Religious Language

The term “religious language” refers to statements or claims made about God or gods. Here is a typical philosophical problem of religious language. If God is infinite, then words used to describe finite creatures might not adequately describe God. For example, is God good in the same sense that Secretary-General of the United Nations Kofi Annan is good? This difficulty challenges us to articulate the degree that attributes used for finite beings can be used for God and what these attributes mean when they describe God. The ambiguity in meaning with respect to the terms predicated of God is the “problem of religious language” or the “problem of naming God.” These predications could include divine attributes, properties, or actions. Since the doctrines of the divine in Eastern religious traditions differ radically from the doctrines of the Abrahamic traditions, the problem of religious language has not been accorded much attention in Eastern philosophy.

The problem of religious language is worrisome to practitioners of the Abrahamic religious traditions because it has the potential to undermine those traditions. All three faiths proclaim truths about God in written texts, commentary traditions, and oral teachings. In fact, speech about God is essential to both personal praxis and organized celebration in these traditions. Without adequate solution to the problem of religious language, human speech about God is called into question. Without the ability to speak about God and to understand the meaning of what is spoken, the Abrahamic faiths are vulnerable to the criticism that their sacred texts and teachings are unintelligible.

The problem of religious language also provides a challenge for philosophers of religion. If there is no adequate solution to the problem of religious language, large discussions in the domain of philosophy of religion will also be rendered unintelligible. For example, philosophers of religion debate the nature of divine foreknowledge and human freedom. These claims about God would be rendered unintelligible if human speech about God is impossible. Thus, the problem of religious language is a philosophical problem that must be solved in order to provide a framework for understanding claims about God in both the house of worship and the academy.

Table of Contents

  1. What Generates the Problem of Religious Language?
  2. Solutions to the Problem
    1. Statements about God are Meaningless
    2. Other Possible Solutions: An Overview
      1. Equivocal Language
      2. Univocal Language
      3. Analogical Language
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. What Generates the Problem of Religious Language?

In contemporary discussions, it is not the question of God’s existence that generates the problem of religious language. If God does not exist, any attempt to describe God will be an inaccurate description of reality. Discussions about religious language attempt to articulate how one could speak of God if, in fact, God exists. The problem of religious language is generated by the traditional doctrine of God in the Abrahamic traditions. Since God is thought to be incorporeal, infinite, and timeless, the predicates we apply to corporeal, finite, temporal creatures would not apply to God.

The problem of religious language is also generated by the medieval doctrine of divine simplicity, which claims that God does not have any intrinsic accidental properties. Intrinsic properties are distinguished from Cambridge properties, such that the acquisition or loss of a Cambridge property by a subject does not entail a change in that subject, while the acquisition or loss of an intrinsic property by a subject entails a change in that subject. Moreover, accidental properties are distinguished from essential properties such that if a subject were to acquire or lose an accidental property, the subject would still be a member of its species. However, if a subject were to acquire a new essential property or lose an essential property, that subject would no longer be a member of its species. Thus, statements such as, “God is P,” where P is an intrinsic accidental property would be ruled out by divine simplicity. For example, the statement, “Kofi Annan is good,” means that some property goodness is a property of Kofi. When one says, “God is good,” it would appear that this statement means that some property goodness is a property of God. But if the doctrine of divine simplicity is true, it is impossible that God have the intrinsic accidental property of goodness. Rather, God is goodness. That is, God’s essence includes goodness and God is identical with his essence. Consequently, whenever someone applies a positive attribute to God they are speaking falsely, for God does not have properties in the way that creatures have properties. Although divine simplicity is a doctrine associated with medieval thinkers, it has been defended in the twentieth century by Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann, among others.

2. Solutions to the Problem

Historically, there have been at least four different solutions to the problem of religious language. Although no single solution has been widely accepted by the philosophical community, some of the solutions have fallen into disrepute.

a. Statements about God are Meaningless

Some philosophers have argued that statements about God do not have truth-values and are thus meaningless or unintelligible. These claims are derived from the views of the Vienna Circle, a group of early twentieth century logical empiricists who developed a test for the truth-value of statements known as Verificationism.

Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970) argued that the only way one could be certain of a statement’s truth or falsity was by verifying those statements through perceptions, observations, or experience. He offers the following example of the process by which a statement could be verified:

Let us take the statement P1: “This key is made of iron.” There are many ways of verifying this statement: for example,: I place the key near a magnet; then I perceive that the key is attracted.

