Sāṅkhya (often spelled Sāṁkhya) is one of the major “orthodox” (or Hindu) Indian philosophies. Two millennia ago it was the representative Hindu philosophy. Its classical formulation is found in Īśvarakṛṣṇa’s Sāṅkhya-Kārikā (ca. 350 CE), a condensed account in seventy-two verses. It is a strong Indian example of metaphysical dualism, but unlike many Western counterparts it is atheistic. The two types of entities of Sāṅkhya are Prakṛti and puruṣa-s, namely Nature and persons. Nature is singular, and persons are numerous. Both are eternal and independent of each other. Persons (puruṣa-s) are essentially unchangeable, inactive, conscious entities, who nonetheless gain something from contact with Nature. Creation as we know it comes about by a conjunction of Nature and persons. Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇa-s or qualities. The highest of the three is sattva (essence), the principle of light, goodness and intelligence. Rajas (dust) is the principle of change, energy and passion, while tamas (darkness) appears as inactivity, dullness, heaviness and despair. Nature, though unconscious, is purposeful and is said to function for the purpose of the individual puruṣa-s. Aside from comprising the physical universe, it comprises the gross body and “sign-body” of a puruṣa. The latter contains among other things the epistemological apparati of embodied beings (such as the mind, intellect, and senses). The sign body of a puruṣa transmigrates: after the death of the gross body, the sign-body is reborn into another gross body according to past merit, and the puruṣa continues to be a witness through its various bodies. An escape from this endless circle is possible only through the realization of the fundamental difference between Nature and persons, whereby an individual puruṣa loses interest in Nature and is thereby liberated forever from all bodies, subtle and gross. Much of the Sāṅkhya system became widely accepted in India: especially the theory of the three guṇa-s; and it was incorporated into much latter Indian philosophy, especially Vedānta.

Table of Contents

  1. History
  2. Sāṅkhya’s Existential Quandary and Solution
  3. Epistemology
  4. Metaphysics
    1. Causality
    2. Prakṛti and the three guṇa-s
    3. Puruṣa
    4. Evolution, Humanity and the World
  5. Liberation
  6. References and Further Reading

1. History

The word “Sāṅkhya” is derived from the Sanskrit noun sankhyā (number) based on the verbal root khyā (make known, name) with the preverb sam(together). “Sāṅkhya” thus denotes the system of enumeration or taking account. The first meaning is acceptable, as Sāṅkhya is very fond of sets, often naming them as “triad,” “the group of eleven,” and so forth; but the second meaning is more fitting, as the aim of Sāṅkhya is to take into account all the important factors of the whole world, especially of the human condition.

Sāṅkhya has a very long history. Its roots go deeper than textual traditions allow us to see. The last major figure in the tradition, Vijñāna Bhikṣu, thrived as late as 1575 CE. Despite its long history, Sāṅkhya is essentially a one-book school: the earliest extant complete text, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā, is the unquestioned classic of the tradition. Not only are its formal statements accepted by all subsequent representatives, but also its ordering of the topics and its arguments are definitive – very little is added in the course of the centuries.

Besides its own author, Īśvarakṛṣṇa, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā itself names several ancient adherents of the school plus a standard work, the Ṣaṣṭi-Tantra (the book of sixty [topics]). The ancient Buddhist Aśvaghoṣa (in his Buddha-Carita) describes Arāḍa Kālāma, the teacher of the young Buddha (ca. 420 BCE) as following an archaic form of Sāṅkhya. The great Indian epic, the Mahābhārata, represents the Sāṅkhya system as already quite old at the time of the great war of the Bharata clan , which occurred during the first half of the first millennium BCE. Such textual evidence confirms that by the beginning of our era, Indian common opinion considered Sāṅkhya as very ancient. Moreover, Sāṅkhya concepts and terminology frequently appear in the portion of the Vedas known as the Upaniṣads, notably in the Kaṭha and the Śvetāśvatara. The older (6th cent. BCE?) Chāndogya Upaniṣad presents an important forerunner of the guṇa-theory, although the terminology is different. And before that, in the Creation-hymn of the Ṛg-Veda (X. 129) we find ideas of the evolution of a material principle and of cosmic dualism, in the company of words that later became the names of the guṇa-s.

Sāṅkhya likely grew out of speculations rooted in cosmic dualism and introspective meditational practice. The agriculturally-rooted concept of the productive union of the sky-god (or sun-god or rain-god) and the earth goddess appears in India typically as the connection of the spiritual, immaterial, lordly, immobile fertilizer (represented as the Śiva-liṅgam, or phallus) and of the active, fertile, powerful but subservient material principle (Śakti or Power, often as the horrible Dark Lady, Kālī). The ascetic and meditative yoga practice, in contrast, aimed at overcoming the limitations of the natural body and achieving perfect stillness of the mind. A combination of these views may have resulted in the concept of the puruṣa, the unchanging immaterial conscious essence, contrasted with Prakṛti, the material principle that produces not only the external world and the body but also the changing and externally determined aspects of the human mind (such as the intellect, ego, internal and external perceptual organs).

