sense, sense perception may be considered intuitive, though Radhakrishnan does not explicitly describe it as such.
Discursive reasoning, and the logical knowledge it produces, is subsequent to sensory experience (perception). “Logical knowledge is obtained by the processes of analysis and synthesis. Unlike sense perception which Radhakrishnan claims to be closer to direct knowledge, logical knowledge “is indirect and symbolic in its character. It helps us to handle and control the object and its workings” (IVL 134). There is a paradoxical element here. Radhakrishnan seems to be suggesting that the direct proximity to an external object one encounters in sense perception is compromised when the perception is interpreted and subsequently incorporated into a more systematic, though presumably higher, form of knowledge through discursive reasoning.
For Radhakrishnan, discursive reasoning and the logical systems they construct possess an element of intuition. The methodical, mechanical working through of logical problems and the reworking of rational systems cannot be divorced from what Radhakrishnan might call an “intuitive hunch” that such a course of action will bear positive results; “In any concrete act of thinking the mind’s active experience is both intuitive and intellectual” (IVL 181-182).
Radhakrishnan argues against what he sees as the prevalent (Western) temptation to reduce the intuitive to the logical. While logic deals with facts already known, intuition goes beyond logic to reveal previously unseen connections between facts. “The art of discovery is confused with the logic of proof and an artificial simplification of the deeper movements of thought results. We forget that we invent by intuition though we prove by logic” (IVL 177). Intuition not only clarifies the relations between facts and seemingly discordant systems, but lends itself to the discovery of new knowledge which then becomes an appropriate subject of philosophical inquiry and logical analysis.
Claiming to take his cue from his former adversary Henri Bergson, Radhakrishnan offers three explanations to account for the tendency to overlook the presence of intuition in discursive reasoning. First, Radhakrishnan claims, intuition presupposes a rational knowledge of facts. “The insight does not arise if we are not familiar with the facts of the case…. The successful practice of intuition requires previous study and assimilation of a multitude of facts and laws. We may take it that great intuitions arise out of a matrix of rationality” (IVL 177). Second, the intuitive element is often obscured in discursive reasoning because facts known prior to the intuition are retained, though they are synthesized, and perhaps reinterpreted, in light of the intuitive insight. “The readjustment [of previously known facts] is so easy that when the insight is attained it escapes notice and we imagine that the process of discovery is only rational synthesis” (IVL 177). Finally, intuition in discursive reasoning is often overlooked, disguised as it is in the language of logic. In short, the intuitive is mistaken for the logical. “Knowledge when acquired must be thrown into logical form and we are obliged to adopt the language of logic since only logic has a communicable language.” This last is a perplexing claim since elsewhere Radhakrishnan clearly recognizes that meaning is conveyed in symbols, poetry, and metaphors. Perhaps what Radhakrishnan means is that logic is the only valid means by which we are able to organize and systematize empirical facts. Regardless, according to Radhakrishnan, the presentation of facts in logical form contributes to “a confusion between discovery and proof” (IVL 177).
Conversely, Radhakrishnan offers a positive argument for the place of intuition in discursive reasoning. “If the process of discovery were mere synthesis, any mechanical manipulator of prior partial concepts would have reached the insight and it would not have taken a genius to arrive at it” (IVL 178). A purely mechanical account of discursive reasoning ignores the inherently creative and dynamic dimension of intuitive insight. In Radhakrishnan’s view the mechanical application of logic alone is creatively empty (IVL 181).
However, Radhakrishnan holds that the “creative insight is not the final link in a chain of reasoning. If it were that, it would not strike us as “inspired in its origin” (IVL 178). Intuition is not the end, but part of an ever-developing and ever-dynamic process of realization. There is, for Radhakrishnan, a continual system of “checks and balances” between intuition and the logical method of discursive reasoning. Cognitive intuitions “are not substitutes for thought, they are challenges to intelligence. Mere intuitions are blind while intellectual work is empty. All processes are partly intuitive and partly intellectual. There is no gulf between the two” (IVL 181).