Here the deduction is made in this way: Premises: P1: “This key is made of iron”; The statement to be examined. P2: “If an iron thing is placed near a magnet, it is attracted;” this is a physical law, already verified.

P3: “This object – a bar – is a magnet;” statement already verified.

P4: “The key is placed near the bar;” this is now directly verified by our observation.

From these four premises we can deduce the conclusion: P5: “The key will now be attracted by the bar.”

This statement is a prediction which can be examined by observation. If we look, we either observe the attraction or we do not. In the first case we have found a positive instance, an instance of verification of the statement P1 under consideration; in the second case we have a negative instance, an instance of disproof of P1. (Carnap 1966, 208).

Having established the principle of verification, Carnap then argues that metaphysical assertions such as, “The principle of the world is water,” cannot be verified. (Ibid. 210). Since metaphysical assertions cannot be verified, they are meaningless. One cannot assess the truth-value of a metaphysical assertion because such assertions cannot be empirically verified.

A.J. Ayer (1910-1989) agreed with Carnap, and thus inferred that since all statements about God cannot be verified, they too are meaningless, “But the notion of a person whose essential attributes are non-empirical is not an intelligible notion at all. We may have a word which is used as if it names this ‘person,’ [God] but, unless the sentences in which it occurs express propositions which are empirically verifiable, it cannot be said to symbolize anything.” (Ayer 1946, 144). Thus, on the basis of Verificationism, statements about God do not have truth-values that can be verified and, thus, are unintelligible expressions. So at least one solution to the problem of religious language is to claim that statements about God are unintelligible.

But Verificationism was challenged by philosophers such as Alonzo Church and Richard Swinburne and largely abandoned in the twentieth century. A.J. Ayer identified and defended a “weak principle of verification” in his seminal paper, “The Principle of Verifiability.” He admitted that empirical propositions are not conclusively verifiable, but argued that in order for a claim to be factual, and thus to have its truth-value determined, it must be verifiable by some possible observations. (Ayer 1936, 199). While Ayer didn’t specify exactly what those possible observations must be, he argued that they need to be the kinds of observations that could verify an assertion.

In response, Richard Swinburne argues that the premises defending weak Verificationism are false. He offers the following example of an argument in defense of weak Verificationism: “It is claimed that a man could not understand a factual claim unless he knew what it would be like to observe it to hold or knew which observations would count for or against it; from which it follows that a statement could not be factually meaningful unless there could be observational evidence which would count for or against it.” (Swinburne 2000, 151).

Swinburne then argues that the premise of the above argument is false, since one could understand a statement if one understands the words forming that statement and if those words are organized in a grammatically significant format. Thus, there could be factual statements that do not have evidence either for or against them and one could understand them. Consequently, metaphysical assertions invoking God and his properties cannot be ruled out as meaningless by weak Verificationism.

Ayer modified his principle of verification for the second edition of his book, Language, Truth and Logic, as follows:

A statement is directly verifiable if it is either itself an observation-statement, or is such that in conjunction with one or more observation-statements it entails at least one observation-statement which is not deducible from these other premises alone; and I propose to say that a statement is indirectly verifiable if it satisfies the following conditions: first, that in conjunction with certain other premises it entails one or more directly verifiable statements which are not deducible from these other premises alone; and secondly, that these other premises do not include any statement that is not either analytic, or directly verifiable, or capable of being independently established as indirectly verifiable. (Ayer 1946, 13).

In a review of the second edition, Alonzo Church argued that even according to Ayer’s revised principle of verification, any statement whatsoever or its negation is verifiable:

For let O1, O2, O3 be three “observation-statements” (or “experiential propositions”) such that no one of the three taken alone entails any of the others. Then using these we may show of any statement S whatever that either it or its negation is verifiable, as follows. Let -O1 and –S be the negations of O1 and S respectively. Then (under Ayer’s definition) -O1O2 v O3–S is directly verifiable, because with O1 it entails O3. Moreover S and -O1O2 v O3–S together entail O2. Therefore (under Ayer’s definition) S is indirectly verifiable – unless it happens that -O1O2 v O3–S alone entails O2 , in which case –S and O3 together entail O2 , so that –S is directly verifiable. (Church 1949, 53).

