Relativism

Relativism

Relativism is sometimes identified (usually by its critics) as the thesis that all points of view are equally valid. In ethics, this amounts to saying that all moralities are equally good; in epistemology it implies that all beliefs, or belief systems, are equally true. Critics of relativism typically dismiss such views as incoherent since they imply the validity even of the view that relativism is false. They also charge that such views are pernicious since they undermine the enterprise of trying to improve our ways of thinking.

Perhaps because relativism is associated with such views, few philosophers are willing to describe themselves as relativists. However, most of the leading thinkers who have been accused of relativism--for example, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Peter Winch, Thomas Kuhn, Richard Rorty, Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida--do share a certain common ground which, while recognizably relativistic, provides a basis for more sophisticated, and perhaps more defensible, positions.

Although there are many different kinds of relativism, they all have two features in common.

(1) They all assert that one thing (e.g. moral values, beauty, knowledge, taste, or meaning) is relative to some particular framework or standpoint (e.g. the individual subject, a culture, an era, a language, or a conceptual scheme).

(2) They all deny that any standpoint is uniquely privileged over all others.

It is thus possible to classify the different types and sub-types of relativism in a fairly obvious way. The main genera of relativism can be distinguished according to the object they seek to relativize. Thus, forms of moral relativism assert the relativity of moral values; forms of epistemological relativism assert the relativity of knowledge. These genera can then be broken down into distinct species by identifying the framework to which the object in question is being relativized. For example, moral subjectivism is that species of moral relativism that relativizes moral value to the individual subject.

How controversial, and how coherent, these forms of relativism are will obviously vary according to what is being relativized to what, and in what manner. In contemporary philosophy, the most widely discussed forms of relativism are moral relativism, cognitive relativism, and aesthetic relativism.

Author Information

Emrys Westacott
Email: westacott@alfred.edu
Alfred University
U. S. A.