Perhaps the most understudied dimension of Radhakrishnan’s interpretations of experience is his recognition of “supernormal” experiences. As early as his first volume of Indian Philosophy (1923), Radhakrishnan affirms the validity of what he identifies as “psychic phenomena”. Radhakrishnan accounts for such experiences in terms of a highly developed sensitivity to intuition. “The mind of man,” Radhakrishnan explains, “has the three aspects of subconscious, the conscious, and the superconscious, and the ‘abnormal’ psychic phenomena, called by the different names of ecstasy, genius, inspiration, madness, are the workings of the superconscious mind” (IP1 28). Such experiences are not “abnormal” according to Radhakrishnan, nor are they unscientific. Rather, they are the products of carefully controlled mental experiments. In the Indian past, “The psychic experiences, such as telepathy and clairvoyance, were considered to be neither abnormal nor miraculous. They are not the products of diseased minds or inspiration from the gods, but powers which the human mind can exhibit under carefully ascertained conditions” (IP1 28). Psychic intuitions are not askew with Radhakrishnan’s understanding of the intellect. In fact, they are evidence of the remarkable heights to which the undeveloped, limited intellect is capable. They are, for Radhakrishnan, accomplishments rather than failures of human consciousness.
As highly developed powers of apprehension, psychic experiences are a state of consciousness “beyond the understanding of the normal, and the supernormal is traced to the supernatural” (IVL 94). Moreover, in what Radhakrishnan might recognize as an “intuitive hunch” in the articulation of a new scientific hypothesis, psychic premonitions, as partial or momentary as they may be, lend themselves to the “psychic hypothesis” that the universal spirit is inherent in the nature of all things (IVL 110). For Radhakrishnan, psychic intuitions are suprasensory: “We can see objects without the medium of the senses and discern relations spontaneously without building them up laboriously. In other words, we can discern every kind of reality directly” (IVL 143). In a bold, albeit highly problematic, declaration, Radhakrishnan believes that the “facts of telepathy prove that one mind can communicate with another directly”(IVL 143).
“All art,” Radhakrishnan declares, “is the expression of experience in some medium” (IVL 182). However, the artistic experience should not be confused with its expression. While the experience itself is ineffable, the challenge for the artist is to give the experience concrete expression. “The success of art is measured by the extent to which it is able to render experiences of one dimension into terms of another. (IVL 187) For Radhakrishnan, art born out of a “creative contemplation which is a process of travail of the spirit is an authentic “crystallization of a life process” (IVL 185). At its ultimate and in its essence, the “poetical character is derived from the creative intuition (that is, integral intuition) which holds sound, suggestion and sense in organic solution” (IVL 191).
In Radhakrishnan’s view, without the intuitive experience, art becomes mechanical and a rehearsal of old themes. Such “art” is an exercise in (re)production rather than a communication of the artist’s intuitive encounter with reality. “Technique without inspiration,” Radhakrishnan declares, “is barren. Intellectual powers, sense facts and imaginative fancies may result in clever verses, repetition of old themes, but they are only manufactured poetry” (IVL 188). It is not simply a difference of quality but a “difference of kind in the source itself” (IVL 189). For Radhakrishnan, true art is an expression of the whole personality, seized as it was with the creative impulse of the universe.
Artistic intuition mitigates and subdues rational reflection. But “[e]ven in the act of composition,” Radhakrishnan believes, “the poet is in a state in which the reflective elements are subordinated to the intuitive. The vision, however, is not operative for so long as it continues, its very stress acts as a check on expression” (IVL 187).
For Radhakrishnan, artistic expression is dynamic. Having had the experience, the artist attempts to recall it. The recollection of the intuition, Radhakrishnan believes, is not a plodding reconstruction, nor one of dispassionate analysis. Rather, there is an emotional vibrancy: “The experience is recollected not in tranquility… but in excitement” (IVL 187). To put the matter somewhat differently, the emotional vibrancy of the aesthetic experience gives one knowledge by being rather than knowledge by knowing (IVL 184).