Church’s objection was so devastating, that Ayer’s definition of verifiability from the second edition of his book was largely abandoned. Despite repeated attempts by various thinkers such as Kai Neilson to reformulate a principle of verification successfully, Verificationism has been continually rejected as an inadequate methodology. As Ruth Weintraub points out in a recent paper, almost no one defends Verificationism in the twenty-first century. (Weintraub 2003, 83).

b. Other Possible Solutions: An Overview

There are at least three solutions to the problem of religious language other than the view that statements about God are meaningless. The first solution argues that when terms are used to describe God and his attributes, those terms are equivocal with respect to what they mean in reference to God and what they mean in reference to creatures. Consequently, this solution would argue that God is not good in the same sense in which Kofi is good; God’s goodness is entirely different from the goodness of a creature. Despite this tremendous difference in kind, God can be spoken of by human beings through negations. Rabbi Moses ben Maimon (Maimonides) (1135-1204) is one of the most famous proponents of this doctrine. He argued for this position in his Guide for the Perplexed. His view has been defended in the twentieth century by, among others, Harry Austryn Wolfson (1887-1974) and Kenneth Seeskin (1947- ).

The second solution argues that when terms are used to describe God and his attributes, those terms are univocal with respect to what they mean in reference to God and what they mean in reference to creatures. This approach would argue that God is good in the same sense in which Kofi is good. In the contemporary literature William Alston argues that there are some concepts that can be applied univocally to God and to human beings, but he rejects a completely univocal solution.

The third solution argues that when terms are used to describe God and his attributes, those terms are used analogously. This solution argues that God is good in an analogous sense to Kofi’s goodness. “Good” applied to both God and to Kofi would signify the same thing, but in different modes. That is, when “good” is applied to Kofi it picks out a property of Kofi, but when “good” is applied to God, it refers to the unity that is God’s essence and not to an individual property. This approach provides a middle position between an equivocal solution and a univocal solution, since terms used analogously aren’t entirely equivocal nor are they entirely univocal; terms used analogously signify the same thing but in different modes. This is the approach of St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274). He defends this position in his Summa theologiae as well as his Summa contra Gentiles. The analogical approach as been defended in the contemporary literature by a number of philosophers, including Ralph McInerny (1929-).

i. Equivocal Language

Maimonides, like Aquinas, is committed to the doctrine of divine simplicity, as it is described in Section 1 above. It is for this reason that he rejects affirmative attributes with respect to God, with some exceptions. Although it is accurate to characterize Maimonides’ solution to the problem of religious language as equivocal, it certainly includes more than just equivocations. One can speak of God through negations. For example, one can say, “God is not dead,” in order to signify that God lives. One can speak of God also through naming the divine actions, such as, “God creates.” However, the Maimonidean attribute of action is not to be understood as identical with the Aristotelian accident of action. Attributes of action are understood to be events by Maimonides, while Aristotle (384-322 BCE) understands actions to be accidents or properties that inhere in a substance. Since Maimonidean attributes of action are not properties, they do not abrogate divine simplicity.

One might oppose Maimonides on this point by arguing that actions imply composition in their subject, and thus that they would abrogate divine simplicity. For example, in the statement, “Zayd stood,” the fact that Zayd stands shows that Zayd has a special feature, namely, the ability or power to stand. So the action of standing implies that Zayd has the power to stand. This ability introduces composition in Zayd in that it shows that Zayd is composed of “the power to stand” among all his other properties. Consequently, Maimonides would be mistaken in arguing that actions do not introduce composition in their subject. In fact, it looks as if each action will introduce a separate power in the agent, thus multiplying the composition in the agent. So for every divine action, God will have a separate power in himself.

Maimonides addresses this objection by arguing that multiple actions could be brought about by a single power or ability. (Maimonides 1966, Vol. I, 53). He uses the example of the heat generated by a fire, which can burn, blacken wood, cook food, and so forth. So, one should not assume that a multiplicity of actions entails a multiplicity of powers in the agent. In the fire example, the heat of the fire produces multiple actions. The same could be said about an agent who acts by virtue of his will. Consequently, Maimonides argues that God brings about multiple actions and effects through his will, which is contained in his essence but not as a property, and that the multiplicity of effects or actions does not entail a multiplicity of powers in God.

