Mulla Sadra (c. 1572—1640)

Mulla Sadra made major contributions to Islamic metaphysics and to Shi’i theology during the Safavid period (1501-1736) in Persia. He started his career in the context of a rising culture that combined elements from the Persian past with the newly institutionalized Shi’ism and Sufi teachings. Mulla Sadra was heir to a long tradition of Islamic philosophy that from the beginning had accommodated the speculations of Greek philosophers, especially Neoplatonic philosophers, for the purpose of understanding the world, particularly in relation to the creator and the Islamic faith. Islamic philosophy originated in the rational endeavours to reconcile reason and revelation though the results did not always satisfy theologians, but ironically widened the gaps between reason and revelation.

Mulla Sadra, too, was deeply concerned about both reason and revelation, and he tried a new way of reconciliation by openly employing a synthetic methodology in which mysticism played an important part. For him and his followers, human knowledge is tenable only as long as it goes back to the indirect grasp of reality which in itself is not subject to conceptualization.  Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra was dedicated to the traditional forms of logical arguments that are based on premises evident to the mind rather than on beliefs which come from religious faith and tradition. For example, his use of Qur’anic verses and religious ideas, though it is an important part of his system, is mainly confined to a secondary or supportive position. As for mysticism, the extensive use of mystical concepts and terminology is acceptable from the point of view of those thinkers who believe that mystical inspiration, intellectual intuition, and revelation, originate in one and the same source, hence their celebration of Mulla Sadra’s work as “prophetic philosophy.” As a result, the scope of Mulla Sadra’s work is wider than his predecessors. In addition to metaphysics, he wrote extensively on the Qur’an and the Tradition and no other major philosopher before him had been so productive in the field of religion.

While focusing on Mulla Sadra’s metaphysics including his ontology, epistemology, psychology, this article also brings to light the philosopher’s solutions to theological problems. Owing to these solutions, not only did Islamic philosophy manage to survive against religious and political odds, but also Shi’i theology never lost its foothold on the intellectual ground. Although the organic unity of Mulla Sadra’s system rests on all the various components of his thought, his independent works on exegesis, mystical treatises, and his commentaries on preceding philosophers, are outside the scope of this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Synthetic methodology
  3. Ontology
    1. Primacy of Being
    2. Gradation of Being
    3. The Absolute and the Relational
  4. Epistemology
    1. Mental Being
    2. Unity of the Knower and the Known
  5. Soteriological Psychology
    1. Substantial Motion and the Soul
    2. The End of the Human Soul
  6. Major Theological Issues
    1. The Essence and the Attributes
    2. Temporal Origin of the World
    3. Bodily Resurrection
    4. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood
  7. Commentaries on the Qur’an and Tradition
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Philosophical Works
    2. English Translation of Primary Literature
    3. Secondary Books in European Languages

1. Biography

Muhammad ibn Ibrahim ibn Yahya al-Qawami al-Shirazi, commonly known as Mulla Sadra, was born and grew up during the golden days of the Safavid period, Iran’s first Shi’ite dynasty (c. 1501-1736). As the only son of a noble family, he received both intellectual and financial support towards a good education that started in his home town, Shiraz, in southeastern Iran. Though Shiraz had a glorious past with regard to philosophy, in Mulla Sadra’s day it was not the best place for satisfying his intellectual desire.  In his quest for advanced religious and philosophical training he left Shiraz for Qazvin and then moved to Isfahan where he studied with the most eminent intellectual figures of the day, Mir Damad (d. 1631) and Shaykh Baha’̓i (d. 1576) who were also affiliated with the court of the Safavid King, Shah Abbas I (c. 1587-1629). While Mulla Sadra’s philosophical character evolved in conversation and debates with Mir Damad, he owed to Shayk Baha’i his broad knowledge of exegesis (tafsir), tradition (hadith), mysticism (irfan) and jurisprudence (fiqh).  There is yet no historical evidence that he ever studied with Mir Findiriski (d. 1640/1), the other leading intellectual of the time. However, the frequency of associating the two by scholars such as Henry Corbin (d. 1978) suggests an inclination on their part towards providing a perfect picture of the philosopher’s integration in the intellectual life of Isfahan with all the pivotal thinkers involved in shaping what has been called “the full flowering of prophetic philosophy” in Mulla Sadra’s hands (Nasr 2006).

In 1601, upon the death of his father, Mulla Sadra returned to Shiraz. Later he related his experience during the time spent in Shiraz in a doleful and critical voice denouncing the intellectual atmosphere of the city for being hostile, suppressive, and philistine with regard to philosophy (al-Asfar I 7). He decided to leave Shiraz for a life of solitude and contemplation in Kahak, a quiet village near the city of Qom. The peace and quiet of life in Kahak gave Mulla Sadra the opportunity to start the composition of his most foundational work, al-Hikmat al-muta ‘aliya fi’l-asfar al-’aqliyya al-arba (Transcendent Wisdom in the Four Journeys of the Intellect). There he also found some of his life-long students who became well-known scholars of their own time.

This period was followed by several journeys between Shiraz, Isfahan, Qom, Kashan, and most importantly, seven pilgrimages to Mecca. Apparently, this itinerant stage played an important part in his intellectual and spiritual growth that is also suggested by the “journey” metaphor in the title and divisions of al-Asfar. It was also during this period that Mulla Sadra accepted the invitation to teach at Khan School, which was built in Shiraz on the order of the new governor, Allahwirdi Khan, in Mulla Sadra’s honour and for the purpose of his lectures.