Art and Science
There is in Radhakrishnan’s mind a “scientific” temperament to genuine artistic expression. In what might be called the science of art, Radhakrishnan believes that the “experience or the vision is the artist’s counterpart to the scientific discovery of a principle or law” (IVL 184). There is a concordance of agendas in art and science. “What the scientist does when he discovers a new law is to give a new ordering to observed facts. The artist is engaged in a similar task. He gives new meaning to our experience and organizes it in a different way due to his perception of subtler qualities in reality” (IVL 194).
Despite this synthetic impulse, Radhakrishnan is careful to explain that the two disciplines are not wholly the same. The difference turns on what he sees as the predominantly aesthetic and qualitative nature of artistic expression. “Poetic truth is different from scientific truth since it reveals the real in its qualitative uniqueness and not in its quantitative universality” (IVL 193). Presumably, Radhakrishnan means that, unlike the universal laws with which science attempts to grapple, art is much more subjective, not in its creative origin, but in its expression. A further distinction between the two may lend further insight into Radhakrishnan’s open appreciation for the poetic medium. “Poetry,” he believes, “is the language of the soul, while prose is the language of science. The former is the language of mystery, of devotion, of religion. Prose lays bare its whole meaning to the intelligence, while poetry plunges us in the mysterium tremendum of life and suggests the truths that cannot be stated” (IVL 191).
Not surprisingly, intuition finds a place in Radhakrishnan’s ethics. For Radhakrishnan, ethical experiences are profoundly transformative. The experience resolves dilemmas and harmonizes seemingly discordant paths of possible action. “If the new harmony glimpsed in the moments of insight is to be achieved, the old order of habits must be renounced” (IVL 114). Moral intuitions result in “a redemption of our loyalties and a remaking of our personalities” (IVL 115).
That Radhakrishnan conceives of the ethical development of the individual as a form of conversion is noteworthy as it underscores Radhakrishnan’s identification of ethics and religion. For Radhakrishnan, an ethical transformation of the kind brought about by intuition is akin to religious growth and heightened realization. The force of this view is underscored by Radhakrishnan’s willing acceptance of the interchangeability of the terms “intuition” and “religious experience”.
Of course, not all ethical decisions or actions possess the quality of being guided by an intuitive impulse. Radhakrishnan willingly concedes that the vast majority of moral decisions are the result of conformity to well-established moral codes. However, it is in times of moral crisis that the creative force of ethical intuitions come to the fore. In a less famous, though thematically reminiscent analogy, Radhakrishnan accounts for growth of moral consciousness in terms of the creative intuitive impulse: “In the chessboard of life, the different pieces have powers which vary with the context and the possibilities of their combination are numerous and unpredictable. The sound player has a sense of right and feels that, if he does not follow it, he will be false to himself. In any critical situation the forward move is a creative act” (IVL 196-197).
By definition, moral actions are socially rooted. As such the effects of ethical intuitions are played out on the social stage. While the intuition itself is an individual achievement, Radhakrishnan’s view is that the intuition must be not only translated into positive and creative action but shared with others. There is a sense of urgency, if not inevitability, about this. Radhakrishnan tells us one “cannot afford to be absolutely silent” (IVL 97) and the saints “love because they cannot help it” (IVL 116).
The impulse to share the moral insight provides an opportunity to test the validity of the intuition against reason. The moral hero, as Radhakrishnan puts it, does not live by intuition alone. The intuitive experience, while it is the creative guiding impulse behind all moral progress, must be checked and tested against reason. There is a “scientific” and “experimental” dimension to Radhakrishnan’s understanding of ethical behavior. Those whose lives are profoundly transformed and who are guided by the ethical experience are, for Radhakrishnan, moral heroes. To Radhakrishnan’s mind, the moral hero, guided as he or she is by the ethical experience, who carves out an adventurous path is akin to the discoverer who brings order into the scattered elements of a science or the artist who composes a piece of music or designs buildings” (IVL 196). In a sense, there is very much an art and science to ethical living.