According to Maimonides, predicates such as qualities or relations are to be denied of God. For example, one should say, “God is not a body,” but one cannot say correctly, “God is merciful.” While there are biblical passages that contain some of these imperfections, they are written in the language of human beings. Maimonides attempts to interpret these passages to eliminate or to deny the imperfections. His foundational assumption is that these passages do not ascribe to God anything that could be viewed as a deficiency. For example, passages that refer to God’s “body parts” are to be interpreted as indicating God’s actions. Maimonides argues that when the Bible indicates that God has an eye, “eye” indicates the intellectual act of apprehension performed by God. This act of apprehension does not imply composition in God insofar as it is an attribute of action, so it can be attributed to God without compromising divine simplicity. Qualities that are attributed to God in the Bible, such as “merciful,” mean that God performs acts that resemble certain acts done by human beings out of a given quality such as mercy. But “merciful” does not indicate what God is like or what his nature is; “merciful” only refers to a certain kind of action. Taken as a quality, terms such as “merciful” are applied to God equivocally. So we cannot say that God has certain qualities such as “mercy” in the same sense in which we would say “Kofi is merciful,” because God’s simplicity precludes his having the quality of mercy. Nor can we speak of any relation of similarity between God and creatures. Relations are accidental properties and God does not have accidental properties. So any relation between God and another thing must be denied of God.

With respect to God, the so-called essential attributes (for example, living, existing, incorporeal, eternal, powerful, knowing, willing, and one) are interpreted equivocally. According to Maimonides, these attributes indicate composition in God and they purport to indicate a feature of God’s essence. In order to preserve divine simplicity, Maimonides interprets these attributes as signifying “the negation of the privation of the attribute in question” with respect to God. A privation is the absence of the existence of a habit. For example, blindness would be a privation of sight. So one could say, “The wall does not see.” Maimonides would not say that the wall is blind, because the only things that could be blind are those things that could or should have the capacity for sight. A wall never has the capacity for sight, although a wall is unseeing. So the negation of the privation of the attribute of seeing in the case of the wall indicates that the property of sight is not fittingly said of the wall, even in a negative sense. In the case of God, essential attributes are to be interpreted as indicating that those attributes are not fittingly said of God, even in a negative sense. For example, “God is living,” would be interpreted to signify, “God is not dead,” which is taken to mean that “dead” is not fittingly said of God. A similar procedure is to be followed for the other essential attributes, none of which are appropriately said of God, even in negations.

In summary, according to Maimonides, we can only say what God is not and what actions he performs. The standard objection to Maimonides’ solution is that it is incompatible with the religious practices and assumptions of his own tradition, Judaism, and with those of the other Western monotheisms. Aquinas argues that an equivocal approach to God would undermine religious practices. Any demonstration about God would be formally invalid, as it would include an equivocation. Any communication about God would be severely limited because we cannot make any affirmative claims about God or his nature. Given that the divine actions are named equivocally through a perceived similarity to creaturely actions, how can human beings know what they mean? Even through the divine actions, God is unknowable. Consequently, Aquinas argues that one should look for a means of naming God that does not fall prey to these problems and that is in keeping with religious practices. It is on this basis that he defends the way of analogy as a preferable solution.

It is important to note that Maimonides’ pessimism with respect to what can be said about God is derived largely from his metaphysical commitment to divine simplicity. If this commitment were removed, then Maimonides would have more latitude with respect to religious language. However, other religious doctrines in the Abrahamic traditions preclude a wholly univocal solution to the problem, as will become evident in the next section.

ii. Univocal Language

A modern proponent of univocity is William Alston. Alston, however, does not defend complete univocity, in which ordinary terms are used in the same sense of God and creatures, because he recognizes that divine otherness, especially divine incorporeality, would preclude complete univocity. (Alston 1989a, 65). However, he argues that two different things could possess the same abstract feature in different ways,

A meeting and a train of thought can both be “orderly” even though what it is for the one to be orderly is enormously different from what it is for the other to be orderly. A new computer and a new acquaintance can both be “intriguing” in a single sense of the term, even though what makes the one intriguing is very different from what makes the other intriguing. (Ibid., 66-67).