Mulla Sadra had a family of six children, three sons and three daughters. All his sons became scholars and his daughters were married to three of Sadra’s students whom he treated as family even prior to the marriages. We know that two of these students Muhsin Fayz Kashani  (d. 1679/80 ) and Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (d. 1661/2 ) succeeded their father-in-law as two influential figures of their time though different to him in their philosophical orientation and working under more pressure due to the growing antagonism to philosophy and mysticism under Shah Abbas II (c. 1642-1666).

The intellectual network consisting of Mulla Sadra, his teachers and students that was later dubbed “the School of Isfahan” was formed in a unique political and religious context. Philosophers such as Mir Damad and Mulla Sadra managed to get their voices heard by their contemporaries and posterities in spite of the conservative religiosity of the newly established Shi’ite rule partly owing to the religious and political state of affairs. Since the Safavids strove to establish their identity as a Persian-Shi’ite state in contrast to the Sunni caliphate of the Turks and Arabs, they were in need of philosophy as a stronghold of knowledge that could reinforce, not to say generate, power through systematic thought. At least during the formative and golden days of the Safavid period the attacks on philosophers targeted their Sufi leanings rather than their endeavours to reconcile metaphysics with Shi’ite theology.

A prolific writer, Mulla Sadra composed a large number of treatises on ontology, epistemology, cosmology, psychology, eschatology, theology, mysticism, the Quran and the Tradition. However, many of his philosophical and theological works are repetitions of or elaborations on chapters from his magnum opus al-Hikmat al-mutaliyah fi’l-asfar al-arba‘a al-‘aqliyyah, commonly referred to as al-Asfar that is printed in nine volumes. Rather than simply holding Mulla Sadra’s theses, the latter work is an encyclopaedia of different schools of Islamic philosophy and theology. With the exception of Risala-yi si asl (Treatise on the Three Principles) which is in Persian, he wrote all his works in Arabic that was the lingua franca of the Muslim world at that time. He also wrote extensive commentaries on the Qur ‘an and the tradition among which respectively al-Mafatihal-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible) and his voluminous commentary on the famous collection of Shi’ite tradition, Usul al-kafi by Kulayni (d.939) are the most important.

After a pious life of dedication to acquiring and expanding philosophy and Islamic sciences, Mulla Sadra died in Basra on the way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. His death was once believed to have occurred in 1640 with his body being buried in Basra. However,  modern scholarship offers new evidence, though not conclusive evidence, in support of the date of 1645 and his burial being in Najaf (Rizvi 2007 30).

2. Synthetic methodology

Mulla Sadra was determined to construct a spacious house of “transcendental philosophy” that could accommodate the apparently conflicting paths in Islamic history towards the ultimate wisdom. He was also heir to a long tradition of philosophy in Persia which had adopted the methodology of Greek philosophy and interpreted it not only in accordance with the Islamic faith, but also implicitly and partly in continuation of the antique Persian traditions. Similar to his past philosophical masters Ibn Sina (d. 1037) and Suhrawardi (d. 1191), but unaware of Ibn Rushd‘s (d.1198) criticism of Neoplatonism in Islamic philosophy, Mulla Sadra relied on Neoplatonic precepts which had been taken for Aristotelian ideas by preceding philosophers. In particular, he followed Suhrawardi by adopting a holistic method of philosophy in which reason is accompanied by intuition, and intellection is the realization of the quintessence of the human soul, with prophecy (nubuwwa) and sainthood (wilaya) as the noblest manifestations of it.  It is based on this holistic attitude that on the one hand, Mulla Sadra synthesizes the two main schools of Islamic philosophy, namely, the Peripatetic and Illuminationist schools, and on the other hand, bridges the gaps between philosophy, theology, and mysticism. While Mulla Sadra’s philosophical methodology is rational in the sense of building his arguments on premises that consist in evident propositional beliefs, he does not reduce philosophical process to mere abstract logical reasoning. The pivotal place of intuition in his philosophical methodology is especially reflected by the influence of Ibn Arabi (d. 1240) throughout his works and by the fact that he regarded Ibn Arabi’s writings as having a philosophical character with a “demonstrative force” (al-Asfar I 315). Whether we understand Mulla Sadra’s use of intuition as “a higher form of reason” in the Platonic sense (Rahman 1975, 6), or as a prophetic experience that turns philosophy into “theosophy” (Nasr 1997, 57), in reality there is no actual separation between reason and intuition in Mulla Sadra’s philosophy. Rather than considering ratiocination (that is, the process of exact thinking) and intuition as independent ways leading to different visions of the truth, for him they merge into one path complementing and completing each other.

Although no Islamic philosopher had ever announced reason and revelation, philosophy and prophecy in conflict with each other, in practice, several philosophical doctrines were regarded by theologians as blasphemous due to contradiction with the theological formulations of Quranic teachings. By synthesizing the findings of his predecessors and relying on his holistic methodology, Mulla Sadra addressed several controversial issues that had opened a wide gap between philosophy and theology, reason and faith. His conciliatory attitude is manifest in his writings that are replete with scriptural and theological references alongside and in harmony with the teachings of Ibn Sina, Suhrawardi, Ibn Arabi, and other Muslim thinkers.

3. Ontology

a. Primacy of Being

Although Aristotle identifies the external existence of a thing with its primary substance, he distinguishes between two questions we can ask with respect to everything: “What it is” and “whether it is (or exists)”. This conceptual distinction was later extended to the extra-mental realm of contingent beings by Islamic philosophers, most insistently Ibn Sina, and following him scholastic philosophers such as Aquinas (d. 1274). For Ibn Sina, essence, or quiddity (mahiyya), is universal in the mind while particular in the external world once being is bestowed on it by the Necessary Being who is identified with the God of Abrahamic faith. Except for God who exists in His own right, every other being is composed of essence and being, hence contingent in the sense of dependence on the Necessary Being for their existence.