Radhakrishnan’s moral heroes, having developed a “large impersonality” (IVL 116) in which the joy, freedom and bliss of a life uninhibited by the constraints of ego and individuality are realized, become “self-sacrificing” exemplars for others. “Feeling the unity of himself and the universe, the man who lives in spirit is no more a separate and self-centered individual but a vehicle of the universal spirit” (IVL 115). Like the artist, the moral hero does not turn his back on the world. Instead, “[h]e throws himself on the world and lives for its redemption, possessed as he is with an unshakable sense of optimism and an unlimited faith in the powers of the soul” (IVL 116). In short, Radhakrishnan’s moral hero is a conduit whose “world-consciousness” delights “in furthering the plan of the cosmos” (IVL 116).
Radhakrishnan believes that ethical intuitions at their deepest transcend conventional and mechanically constructed ethical systems. Moral heroes exemplify Radhakrishnan’s ethical ideal while at the same time provoking in those who accept the ethical status quo to evaluate and to reconsider less than perfect moral codes. As the moral hero is “fighting for the reshaping of his own society on sounder lines [his] behavior might offend the sense of decorum of the cautious conventionalist” (IVL 197). The contribution of ethically realized individuals is their promotion of moral progress in the world. “Though morality commands conformity, all moral progress is due to nonconformists” (IVL 197). The moral hero is no longer guided by external moral codes, but by an “inner rhythm” of harmony between self and the universe revealed to him in the intuitive experience. “By following his deeper nature, he may seem to be either unwise or unmoral to those of us who adopt conventional standards. But for him the spiritual obligation is more of a consequence than social tradition” (IVL 197).
For the sake of clarity, we must at the outset make a tentative distinction between religious experience on the one hand and integral experience on the other. Radhakrishnan’s distinction between “religion” and “religions” will be helpful here. At its most basic, religions, for Radhakrishnan, represent the various interpretations of experience, while integral experience is the essence of all religions. “If experience is the soul of religion, expression is the body through which it fulfills its destiny. We have the spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others” (IVL 90). “It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change” (IVL 90). But the interpretations should not be confused with the experiences themselves. For Radhakrishnan, “[c]onceptual expressions are tentative and provisional… [because] the intellectual accounts… are constructed theories of experience” (IVL 119). And he cautions us to “distinguish between the immediate experience or intuition which might conceivably be infallible and the interpretation which is mixed up with it” (IVL 99).
For Radhakrishnan, the creeds and theological formulations of religion are but intellectual representations and symbols of experience. “The idea of God,” Radhakrishnan affirms, “is an interpretation of experience” (IVL 186). It follows here that religious experiences are, for Radhakrishnan, context relative and therefore imperfect. They are informed by and experienced through specific cultural, historical, linguistic and religious lenses. Because of their contextuality and subsequent intellectualization, experiences in the religious sphere are limited. It is in this sense that we may refer to experiences which occur under the auspices of one or other of the religions as “religious experiences”. Radhakrishnan spends little time dealing with “religious experiences” as they occur in specific religious traditions. And what little he does say is used to demonstrate the theological preconditioning and “religious” relativity of such experiences. However, “religious experiences” have value for Radhakrishnan insofar as they offer the possibility of heightening one’s religious consciousness and bringing one into ever closer proximity to “religious intuition”.
Much to the confusion and chagrin of readers of Radhakrishnan, Radhakrishnan uses “religious experience” to refer to such “sectarian” religious experiences (as discussed immediately above) as well as to refer to “religious intuitions” which transcend narrow sectarian and religious boundaries and are identical to intuition itself (taken up in the section on “Intuition” above (B.I.) and revisited immediately below).