Having pointed out that two different kinds of things can possess the same abstract feature in different ways, Alston argues that God and human beings can possess the same abstract feature in different ways. For example, a human being can know a particular fact and God can know that same fact. But how God knows something or the way that God knows something will be different from the way that a human being knows something insofar as God is incorporeal, omniscient, and so forth. According to Alston, the difference in the way knowledge is acquired doesn’t prevent us from saying that the psychological concept, “knows p,” can be applied to both human beings and to God. Moreover, one can also apply functionalist concepts, which are concepts of a certain functional role in the psyche, to both human beings and to God. Alston offers the following description of functionalist concepts,

The concept of a belief, desire or intention is the concept of a particular function in the psychological economy, a particular “job” done by the psyche. A belief is a structure that performs that job, and what psychological state it is – that it is a belief and a belief with that particular content – is determined by what that job is . . . . Our ordinary psychological terms carry no implications as to the intrinsic nature of the structure, its neurophysiological or soul-stuff character. . . . Thus, on this view, psychological concepts are functional in the same way as many concepts of artifacts, for example, the concept of a loudspeaker. (Ibid., 67-68).

Since functionalist concepts are indifferent as to the nature of the structure of the psyche in which they inhere, it is possible to apply a functionalist concept to both a human being and to God in the same sense. According to Alston:

We can say of a human being that she will tend to do what she can to bring about what she recognizes to be best in a given situation, and we can take this tendency to be partly constitutive of the concept of recognizing something to be best. We can then formulate the divine regularities in tendency terms also. Thus it will be true of God also that if He recognizes that it is good that p He will tend to bring about p insofar as He can unless He recognizes something incompatible with p to be a greater good. (Ibid., 79).

Alston claims that this example illustrates his method of applying functionalist concepts to God and to human beings univocally. According to Alston, the tendency statements are true of God, but the core of common meaning between human beings and God is to be found in the concept of “recognizing something to be best.” Alston further claims that although both God and human beings can be said to perform the function “recognizing something to be best,” human beings do not always assess the situation correctly, but God does. Since God and human beings perform the same function, albeit in a different way, the functionalist concept “recognizing something to be best” can be applied truly to both entities with a common core of meaning. So it would be true to say of God that he recognizes something to be best and that this concept can be applied to him and to human beings in the same sense. Thus, Alston argues that functionalist concepts can be constructed in such a way that they apply in the same sense to God and creatures, and he identifies this position as “partial univocity.”

At least one of the limitations of Alston’s view is that the predicates that are frequently used of God in the historical religious traditions, for example, “good,” and that are applied also to human beings cannot be applied univocally to God; only constructed terms, for example, “recognizing something to be best,” could be applied univocally to God. Therefore, with respect to the historical religious traditions, Alston’s view is not of much help. A religious believer, for example, might ask herself the question whether or not God could be said truly to be good. Alston can’t provide an answer to this question, because he intentionally limits partial univocity to functionalist concepts. If goodness could be expressed in a functionalist concept such as “recognizing something to be best,” then God could be said truly to possess this predicate in the same sense as a human being who shares the same predicate. But functionalist concepts are descriptive of mental states and so one might wonder if the equation of goodness with a particular mental state is a sufficiently robust description of goodness.

Second, one might wonder why Alston believes that God performs the same functions as human beings, given divine otherness. Presumably, he would argue that mental states would be the same in two minds, regardless of how the minds are constructed or out of what materials they are constructed. Granting this point, on what basis does Alston reject complete univocity between the functionalist concepts of the two minds? If the nature and constituents of their minds does not prevent the two minds from having the same mental state, why would Alston deny that there is a complete univocity between them? Complete univocity is probably denied because of divine otherness. But divine otherness has to do with, for example, divine incorporeality. Divine incorporeality would impinge upon how God’s mind is constructed, but this would be irrelevant for the functionalist concepts. One wonders if Alston should be committed to a completely univocal view, given his account of functionalist concepts.

Given the limitations of Alston’s view and some of the unanswered questions that arise concerning it, it is appropriate to turn our attention to the third possible solution to religious language, which is the view of St. Thomas Aquinas.

iii. Analogical Language

Aquinas argues that the when terms are used to describe God and his attributes, those terms are used analogously. Thus, when the predicate “good” is applied to God, it doesn’t pick out a property that God has. Owing to divine simplicity, God does not have properties. When predicated of God, “good” refers to the unity that is God’s essence. So when “good” is attributed to God and to Kofi, it signifies the same thing in both attributions, but it signifies this thing in different modes.

Aquinas grounds his analogical approach in the causal relation that obtains between God and creatures. In his discussion of analogy, Aquinas outlines the following points:

1) Human beings name things as they know them (Aquinas, Ia,.13.1).
2) Human beings know God from creatures.
3) God causes the existence of creatures (Ibid., 12.8).
4) Creatures resemble God just as an effect resembles its agent cause.