The distinction was taken for granted after Ibn Sina but turned into a controversial issue when philosophers in the Illuminationist school questioned the external reality of being over and above essence. Suhrawardi and following him Mir Damad argued that being was only a mental construct and the distinction between essence and being was only possible in the conceptual domain. Since then, Islamic philosophers have roughly been categorized as adherents of either the primacy of essence or the primacy of being. Influenced by his philosophy master, Mulla Sadra started as an advocate of essentialism but soon diverged towards the opposite doctrine that he made famous as “the primacy of being” (asalat-i wujud). He built on this foundation the whole of his philosophical system.

Starting with the concept of being, Mulla Sadra attributes two major characteristics to it. Firstly, being is beyond logical analysis, hence indefinable, due to its simplicity and supra-categorical status. It is self-evident and prior to any other concept in the mind. Secondly, it is a univocal concept in the sense that it has one and the same meaning in all its applications, whether we apply it to God or to any other entity. The first characteristic seems to place being as such totally outside the grasp of discursive thought. The second one leaves the philosopher with the hope that in case he finds an alternative path towards being, he will be able to bridge the ontological gap made by certain theologians between the Creator and the created.

As for the reality of being in the external world, Mulla Sadra not only follows Ibn Sina in considering being as a reality, but adheres to his other master, Ibn’Arabi in considering being as the only reality, the doctrine which is commonly referred to as “the unity of being” (wahdat al-wujud). Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra’s ontological monism does not imply that essences are illusions, as it is held in radical forms of Sufism. For Mulla Sadra, though essences are not genuine in their existence, they still exist as delimitations of the Real Being that is the ground of all that exists. Using a poetic analogy, the indefinite Reality is a colorless light while essences are the colourful glasses through which the single light appears as diverse phenomena. Conceptual differentiation, without which thinking and speaking would be impossible, is owing to this semi-reality of essences. To sum up, while being is the principle of unity, essence or quiddity is the principle of difference.

Mulla Sadra has several arguments for the primacy of being and its unrivalled reality. The most comprehensive list of the arguments appears in his al-Mashair, a useful summary of his ontology, and several arguments are included in al-Asfar. For the premises of his arguments, Mulla Sadra relies on the classical understanding of essence as a universal without external effects within the mind. On this ground, the real horse can give you a ride while the universal horse in the mind is incapable of that because real particularity, external properties and real effects are owing to being and cannot be in the mind. In conclusion, being is the ground of reality, or better to say, reality itself, while essence only belongs to the conceptual realm and as Mulla Sadra put it “the term ‘existent’ is applied to essence only with respect to its relation to being [itself]” (al-Asfar VI 163).

b. Gradation of Being

The univocal concept of being applies to its instances in the same sense because of the unity of its reality, and conceptual differences are only due to essences. On the other hand, essences have no reality of their own. Based on these two premises, one could conclude that diversity is not real. Gradation, or modulation, of being (tashkik al-wujud) is Mulla Sadra’s way to avoid this counterintuitive result and to create a system in which the monistic worldview of Sufism is reconciled with the realistic pluralism of classical philosophy and our common sense. According to this doctrine, though one simple reality, being comes in grades, in a similar way that sunlight and candlelight are the same reality of different grades. In effect, there are only differences by degrees, while essences, as concepts in the mind, reflect gradations as contrasts. As Mulla Sadra put it,

The instances of being are different in terms of intensity and weakness as such, priority and posteriority as such; nobility and baseness as such, although the universal concepts applicable to it and abstracted from it, named quiddities, are in contrast essentially, in terms of genus, species, or accidents. (al-Asfar IX 186)

Before Mulla Sadra, Suhrawardi introduced the concept of gradation into the logic of definition and considered essence as capable of applying to instances by different degrees. For example, he regarded a horse more of an animal than a fly. His ontology was based on light as the hierarchical reality of universe with realms of existence as different ranks of it. Inspired by Suhrawardi’s challenge of classical philosophers such as Ibn Sina who would not allow gradation in the same essence, but in contrast to the former’s belief in the ontological primacy of essence or quiddity, Mulla Sadra replaced the hierarchical light of Suhrawardi with the hierarchical being. Accordingly, Reality is one and the same thing but possessed of different degrees of intensity, which justifies diversity within unity.

The doctrine of gradation not only supports the reality of diversity, but also points out the all-encompassing simplicity of being qua being. Hence the famous dictum that is frequently repeated in Mulla Sadra’s works, “the Simple Reality (basit al-haqiqa) is all things but none of those things in particular” (al-Asfar VI 111).

c. The Absolute and the Relational

Given that for Mulla Sadra reality consists in different grades of the same being, the nature of causality becomes an urgent question for him. Mulla Sadra’s formulation of causality reveals the strong influence of Ibn Arabi’s unity of being (wahdat al-wujud). Mulla Sadra begins with causality in the sense of existentiation (ijad) according to which contingent essences are brought into existence once their existence is necessitated by the Necessary Being. However, since in Mulla Sadra’s system, essences only belong in the conceptual domain, the relationship between cause and effect cannot be explained based on the metaphysical duality of being/essence. Therefore, he finally replaces this duality by the distinction he makes between two senses of being, the independent and the relational. At the cosmic level, the only independent being is the Absolute Being, while the rest, no matter of what intensity, are only relational.