Radhakrishnan is explicit and emphatic in his view that religious intuition is a unique form of experience. Religious intuition is more than simply the confluence of the cognitive, aesthetic, and ethical sides of life. However vital and significant these sides of life may be, they are but partial and fragmented constituents of a greater whole, a whole which is experienced in its fullness and immediacy in religious intuition.
To Radhakrishnan’s mind, religious intuition is not only an autonomous form of experience, but a form of experience which informs and validates all spheres of life and experience. Philosophical, artistic, and ethical values of truth, beauty, and goodness are not known through the senses or by reason. Rather, “they are apprehended by intuition or faith…” (IVL 199-200). For Radhakrishnan, religious intuition informs, conjoins, and transcends an otherwise fragmentary consciousness.
Informing Radhakrishnan’s interpretation of religious intuition is his affirmation of the identity of the self and ultimate reality. Throughout his life, Radhakrishnan interpreted the Upaniṣadic mahavakya, tat tvam asi, as a declaration of the non-duality (advaita) of Atman and Brahman. His advaitic interpretation allows him to affirm the ineffability of the truth behind the formula. Radhakrishnan readily appropriates his acceptance of the non-dual experience to his interpretation of religious intuition. Radhakrishnan not only claimed to find support for his views in the Upaniṣads, but believed that, correctly understood, the ancient sages expounded his interpretation of religious intuition. Any attempt at interpretation of the intuition could only approximate the truth of the experience itself. As the ultimate realization, religious intuition must not only account for and bring together all other forms of experience, but must overcome the distinctions between them. Radhakrishnan goes so far as to claim that intuition of this sort is the essence of religion. All religions are informed by it, though all fail to varying degrees to interpret it. “Here we find the essence of religion, which is a synthetic realization of life. The religious man has the knowledge that everything is significant, the feeling that there is harmony underneath the conflicts and the power to realize the significance and the harmony” (IVL 201).
With this, the present discussion of intuition and the varieties of experience has come full circle. Radhakrishnan identifies intuition — in all its contextual varieties — with integral experience. The two expressions are, for Radhakrishnan, synonymous. Integral experience coordinates and synthesizes the range of life’s experiences. It furnishes the individual with an ever-deepening awareness of and appreciation for the unity of Reality. As an intuition, integral experience is not only the basis of all experience but the source of all creative ingenuity, whether such innovation be philosophical, scientific, moral, artistic, or religious. Moreover, not only does integral experience find expression in these various spheres of life, but such expression, Radhakrishnan believes, quickens the intuitive and creative impulse among those it touches.
Radhakrishnan’s hierarchy of religions is well-known. “Hinduism,” Radhakrishnan affirms, “accepts all religious notions as facts and arranges them in the order of their more or less intrinsic significance”: “The worshippers of the Absolute are the highest in rank; second to them are the worshippers of the personal God; then come the worshippers of the incarnations like Rama, Kṛṣṇa, Buddha; below them are those who worship ancestors, deities and sages, and the lowest of all are the worshippers of the petty forces and spirits” (HVL 32).
Radhakrishnan uses his distinctions between experience and interpretation, between religion and religions, to correlate his brand of Hinduism (that is, Advaita Vedanta ) with religion itself. “Religion,” Radhakrishnan holds, is “a kind of life or experience.” It is an insight into the nature of reality (darsana), or experience of reality (anubhava). It is “a specific attitude of the self, itself and not other” (HVL 15). In a short, but revealing passage, Radhakrishnan characterizes religion in terms of “personal experience.” It is “an independent functioning of the human mind, something unique, possessing and autonomous character. It is something inward and personal which unifies all values and organizes all experiences. It is the reaction to the whole of man to the whole of reality. [It] may be called spiritual life, as distinct from a merely intellectual or moral or aesthetic activity or a combination of them” (IVL 88-89).