On the basis of the resemblance between creatures and God, human beings can infer that certain perfections of created things are present in God and they can name these perfections. Thus, the foundation for an analogy of names between creatures and God is the causal relationship that holds between God and creatures. >

Aquinas affirms the principle that effects resemble their efficient or agent causes. His account of the similarity between an agent cause and its effect includes a shared form. According to Aquinas, there are at least two different kinds of forms: substantial forms and accidental forms. Substantial forms configure the matter or physical stuff in which they inhere. They contribute a set of essential properties to a substance, such as rationality. A substantial form is the essence of a substance, which is a matter-form composite such as a human being. Accidental forms are non-essential properties, such as perfections or qualities. Aquinas explains that creaturely perfections are associated with both substantial forms and accidental forms;

“God alone is good essentially. For everything is called good according to its perfection. Now perfection of a thing is threefold: first, according to the constitution of its own being; secondly, in respect of any accidents being added as necessary for its perfect operation […] Thus, for instance, the first perfection of fire consists in its existence, which it has through its own substantial form; its secondary perfection consists in heat, lightness and dryness […] This […] perfection belongs to no creature by its own essence; it belongs to God only, in Whom alone essence is existence; in Whom there are no accidents; since whatever belongs to others accidentally belongs to Him essentially, as, to be powerful, wise, and the like.” (Ibid., 6.3.).

According to Aquinas, there is a perfection associated with a thing’s substantial form and there are the added perfections that attach to the essence of a thing as accidents. In both cases, these perfections are derived from God. However, insofar as the shared forms are found in more eminent mode in God than in a creature, the creature will be less perfect than God. Consequently, the shared form cannot share a univocal name. However, the shared forms are not wholly different (otherwise they couldn’t be shared) and so they cannot share an equivocal name. Thus, Aquinas argues that the shared forms also share an analogical name, which would be neither univocal nor equivocal. So human beings can name God’s perfections by way of analogy, on the basis of the causal relationship that holds between God and creatures. It is on this basis that one could say, “God is good,” and, “Kofi is good,” where “good” is understood to be said truly of both God and Kofi, even though God is good essentially and Kofi possesses goodness only as an accidental property.

Despite the similarities that exist between God and creatures, there are many ways in which creatures do not resemble God. So when one names God, one must be cognizant of the differences between God and creatures as well as the similarities so that one does not make a false attribution to God. So although Aquinas thinks that God can be named on the basis of the resemblance that holds between him and creatures, Aquinas acknowledges that this resemblance is limited and that therefore not all terms that are correctly applied to creatures may be correctly applied to God. For example, any terms indicating corporeality cannot be applied to God since God is incorporeal.

In order to affirm the naming of God by analogy along with the doctrine of simplicity, Aquinas makes a distinction between the mode of signification of a name (modus significandi) and the thing signified by a name (res significata). This distinction is not made by Maimonides, so he is unable to use it in his attempt to provide a solution to the problem of religious language. Owing to divine simplicity, the divine names will be different in mode than the same names as applied to creatures. For example, when “good” is applied to a creature it will signify that the property “goodness” inheres in the creature. However, when “good” is applied to God it will signify that “goodness” is somehow included in God’s essence, but not as a property. The mode of signification of human language is inherently defective with respect to God since it always picks out predicates as accidental properties. God doesn’t have accidental properties. In contrast, the thing signified by names such as “good” belongs properly to God and more so to God than to creatures, since any goodness that could be found in a creature is derived from God as the creator. One could say, “Kofi Annan is good,” and one could say, “God is good,” where “good” is included in God’s essence in a higher mode and to a greater degree than the property “goodness” inheres in Kofi Annan.

One might think that with respect to perfection terms the thing signified would be applied univocally between God and creatures. But, according to Aquinas, things are named univocally when they have both the same name and the same definition of the name. The definition of the name would include both the mode of signification and the thing signified by the name. So in the case of perfection terms applied to God and to creatures, the thing signified by the name would be the same but the mode of signification would be different. So although the thing signified would be the same, the name would not be said univocally between God and creatures. God’s perfection isn’t a matter of quantity such that he just has more perfection than a creature does. The manner in which he possesses a given perfection is different from the manner in which a creature possesses that same perfection, since God is simple and creatures are not.