Mulla Sadra’s introduction of this distinction into Islamic philosophy was inspired by the linguistic division between the meaning of “to be” in the sense of existence as a real predicate, and “to be” as a copula, the latter being nonexistent as a word in Arabic and only suggested though predication. Relational being is a “being-in-another” in the sense of being nothing other than a relation to another being. For example, in saying that “snow is white”, the predicative relation that is expressed by “is” has no existence apart from “snow” and “white”. Mulla Sadra regards all beings as nothing but an existential relation to the Absolute Being. For Him, “He is the Truth and the rest are His manifestations. He is the Light and the rest are the streaks of that Light…” (al-Masha’ir 450).

4. Epistemology

Mulla Sadra’s epistemology is not prior to but based on his findings about the nature of reality. Though this may sound like begging the question from the perspective of modern philosophy, it is consistent with the totality of Mulla Sadra’s system in which everything including knowledge itself is a form of being. It is for this reason that he studies knowledge as a subject of first philosophy, namely, the study of being qua being. He diverges from what he criticises in Ibn Sina as the negative process of abstraction (al-Asfar III 287) in favour of the positive presence of noetic or mental beings in the mind. For Mulla Sadra, knowledge is the realization of an immaterial being which corresponds to the extra-mental reality because it is the higher grade of the latter being.

Mulla Sadra’s main contribution to Islamic epistemology lies in his diversion from the Aristotelian dualism of subject and object, in other words, knower and the known (̒aqil wa ma’quil). He rejected the dominant theory of knowledge as the representation of the abstracted and universal form of particular objects to the mind. This innovation, though on a different ground and based on a different foundation, is comparable to the 20th century efforts made in the area of phenomenology and existentialism to get over the epistemological scepticism resulting from Cartesian dualism.

a. Mental Being

In classical Islamic epistemology knowledge is divided into “knowledge by presence” that consists only in the immediate access of the soul to itself in the sense of self-consciousness, and “knowledge by acquisition” that originates in sense perception and provides the subject with an abstracted representation of the external objects, that is, the intelligible universal at the level of intellect. In line with the Neoplatonic trend of thought adopted by Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra replaced representation by direct presentation (hudur). For Mulla Sadra, all knowledge is, at bottom, knowledge by presence because our knowledge of the world is a direct access to what is called mental beings.

In contrast to the Peripatetic mental form or concept as a universal produced by abstraction, mental being is an immaterial and particular mode of existence with a higher intensity than the external object corresponding to it. According to Mulla Sadra, mental being is the key to the realization of all levels of knowledge including sense perception, imagination, and intellection. Upon encounter with the external world, the soul creates mental beings in a similar manner that God creates the world of substantial forms both material and immaterial (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 43). Thus, rather than correspondence between the external object and its represented form in the mind, for Mulla Sadra the credibility of knowledge lies in the existential unity of  different grades of the same being, one created by the soul and the other existing in the external world.

Although the human soul has the potentiality of creating modes of existence also in the absence of the matter, as in the case of miracles, for the average human soul, as long as she lives in the material world, contact with matter is necessary for activating the creative process of generating mental beings. In this respect, Mulla Sadra’s epistemology should not be conflated with subjective idealism in that for him the physical being is a reality though of a lesser intensity than its counterpart in the soul.

b. Unity of the Knower and the Known

Mulla Sadra revolutionized epistemology with regard to the relationship between the knowing subject and her object based on the doctrine of the unity of the knower and the known previously held by the Neoplatonic Porphyry (d. 305) but strongly rejected by Ibn Sina.  Siding with the former, Mulla Sadra redefines the status of knowledge. Previously, mental form was defined as a psychic quality that occurs to the immaterial substance of the soul as a mere accident (̒arad), incapable of making any changes to the soul’s essence. Conversely, for Mulla Sadra, knowledge that is made up of mental beings functions as a substantial form that actualizes the potential faculties of the soul. Similar to form and matter in the physical world, there is no real separation between the knower (soul or mind) and the immediately known object of it, that is, the mental being. To put it in a nutshell, knowledge is a single reality that, in its potentiality, is called “the knower” (‘lim) or “the intellect” (‘aqil) while in its actuality, it is “the known” (ma’lum) or the “intelligible” (ma’quil). Owing to this unity, rather than being a fixed substratum for accidental mental forms, the mind in its reality is identical to the sum of all the mental beings that are realized in it. In other words, there is no such thing as an actual mind in the absence of knowledge.

This existential unification holds at all the levels of knowledge that is confined by Mulla Sadra to sense perception, imagination, and intellection. The faculty of sense perception is a potentiality of the soul that is unified with the perceptible forms (or beings) in the occasion of contact with the sensible world. Once sensible forms (beings) are realized, a higher grade of mental beings called “the imaginal beings” are actualized in unity with the imaginative faculty of the soul. The same unification holds at the level of intellection between the intelligible forms (beings) as the actual and the intellect as potential. From this level, the human soul is capable of acquiring higher degrees of knowledge that prepares her for the final unification with the Active Intellect that is the reservoir of all knowledge, and as a result, the activator of the human mind during the creative process of knowledge formation. This epistemic elevation is at the same time the journey of the soul towards higher grades of being and spiritualization.