For Radhakrishnan, integral intuitions are the authority for, and the soul of, religion (IVL 89-90). It is here that we find a critical coalescence of ideas in Radhakrishnan’s thinking. If, as Radhakrishnan claims, personal intuitive experience and inner realization are the defining features of Advaita Vedanta , and those same features are the “authority” and “soul” of religion as he understands it, Radhakrishnan is able to affirm with the confidence he does: “The Vedanta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance” (HVL 23).
For Radhakrishnan, Hinduism at its Vedantic best is religion. Other religions, including what Radhakrishnan understands as lower forms of Hinduism, are interpretations of Advaita Vedanta . Religion and religions are related in Radhakrishnan’s mind as are experience and interpretation. The various religions are merely interpretations of his Vedanta. In a sense, Radhakrishnan “Hinduizes” all religions. Radhakrishnan appropriates traditional exegetical categories to clarify further the relationship: “We have spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others, śruti or what is heard, and smṛti or what is remembered. Śaṅkara equates them with pratyakṣa or intuition and anumana or inference. It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change” (IVL 90).
The apologetic force of this brief statement is clear. For Radhakrishnan, the intuitive, experiential immediacy of Advaita Vedanta is the genuine authority for all religions, and all religions as intellectually mediated interpretations derive from and must ultimately defer to Advaita Vedanta . Put succinctly: “While the experiential character of religion is emphasized in the Hindu faith, every religion at its best falls back on it” (IVL 90).
For Radhakrishnan, the religions are not on an even footing in their approximations and interpretations of a common experience. To the extent that all traditions are informed by what Radhakrishnan claims to be a common ground of experience (that is, Advaita Vedanta ), each religion has value. At the same time, all religions as interpretations leave room for development and spiritual progress. “While no tradition coincides with experience, every tradition is essentially unique and valuable. While all traditions are of value, none is finally binding” (IVL 120). Moreover, according to Radhakrishnan, the value of each religion is determined by its proximity to Radhakrishnan’s understanding of Vedanta.
Radhakrishnan argues that Hinduism, as he understands it, is a scientific religion. According to Radhakrishnan, “[i]f philosophy of religion is to become scientific, it must become empirical and found itself on religious experience” (IVL 184). True religion, argues Radhakrishnan, remains open to experience and encourages an experimental attitude with regard to its experiential data. Hinduism more than any other religion exemplifies this scientific attitude. “The Hindu philosophy of religion starts from and returns to an experimental basis” (HVL 19). Unlike other religions, which set limits on the types of spiritual experience, the “Hindu thinker readily admits of other points of view than his own and considers them to be just as worthy of attention” (HVL 19). What sets Hinduism apart from other religions is its unlimited appeal to and appreciation for all forms of experience. Experience and experimentation are the origin and end of Hinduism, as Radhakrishnan understand it.
Radhakrishnan argues that a scientific attitude has been the hallmark of Hinduism throughout its history. In a revealing passage, Radhakrishnan explains: “The truths of the ṛṣis are not evolved as the result of logical reasoning or systematic philosophy but are the products of spiritual intuition, dṛṣti or vision. The ṛṣis are not so much the authors of the truths recorded in the Vedas as the seers who were able to discern the eternal truths by raising their life-spirit to the plane of universal spirit. They are the pioneer researchers in the realm of the spirit who saw more in the world than their followers. Their utterances are not based on transitory vision but on a continuous experience of resident life and power. When the Vedas are regarded as the highest authority, all that is meant is that the most exacting of all authorities is the authority of facts” (IVL 89-90).
If the ancient seers are, as Radhakrishnan suggests, “pioneer researchers,” the Upaniṣads are the records of their experiments. “The chief sacred scriptures of the Hindus, the Vedas register the intuitions of the perfected souls. They are not so much dogmatic dicta as transcripts from life. They record the spiritual experiences of souls strongly endowed with the sense of reality. They are held to be authoritative on the ground that they express the experiences of the experts in the field of religion” (HVL 17).