One might think that if we reject divine simplicity, all reasons for naming God analogically would disappear. But this isn’t quite right. As Alston points out, the problem of religious language can be generated by divine otherness. So even absent divine simplicity, Aquinas would be likely to argue for an analogy between creatures and God. However, Aquinas doesn’t limit his approach to religious language solely to analogies. He also approves of naming God by virtue of negations, but he doesn’t limit speech about God to negations.

Alston provides a recent objection to Aquinas’ analogical solution. He argues that serious problems arise in connection with the thing signified by the name, as Aquinas understands it. This is so because Aquinas is unable to specify completely God’s perfections. Moreover, he cannot make explicit what likeness holds between God and creatures because all names fall short of him. According to Alston, there are too many ambiguities in Aquinas’ view.

But Aquinas has an answer to this objection in his recourse to the principle that every effect is like its agent cause. Aquinas knows this principle in general based upon observations of other agent causes, such as artisans who craft artifacts, and he applies this principle to God by virtue of the arguments that God is the first efficient (agent) cause. (Aquinas, Ia., 2.3). Thus, God cannot be wholly different from creatures in the way that Alston suspects.

Alston argues that since the thing signified by the name is indeterminate with respect to God, we cannot know, for example, what “God is good” means. But Aquinas would take issue with the inference from the first claim to the second, on the grounds of the relationship between created effects and God. Perfections such as goodness are found both in the created effect and in God, but in God they are found in a different mode and to a greater degree. So “God is good” is not meaningless nor is it the case that we do not know what “God is good” means. We know that goodness is found in God somehow, in a different mode and to a different degree. So “God is good” is a true statement. In fact, “good” is said primarily of God, rather than creatures, because “good” is given to creatures via the causal relationship. The thing signified by “good” is indeterminate in the sense that we do not know exactly to what degree it is found in God, except that the mode is different and the degree is greater than that found in creatures. But this degree of indeterminateness does not entail the kind of agnosticism about the divine attributes that Alston suggests. Consequently, Alston’s objection is unsuccessful.

Despite the virtues of Aquinas’ approach to naming God, there are some obvious drawbacks for his view. In particular, his view requires a medieval metaphysics that most contemporary philosophers would find questionable. For example, he believes in a causal relation between creatures and God. However, in comparison with the other two solutions and their respective disadvantages, Aquinas makes a strong case in favor of his view.

3. Conclusion

With respect to the problem of religious language, multiple solutions have been suggested and defended. Four of these solutions have been presented in this entry. The first solution suggests that all statements about God are meaningless. The second solution suggests that all attributes predicated of God are to be interpreted equivocally. The third solution suggests that the attributes predicated of God are to be interpreted univocally. The fourth solution suggests that the attributes predicated of God are to be interpreted analogously.