5. Soteriological Psychology

In the pre-modern context, one should understand the term “psychology” in the sense of inquiry into the nature and mechanism of the metaphysical soul in its relation to the body. Moreover, informed by the Islamic doctrines and inspired by mysticism, Islamic philosophers regarded the human soul as capable of elevation through acquiring knowledge and spiritual practice. Mulla Sadra’s psychology is not an exception to this tradition; however, in his system, the human soul is given a more dominant role within the cosmic drama that unfolds along a salvific process of perfection.

a. Substantial Motion and the Soul

Mulla Sadra describes the soul as one simple but graded reality that in its unity includes diverse mental faculties. He also regards the soul as bodily in its origin, but spiritual in subsistence. This picture of the soul’s substance is unprecedented in the philosophy before Mulla Sadra. It is built on the doctrine of substantial motion that is one of the hallmarks of transcendental philosophy. According to this doctrine, all nature, including substances and accidents, is in motion. As bodily in its origin, the soul too moves from one form to another as long as it is living in this world. The substance of the soul is an existentially graded reality in which the changes take place through the superimposition of one form over the previous one rather than one replacing the other. Therefore, the unity of the soul is maintained despite the changes and her identity is preserved.

Though starting from the Aristotelian view of the soul as the form of the body, in his psychology, Mulla Sadra departs from the former in attributing to the human soul the power of growing out of the bodily attachment. Along with the expansion of knowledge and spiritual evolvement, the soul moves up to higher grades of being. The rational human soul is actualized when we reach maturity (around the age of forty), but this is not the end. At this stage, we are actually human but potentially angels or devils. 

b. The End of the Human Soul

For Mulla Sadra, the ultimate happiness of the human souls is to join in the beatific life of the Intellects. This is in agreement not only with Aristotle’s definition of happiness, but also with a Neoplatonic doctrine according to which the individual souls are only particular determinations of the universal soul that descends to the imperfect level of nature by joining the bodies. Therefore, the individual human soul, though starting as a bodily being in the world, is still invested with an otherworldly spirituality due to the noble state of the universal soul before the descent. The inherent inclination toward reunion with the Active Intellect, that is, the realm of Divine Knowledge, puts the soul back on the “arch of ascent”. However, the ascent toward reunion is not guaranteed for each and every human soul since there are many phases that each soul should pass successfully in order to substantially evolve and reach up to higher ranks of being.

Mulla Sadra’s delineation of the soul’s journey resonates with ideas of Islamic mysticism which in turn is indebted for its theoretical formulation to Neoplatonic ideas. The title of his magnum opus, al-Asfar, together with its main divisions is a proof to the mystical attachment as the philosophical narrative unfolds in terms of the famous four journeys of the soul, namely, the quest in search of the ultimate Truth or God and the final reunion with Him. In al-Asfar, the first journey that is from the created to the Creator is devoted to the concept and reality of being. The second journey is from the Creator to the Creator through the Creator, and discusses essence. The third journey is from the Creator to the created with the Creator and is about God and His Attributes, and finally the journey from the created to the created with the Creator that is focused on the destiny of the humankind.

Furthermore, Mulla Sadra explains the afterlife of the human soul based on Ibn’Arabi’s metaphysics of imagination that introduces the imaginal world (̒alam al-mithal) in between the Intellectual realm on top and the material world at the bottom. In line with Ibn’Arabi and Suhrawardi, while in contrast to Ibn Sina, Mulla Sadra believes in a bipartite reality of imagination according to which imaginative forms can exist both as subjective, or attached to the human mind, and as objective, or independent, comprising the detached domain of imagination, that is, the imaginal world. The creative imagination of the human soul, which is the source of prophecy and miracles in this world, is also the key to the bodily resurrection of the soul in the next world. While in this world only the prophets and saints are capable of bringing their imagination into life, in the next world where the material bodies are no more existent, every soul will be capable of creating her imaginal body.

The bodily resurrection of the soul should not be conflated with any forms of reincarnation which is strongly rejected by Mulla Sadra. He uses the analogy of “reflections in the mirror” (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya, 126) to show the necessary correlation between the otherworldly body and the spiritual grade of the individual soul. Rather than transmigrating into another body, the soul creates its very own body that becomes an objective image of her intentions and deeds in the previous life. That is the reason why the lesser souls will be resurrected as animals while the noble ones will simply join in the life of Intellect with no bodies at all. Thus, the hierarchy of resurrected souls in the next world corresponds to the hierarchy of souls in this world. There is a subtle problem here concerning the nature of imagination and the “mirror-like” nature of the soul in terms of eschatology. Mulla Sadra’s use of mirror imagery with respect to other-worldly bodies is his response to Suhrawardi on the same issue and draws on the endeavours of Ibn’Arabi and his commentator Dawoud al-Qaysari (d. 1350) to solve an earlier problem in Islamic philosophy (Rustom 2007).

6. Major Theological Issues

Islamic philosophy is rooted in the early endeavours of Mu’tazilite theologians who borrowed the instrument of Greek logic and terminology in order to formulate the doctrines of faith in a manner palatable for human reason. Of primary importance was proof to the existence and oneness of God, the nature and function of His Attributes, and the nature and mechanism of prophecy. Not only have different schools of theology offered divergent solutions to theological problems, but also theology has been in conflict with philosophy over several key issues. One of the novelties of Mulla Sadra’s work was the systematic effort to resolve long-held conflicts between philosophers and theologians. Moreover, unlike his philosophical predecessors, he did not leave any religious doctrine to mere faith and believed in the possibility of rational explanation for all. His proof for the doctrine of bodily resurrection is a good example of this positive attitude. On the whole, Mulla Sadra does not see a chasm between philosophy and theology; rather, his theology is both the continuation and the ultimate result of his philosophical doctrines.