Radhakrishnan’s understanding of scripture as the scientific records of spiritual insights holds not only for Hinduism, but for all religious creeds. Correctly understood, the various scriptures found in the religions of the world are not an infallible revelation, but scientific hypotheses: “The creeds of religion correspond to theories of science” (IVL 86). Radhakrishnan thus recommends that “intuitions of the human soul… should be studied by the methods which are adopted with such great success in the region of positive science” (IVL 85). The records of religious experience, of integral intuitions, that are the world’s scriptures constitute the “facts” of the religious endeavor. So, “just as there can be no geometry without the perception of space, even so there cannot be philosophy of religion without the facts of religion” (IVL 84).
Religious claims, in Radhakrishnan’s mind, are there for the testing. They ought not be taken as authoritative in and of themselves, for only integral intuitions validated by the light of reason are the final authority on religious matters. “It is for philosophy of religion to find out whether the convictions of the religious seers fit in with the tested laws and principles of the universe” (IVL 85). “When the prophets reveal in symbols the truths they have discovered, we try to rediscover them for ourselves slowly and patiently” (IVL 202).
The scientific temperament demanded by “Hinduism” lends itself to Radhakrishnan’s affirmation of the advaitic Absolute. The plurality of religious claims ought to be taken as “tentative and provisional, not because there is no absolute, but because there is one. The intellectual accounts become barriers to further insights if they get hardened into articles of faith and forget that they are constructed theories of experience” (IVL 199).
For Radhakrishnan, the marginalization of intuition and the abandonment of the experimental attitude in matters of religion has lead Christianity to dogmatic stasis. “It is an unfortunate legacy of the course which Christian theology has followed in Europe that faith has come to connote a mechanical adherence to authority. If we take faith in the proper sense of truth or spiritual conviction, religion is faith or intuition” (HVL 16). The religious cul de sac in which Europe and Christian theology find themselves testifies to their reluctance to embrace the Hindu maxim that “theory, speculations, [and] dogma change from time to time as the facts become better understood” (IVL 90). For the value of religious “facts” can only be assessed “from their adequacy to experience” (IVL 90). Just as the intellect has dominated Western philosophy to the detriment of intuition, so too has Christianity followed suit in its search for a theological touchstone in scripture.
Radhakrishnan’s appeal to intuition underlies his vision for an ethical Hinduism, a Hinduism free from ascetic excesses. The ethical potency of intuition affirms the validity of the world. “Asceticism,” Radhakrishnan emphasizes, “is an excess indulged in by those who exaggerate the transcendent aspect of reality.” Instead, the rational mystic “does not recognize any antithesis between the secular and the sacred. Nothing is to be rejected; everything is to be raised” (IVL 115).
Radhakrishnan’s ethical mystic does not simply see the inherent value of the world and engage in its affairs. Rather, the ethical individual is guided by an intuitive initiative to move the world forward creatively, challenging convention and established patterns of social interaction. For Radhakrishnan, this ethically integrated mode of being presents a positive challenge to moral dogmatism. The positive challenge to moral convention, according to Radhakrishnan, is the creative promotion of social tolerance and accommodation. Just as Radhakrishnan’s Hinduism rejects absolute claims to truth and the validity of external authority, so too has Hinduism “developed an attitude of comprehensive charity instead of a fanatic faith in an inflexible creed” (HVL 37).