While no single solution has emerged to the satisfaction of all religious communities or philosophers of religion, three of the historical solutions offer a way in which statements about God might be understood. Maimonides’ solution severely limits the degree to which human beings can speak about God. Alston’s solution raises at least two objections that require a satisfactory response and a possible modification of his proposal. Finally, the solution of Aquinas requires a medieval metaphysic in which one affirms the relation of creation between creatures and God, a foundation many contemporary individuals would reject. Consequently, there is much research and thought that is still to be done on the problem of religious language. The historical solutions offered here provide a tenuous beginning in that direction and show promise for the emergence of a satisfactory solution.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William P. “Religious Language.” In The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Religion. Ed. William J. Wainwright. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005. pp. 220-244.
  • Alston, William P. “Aquinas on Theological Predication: A Look Backward and A Look Forward.” In Reasoned Faith: Essays in Philosophical Theology in Honor of Norman Kretzmann. Ed. Eleonore Stump. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1993.
    • Alston provides several objections to Aquinas’ analogical solution to the problem of religious language.
  • Alston, William P. “Functionalism and Theological Language.” In Divine Nature and Human Language: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1989a.
  • Alston, William P. “Can We Speak Literally of God?” In Divine Nature and Human Language: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1989b.
  • Alston, William P. “Divine and Human Action.” In Divine Nature and Human Language: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1989c.
  • Aquinas, Saint Thomas. Summa Theologiae. Trans. by Fathers of the English Dominican Province. New York: Benziger Bros., 1948.
    • Aquinas’ most famous work, which summarizes his views on a variety of theological and philosophical topics.
  • Aristotle. Categories and On Interpretation. Trans. Hugh Tredinnick. Loeb Classical Library. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1938.
    • Two of Aristotle’s logical works, which include discussions of actions, accidents, logic and the truth-conditions of assertions.
  • Ayer, A. J. “The Principle of Verifiability.” In Mind. vol. 45, no. 178 (Apr 1936), pp. 199-203.
    • Ayer’s defense of weak Verificationism.
  • Ayer, A. J. “God-Talk is Evidently Nonsense.” In Philosophy of Religion. Ed. Brian Davies. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000. pp. 143-147.
    • In this extract from his book, Language, Truth and Logic, Ayer argues that since assertions about God cannot be empirically verified that they are therefore meaningless.
  • Ayer, A. J. Language, Truth and Logic. 2nd ed. New York: Dover Publications: 1946.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. “Philosophy and Logical Syntax: Part I.” In 20th-Century Philosophy: The Analytic Tradition. Ed. Morris Weitz. New York: The Free Press, 1966. pp. 207-219.
    • Carnap’s groundbreaking lecture on Verificationism and its implications for metaphysics.
  • Church, Alonzo. “Review of A.J. Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic, Second Edition,” in Journal of Symbolic Logic. vol. 14, no. 1, (March 1949), pp. 52-53.
  • Konyndyk, Kenneth. “Verificationism and Dogmatism” in International Journal for Philosophy of Religion. vol. 8, no. 1 (1977), pp. 1-17.
    • In this article, Konyndyk canvasses Kai Neilsen’s attempts to formulate a successful principle of verification and argues that each formulation is unclear and ambiguous.
  • Kretzmann, Norman and Eleonore Stump, Eds. The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Maimonides, Moses. The Guide of the Perplexed. 2 vols. Trans. Shlomo Pines. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963.
    • Maimonides’ famous work, which summarizes his views on a variety of theological and philosophical topics, and includes various polemics against Islamic theologians.
  • McInerny, Ralph. Aquinas and Analogy. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1996.
  • Neilsen, Kai. Contemporary Critiques of Religion. (London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1973).
    • In this work, Neilsen offers his own principle of Verification, which is subsequently criticized by Kenneth Konyndyk.
  • Seeskin, Kenneth. “Sanctity and Silence: The Religious Significance of Maimonides’ Negative Theology.” In American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly. 76 (2002): pp. 7-24.
  • Seeskin, Kenneth, Ed. The Cambridge Companion to Maimonides. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Stump, Eleonore and Norman Kretzmann. “Absolute Simplicity.” In Faith and Philosophy. 2, (1985), pp. 353-382.
    • A contemporary defense of the medieval doctrine of divine simplicity.
  • Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. New York: Routledge Press, 2003.
    • A contemporary articulation and defense of many of Aquinas’ most important views on topics both theological and philosophical, including an excellent treatment of Aquinas’ views on form.
  • Swinburne, Richard. “God-Talk is not evidently nonsense.” In Philosophy of Religion. Ed. Brian Davies. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000. pp. 147-152.
    • In this extract from his book, The Coherence of Theism, Swinburne argues that weak Verificationism is founded on a false premise.
  • Weed, Jennifer Hart. Creation as a Foundation of Analogy in Aquinas,” forthcoming in Divine Transcendence and Immanence in the Thought of St. Thomas Aquinas (Leuven: Peeters, 2006).
    • A contemporary analysis of Aquinas’ account of divine causality and the kind of resemblance that holds between creatures and their creator, with a brief discussion of how this resemblance functions in Aquinas’ method of naming God analogically.
  • Weed, Jennifer Hart. “Maimonides and Aquinas: A Medieval Misunderstanding?” In Revista Portuguesa de Filosofia. Forthcoming in 2006.
    • A contemporary comparison between Maimonides’ via negativa and Aquinas’ way of analogy, along with a re-examination of Aquinas’ alleged misunderstanding of Maimonides’ method.
  • Weintraub, Ruth. “Verificationism Revisited,” in Ratio. Vol. XVI, (March 2003), pp. 83-98.
    • In this paper, Weintraub points out that almost no one defends Verificationism in the contemporary philosophical community.
  • Wolfson, Harry Autryn. Studies in the History of Philosophy and Religion. Eds. Isadore Twersky and George H. Williams. 2 vols. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977.
    • A collection of Wolfson’s papers, primarily on Jewish philosophy and medieval philosophy.

Author Information

Jennifer Hart Weed
University of New Brunswick