Mulla Sadra dismissed all the previous proofs to the existence of God as resting on wrong assumptions, or at best insufficient. He even criticised Ibn Sina’s “proof of the righteous” (al-Asfar VI 13) because of its reliance on the concept rather than the reality of being. However, Mulla Sadra’s proof, which he calls by the same name, shares the a priori character of Ibn Sina’s proof. An a priori proof (burhan-i limmi) does not infer the existence of the Creator (cause) from the existence of any particular created thing (effect). For Mulla Sadra, the “proof of the righteous” is called by this name because it has the privilege of arguing for the existence of God through God Himself. Based on Mulla Sadra’s ontology, the reality of being is necessary, and it is of different grades. The delimited and imperfect grades do not exist in their own right, but only as relations to the most perfect or Absolute Being. Therefore, the Absolute Being or God must necessarily exist. Starting from the reality of being, this argument infers the existence of God from God Himself because “the real being and the Necessary Being apply to the same thing”, that is, God (al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma’ad 30).

As for the oneness of God (tawhid), that is, the first article of faith in Islam, Mulla Sadra further relies on his ontological views to argue against both the intrinsic and extrinsic plurality with respect to God. His argument is based on the transcendental inclusiveness of the Absolute Being. God as the Absolute Being is a simple reality in the sense of being without parts while including all things. As the most intense and the only independent being, God is inclusive of every form of existence while excluding only the imperfections and contingencies. Therefore, to assume another being next to God would be logically absurd. In Mulla Sadra, the theological doctrine of Divine Oneness can be identified with the mystical-philosophical doctrine of the oneness of being that is the only way in which the oneness of God can be understood without wrongly imagining it as a numerical concept.

a. The Essence and the Attributes

The simplicity of the Absolute Being in the sense of being comprehensive of all is also the key to explaining God’s Attributes in relation to each other and to the Essence (dhat). Though the Attributes must be infinite in number and scope, human beings only know of a limited number of them through the Qur’an. The nature of Divine Attributes has been a subject of controversies between different theological schools. They differ over the objectivity of the Attributes in the sense of independence from God’s Essence. In al-Asfar and al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma ‘ad, Mulla Sadra has elaborated on several Attributes including Life, Knowledge, Will, Speech, Vision and Hearing. He tries to prove the reality of the Attributes in a way that would not defy the unity of God’s Essence. He resolves this theological paradox of diversity in unity with regard to God’s Essence by resorting to the simple reality of God’s Being. In a similar way to the unity of the soul with the diverse psychic properties like knowledge and will, all the Attributes of God are not only unified with the Essence, but unified with each other. The corollary to this conclusion is that, in its ontological unity with the infinite and necessary Reality of God, each Attribute must be infinite and necessary. For example, God has necessary and infinite knowledge of all. According to Mulla Sadra, God knows the world through the knowledge of Himself and as his Essence includes all, he has knowledge of all without any limits. Nevertheless, the objects of divine knowledge exist at the level of Essence in a state of existential togetherness (wujud al-jam’i) with a higher grade of being than their existence as distinct essences in the created world. This is the way Mulla Sadra tried to resolve a long-held conflict between philosophy and theology regarding God’s detailed knowledge of the world. In a similar fashion, Mulla Sadra redefines other Attributes of God in the context of transcendental philosophy with the hope of reconciling philosophy with theology.

b. Temporal Origin of the World

One of the earliest and harshest theological indictments of Islamic philosophy was carried out by the Ash’arite theologian, Abu Hamid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazzali, (d. 1111) in his al-Tahafat al-falasifa (The Inconsistency of Philosophers). One of the most important faults he finds in philosophers such as Ibn Sina is the doctrine of the eternity of creation. According to this doctrine that was accepted by all Peripatetic philosophers the universe was created in eternity, which means that creation had no beginning in time. This doctrine has been criticised by theologians due to its conflict with the scriptural picture of creation, both in the Bible and the Qur’an.

Mulla Sadra takes a middle path between reason and revelation by resorting to his doctrine of substantial motion. According to Mulla Sadra, every particle of nature is in constant motion along their timeline which he regards as the fourth dimension of the bodily substance. Motion is not an accidental property given to nature over and above its substance; rather, it is essential to it and caused at the same ‘time’ with the creation of the bodily substance. Motion is by definition temporal, and substantial motion is the renewal of every particle of nature in time. Thus, Mulla Sadra concludes that every particle of nature is being recreated at every moment, which is the meaning of temporal origination. The world as a whole is nothing more than its parts, so the origination of the whole world in time is an absurd question.

c. Bodily Resurrection

Bodily resurrection is an article of Islamic faith that is regarded by theologians as a requisite for the fulfilment of the scriptural promises and threats regarding reward and punishment in the next world. As a theological issue, bodily resurrection has caused serious conflicts between philosophy and theology particularly following Ghazzali’s criticism of Ibn Sina on this issue. According to Ibn Sina, bodily resurrection is a matter of faith that Muslims must believe in, but from a logical point of view, it is impossible.