Radhakrishnan affirms that the caste system, correctly understood, is an exemplary case of ethical tolerance and accommodation born out of an intuitive consciousness of reality. “The institution of caste illustrates the spirit of comprehensive synthesis characteristic of the Hindu mind with its faith in the collaboration of races and the co-operation of cultures. Paradoxical as it may seem, the system of caste is the outcome of tolerance and trust” (HVL 93) Based not on the mechanical fatalism of karma, as suggested by Hinduism’s critics, but on a recognition of Hinduism’s spiritual values and ethical ideals, caste affirms the value of each individual to work out his or her own spiritual realization, a spiritual consciousness Radhakrishnan understands in terms of integral experience. Just as Radhakrishnan sees his ranking of religions as affirming the relative value of each religion in terms of its proximity to Vedanta, the institution of caste is a social recognition that each member of society has the opportunity to experiment with his or her own spiritual consciousness free from dogmatic restraints. In Radhakrishnan’s eyes, herein lies the ethical potency and creative genius of integral experience. Caste is the creative innovation of those “whose lives are characterized by an unshakable faith in the supremacy of the spirit, invincible optimism, ethical universalism, and religious toleration” (IVL 126). [For a discussion of the democratic basis of caste in Radhakrishnan's thinking, see Robert Minor, Radhakrishnan: A Religious Biography(1989).]
There are numerous criticisms that may be raised against Radhakrishnan’s philosophy. What follows is not an exhaustive list, but three of the most common criticisms which may be levied against Radhakrishnan.
The first is a criticism regarding the locus of epistemic authority. One might ask the question: Does the test for knowledge lie in scripture or in experience? Radhakrishnan’s view is that knowledge comes from intuitive experience (anubhava). Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis of scripture, namely the Upaniṣads. The Upaniṣads, according to Radhakrishnan, support a monistic ontology. Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis that the Upaniṣads are the records of the personal experiences of the ancient sages. Thus, the validity of one’s experience is determined by its proximity to that which is recorded in the Upaniṣads. Conversely, the Upaniṣads are authoritative because they are the records of monistic experiences. There is a circularity here. But this circularity is one with which Radhakrishnan himself would likely not only acknowledge, but embrace. After all, Radhakrishnan might argue, intuitive knowledge is non-rational. An intuitive experience of Reality is not contrary to reason but beyond the constraints of logical analysis.
A second criticism of Radhakrishnan’s views surrounds his characterizations of the “East” and the “West.” Radhakrishnan characterizes the West, as well as Christianity, as inclined to dogmatism, the scientific method whose domain is limited to exploration of the outer natural world, and a reliance upon second-hand knowledge. The East, by contrast, is dominated by an openness to inner experience and spiritual experimentation. The West is rational and logical, while the East is predominantly religious and mystical. As pointed out by numerous scholars working in the areas of post-colonial studies and orientalism, Radhakrishnan’s constructions of “West” and “East” (these categories themselves being constructions) accept and perpetuate orientalist and colonialist forms of knowledge constructed during the 18th and 19th centuries. Arguably, these characterizations are “imagined” in the sense that they reflect the philosophical and religious realities of neither “East” nor “West.”
A separate but related criticism that might be levied against Radhakrishnan’s views has to do with his theory of religious pluralism and his treatment of the religious traditions with which he deals.
First, Radhakrishnan minimizes the contributions of the monistic philosophers and religious mystics of the West. While Radhakrishnan acknowledges the work of such thinkers as Henri Bergon, Goethe, and a variety of Christian, Jewish, and Muslim mystics, he seems to imply that such approaches to religious and philosophical life in the West are exceptions rather than the rule. In fact, Radhakrishnan goes so far as to suggest that such figures are imbued with the spirit of the East, and specifically Hinduism as he understands it.
Second, while Radhakrishnan readily acknowledges the religious diversity within “Hinduism,” his treatment of Western traditions is much less nuanced. In a sense, Radhakrishnan homogenizes and generalizes Western traditions. In his hierarchy of religions (see Section 2c above), one or another form of Hinduism may be located within each of his religious categories (monistic, theistic, incarnational, ancestoral, and natural). By contrast, Radhakrishnan seems to imply that the theistic (second) and the incarnational (third) categories are the domains of Unitarian and Trinitarian Christianity respectively.
HVL - The Hindu View of Life (1927)
IP1 - Indian Philosophy: Volume 1 (1923)
IVL - An Idealist View of Life (1929)
MST - My Search for Truth (1937)
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