Mulla Sadra follows Ghazzali in holding that scepticism over bodily resurrection is not acceptable from either the religious or logical point of view (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya 125). However, he reinterprets bodily resurrection in terms of the imaginative creation of the otherworldly body by the soul. Though immaterial, the imaginal body is possessed of the three dimensions of the physical body that make it subject to a variety of feelings similar to our dream-world experiences. This will especially serve the purpose of punishment for the imperfect souls who spoiled the prospect of an intellectual/heavenly life through their carnal obsessions in the previous world. Some souls may be pardoned after serving their time in Hell by God’s Grace and the intermission of angels and nobler souls. As for the others, they will stay in Hell with their imaginal bodies forever. Despite his efforts, Mulla Sadra’s picture of resurrection is not in complete conformity with that of theology. Especially, his intellectual Paradise is not different to that of the classical philosophers. Great souls are not satisfied with carnal pleasures even in this world, so their reward in the next world cannot be a carnal one.

d. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood

Influenced by Ibn ‘Arabi’s doctrine of “the Perfect Human” and its incorporation into Shi’i imamate by Sayyid Haydar Amuli  (d. 1385), Mulla Sadra explains prophethood, imamate, and sainthood as related aspects of the same reality. Prophets, Imams, and Saints are instances of the category of the Perfect Human (al-insan al-kamil) whose soul is inclusive of the three levels of creation, that is, the intellectual, the imaginal, and the sensory worlds. Mulla Sadra, regards prophethood as “exoteric guidance” (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 492) which is necessary for the average people. Intellectual truths that are revealed to prophets through the unification of their intellect with the Angel of revelation, identical to the Active Intellect of philosophy, descend to the level of imagination and sense perception in order to be communicated to the people.

The esoteric side of prophecy is not only the innermost spiritual meaning of it, but also the purpose of creation. Although Muslims believe that Muhammad was the last prophet of God, according to Mulla Sadra, after the death of Muhammad, revelation continued in the form of inspiration that endows the Imam and Saint with the same infallibility as the Prophet.  Thus, the content of the divine communication is the same in all three, but the form is slightly different. Prophets have a clearer vision of the Angel of revelation in comparison to the Imams and Saints (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 480).

7. Commentaries on the Qur’an and Tradition

In many cases philosophers have resorted to the Qur’an in order to reinforce their philosophical arguments. On the other hand, there is a long tradition of Qur’anic exegesis ranging from technical linguistic analysis to rational and esoteric hermeneutics (ta’wῑl) that comprises a sophisticated and independent discipline. Mulla Sadra is a special case as a philosopher who has dedicated independent treatises to Qur’anic commentaries. Moreover, there is a mutual reinforcement between his philosophy and his reading of the Qur’an in the sense that not only his approach to the Qur’an is philosophical, but also his philosophy has a Qur’anic base (Rustom 2012). Mulla Sadra does not see any conflicts between the teachings of the Qur’an and his philosophical system. Apart from several commentaries on chapters and verses from the Qur’an, Mulla Sadra also wrote about the theoretical and practical criteria of exegesis. His major theoretical work is Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible).

As for Mulla Sadra’s work on the tradition (hadith), his monumental commentary on al-Usul al-kafi by Kulayni  is the most important. Kulayni’s work is the first Shi‘i collection of Hadith and focuses on theology and jurisprudence. It has served as a textbook at the religious seminaries around the Shi’i world for centuries, and Mulla Sadra’s commentary on this work has secured him a good place among the experts in Hadith scholarship.

8. Legacy

Mulla Sadra’s influence on his immediate students, including his sons-in-law, Fayz Kashani and Lahiji, owed more to the mystical aspect of his works. As for his philosophical doctrines, he was only followed by the less famous among his students such as Husayn Tunikabuni  (d.1693). Especially, in the late Safavid period due to the intellectually suppressive atmosphere created by influential clerics, most prominently Muhammad Baqir Majlisi (d. 1198), philosophical and particularly mystical thoughts were antagonized by the ruling system and the clerics alike.

Nevertheless, the legacy of the philosopher was kept alive until, in the Qajar period (c. 1785-1925), a more welcoming attitude facilitated the revival of his works in the hands of his followers who worked as Sadrian scholars. In addition to editing and expounding the latter’s works, as teachers they also initiated a chain of scholars that has continued until today. Among contemporary scholars and Sadrian philosophers, Muhammad Husayn Tabataba’i (d. 1981) is one of the most widely read. His books, which are based on Mulla Sadra’s philosophy with some modifications, are still being taught as compendiums of Islamic philosophy at the departments of philosophy in Iran. Mulla Sadra studies particularly flourished after the Islamic Revolution of 1979. Since then, he has been widely taught both at the religious seminaries and universities with governmental funds supporting the foundation of institutes and international conferences. Among these, Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute, established in 1994 in Tehran, and the World Congress on Mulla Sadra in 1999 are the best examples.

After Mulla Sadra’s death, India was the first place outside Iran to show his influence. A remarkable number of expositions and commentaries have been written on one of his marginal works called Commentary on Sharh al-Hidayah in India where it has been taught as a course book of Islamic philosophy for several centuries. Later, the Shi’i seminaries of Iraq in the city of Najaf and some influential thinkers in Pakistan also welcomed Mulla Sadra’s philosophy.

Mulla Sadra was introduced into the West at the end of the nineteenth century by the German orientalist, Max Horten (d. 1945) with an emphasis on the mystical aspect of the philosopher’s work. Later during 1960′s and 70′s, the collaboration of the French scholar Henry Corbin (d. 1978) with Toshihiko Izutsu (d.1986 ) from Japan and Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) from Iran, led to a full-fledged introduction of Mulla Sadra into Western academia as part of a wider project of reviving “perennial wisdom”. Following their work, Mulla Sadra has been translated, taught, and discussed in academic journals and circles both in Europe and North America. The contemporary generation of Mulla Sadra scholars, though approaching Mulla Sadra from different points of view, are illuminating various aspects of the philosopher’s work.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Philosophical Works

  • Mulla Sadra, Risala-yi si asl. Seyyed Hossein Nasr (ed.). (Tehran: Mulla Sadra Research Institute, 1381AH solar).  
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-muta’aliya fi asfar al-aqliya al-arba’a. 5. Muhammad Reza Muzaffar (ed.). 9 vols. (Beirut: Dar al-ihya ‘ al-turath al-Arabi, 1999).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-’Arshiyya. Ghulam Ahani (ed.). (Isfahan: Isfahan University press, 1340 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh al-Hidaya.Ahmad Shirazi (ed.). (Facsimile repr. Qom: Intishsrat-i Bidar. 1313 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma’ad. Ahmad Hosseini Ardakani (ed.). (Tehran: Sitad-i Inqilab-i Farhangi, Markaz-i Nashr-i Danishgahi, 1983).
  • Mulla Sadra, Tafsir al-Qur’an al-karim. M. Khajavi (ed.). 7 vols. (Qom: Intisharat-i Bidar, 1988).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya. 3. Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1387 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Shawahid al-rububiyya. Javad Mosleh (trans.). (Tehran: Soroush Press, 2006).
  • Mulla Sadra, Majmu’a-yi rasa’il-i falsafi-yi Sadr al-muta’allihin. Hamid Naji Isfahani (ed.). (Tehran: Hikmat, 1385AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Masha’ir.Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1386 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Mafatih al-ghayb. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). (Beirut: Mu ‘assasat al-Tarikh al-Arabi, 2002 rpt).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh-i Usul al-Kafi. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). 4 vols. (Tehran: Pizhuhishgah-i Ulūm-i Insani va Mutala’at-i Farhangi, 2004).

b. English Translation of Primary Literature

  • Mahdi Dasht Bozorgi and Fazel Asadi Amjad, Divine Manifestations: Concerning the Secrets of the Sciences of Perfection (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • William Chittick, The Elixir of the Gnostics (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2003).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • T. Kirmani, The Manner of the Creation of Actions (Tehran: SIPRIn, 2004).
  • J. Lameer, Conception and Belief in Sadr al-Din Shirazi (Tehran: Iranian Academy of Philosophy, 2005).
  • Parviz Morewedge, The Metaphysics of Mulla Sadra: The Book of Metaphysical Prehensions (New York: Society for the Study of Islamic Philosophy and Science, 1992).
  • James Morris, The Wisdom of the Throne (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr and Ibrahim Kalin, Metaphysical Penetrations: A Parallel English-Arabic Text by Mulla Sadra (Provo: Brigham Young Press, 2013).
  • Latimah Peerwani, On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Qur ‘an (London: ICAS Press, 2004).
  • Colin Turner, Challenging Islamic Fundamentalism: The Three Principles of Mulla Sadra (London: Routledge, 2011).

c. Secondary Books in European Languages

  • Alparslan Açikgenç, Being and Existence in Sadra and Heidegger: A Comparative Ontology (Kuala Lumpur: International Institute of Islamic Thought and Civilization, 1993).
  • Reza Akbarian, The Fundamentals of Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Reza Akbarian, Islamic Philosophy: Mulla Sadra and the Quest of “Being” (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Cécile Bonmariage, Le Réel et les réalités: Mulla Sadra Shirazi et la structure de la réalité (Paris: Vrin, 2008).
  • Maria Massi Dakake,”Hierarchies of Knowing in Mulla Sadra’s Commentary on Usul al-Kafi.” Journal of Islamic Philosophy 6 (2010).
  • Mahdi Dehbashi, Transubstantial Motion and the Natural World (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Max Horten, Das philosophische System von Schirázi (Strasbourg: Trübner, 1913).
  • Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra. Jeff Fort (trans.). (New York: Zone Books, 2006).
  • Christian Jambet, Mort et résurrection en islam: L’audelàselon Mulla Sadra (Paris: Albin Michel, 2008).
  • Christian Jambet, Se rendre immortel (Saint Clémentde Rivière: Fata Morgana, 2002).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal. From Essence to Being: The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra and Martin Heidegger (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal, Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006).
  • Sayeh Meisami, Mulla Sadra (Oxford: Oneworld, 2013).
  • Mahmoud Khatami, From a Sadrean POint of View: Toward an Ontetic Elimination of the Subjectivistic Self (London: London Academy of Iranian Studies, 2004).
  • Megawati Moris, Mulla Sadra’s Doctrine of the Primacy of Existence ( KualaLumpur: ISTAC, 2003).
  • Zailan Moris, Revelation, Intellectual Intuition and Reason in the Philosophy of Mulla Sadra: An Analysis of the al-Hikmahal‘Arshiyyah (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr, Sadr al-Din Shirazi and His Transcendent Theosophy. 2nd ed. (Tehran: Institute for Humanities and Cultural Studies, 1997).
  • Fazlur Rahman, The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1975).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra Shirazi: His Life and Works and the Sources for Safavid Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra and Metaphysics: Modulation of Being (London: Routledge, 2009).
  • Mohammed Rustom, “Psychology, Eschatology, Imagination, in Mulla Sadra Shirazi’s Commentary on the Hadith of Awakening,” Islam & Science, vol 5 (summer 2007) No 1.
  • Mohammed Rustom, The Triumph of Mercy: Philosophy and Scripture in Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2012).
  • Mahdi Ha’iri Yazdi, The Principles of Epistemology in Islamic Philosophy: Knowledge by Presence (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992).


Author Information

Sayeh Meisami
Queen’s University School of Religion