Both the agrarian theology of Śiva-Śakti/Sky-Earth and the tradition of yoga (meditation) do not appear to be rooted in the Vedas. Not surprisingly, classical Sāṅkhya is remarkably independent of orthodox Brahmanic traditions, including the Vedas. Sāṅkhya is silent about the Vedas, about their guardians (the Brahmins) and for that matter about the whole caste system, and about the Vedic gods; and it is slightly inimical towards the animal sacrifices that characterized the ancient Vedic religion. But all our early sources for the history of Sāṅkhya belong to the Vedic tradition, and it is thus reasonable to suppose that we do not see in them the full development of the Sāṅkhya system, but rather occasional glimpses of its development as it gained gradual acceptance in the Brahmanic fold.

From these and also from some quotations in later literature commenting on the tradition (first of all in the Yukti-dīpikā), a variety of minor variations and differing opinions have been collected that point to the existence of many branches of the school. The most significant divergence is perhaps the development of a theistic school of Orthodox Hindu philosophy, called Yoga, which absorbs the basic dualism of Sāṅkhya, but is theistic, and thus regards one puruṣa as a special puruṣa, called the Lord (Īśvara).

According to the Indian tradition, the first masters of Sāṅkhya are Kapila and his disciple Āsuri. They belong to antiquity (and sometimes, prehistory) and are known only through ancient legends. Another putative ancient master of Sāṅkhya, Pañcaśikha, seems to be more historical, and may have been the author of the original Ṣaṣṭi-Tantra. Other important figures in the tradition, frequently referred to and also quoted in the commentaries, include Vārṣagaṇya, and Vindhyavāsin, who may have been an older contemporary of Īśvarakṛṣṇa.

Around the beginning of our era, Sāṅkhya became the representative philosophy of Hindu thought in Hindu circles, and this probably explains why we find it everywhere – not only in the epics and the Upaniṣads but also in other important texts of the Hindu tradition, such as the dharmaśāstra-s (law-books), medical treatises (āyurveda) and the basic texts of the meditational Yoga school. And in fact much of the philosophy of Yoga (as formulated by Patañjali ca. 300 CE) is considered by several modern scholars as a version of Sāṅkhya.

Of Īśvarakṛṣṇa we know nothing; he may have lived around 350 CE, in any case after the composition of the foundational text of the Nyāya school of Indian philosophy, known as the Nyāya-Sūtra, and before the famous Buddhist philosopher, Vasubandhu. Īśvarakṛṣṇa’s work, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā consists of 72 stanzas in the āryā meter. Perhaps some of the verses were added by a student, but most of the work clearly tells of a single, philosophically and poetically ingenious hand. Unlike the (older) sūtras (aphorisms) of other systems, which are often cryptic and ambiguous, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā is a clear composition that is well ordered and argued. It is stated in the last stanza that it is a condensation of the whole Ṣaṣṭi-Tantra, leaving out only stories and debates. And in fact Īśvarakṛṣṇa never refers to the theses of other systems, nor to differences within the school. He purposefully avoids all points of conflict: he is either silent about them or uses ambivalent expressions. It is perfectly clear that he wanted to write the common standard for the whole school, acceptable to all adherents to the philosophy; and he succeeded. The Kārikā ousted all previous Sāṅkhya writings, of which only stray quotations remain. The presentation given below will thus follow this work very closely.

Many commentaries were written on the Kārikā, mostly simple explanations of the text, and very similar to each other (the better known are Gauḍapāda’s Bhāṣya, Māṭhara’s Vṛttiand Śaṅkarācārya’s Jaya-Maṅgalā — this Gauḍapāda and Śaṅkarācārya are generally thought to be different from the famous Advaitins of the same name). By far the most important and also longest commentary is the Yukti-dīpikā, “Light on the arguments” written perhaps by Rājan or Rājāna around 700 CE. This commentary discusses different positions within the school (and is therefore our most important historical source for old Sāṅkhya) and debates with other schools over many fundamental points of doctrine. It follows the polemical style of writing in the early classical schools, with heavy emphasis on epistemological issues. Unfortunately this text received very little response in classical times; in fact it was hardly known outside Kashmir. One of the reasons for this may be the extreme popularity of another commentary, Vācaspati Miśra’s Sāṅkhya-Tattva-Kaumudī, or “Moonlight of the Principles of Sāṅkhya,” (circa 980 CE). This commentary, although incomparably simpler, still follows mature classical philosophical style, and was written by a master of all philosophies, respected for his works on all major schools. It was the starting point of a tradition of sub-comments continuing to the present day.

Besides the Kārikā there are two other important foundational texts of Sāṅkhya. The cryptic, half page long Tattva-Samāsa-Sūtra (Summary of the Principles) is very old at least in some parts, but no Sāṅkhya author mentions it before the 14th century. It is only a list of topics, but a list quite different from the categories of the Kārikā; it has several commentaries, the best known is the Krama-Dīpikā, “Light on the Succession.” The other text is the well-known, longish Sāṅkhya-Sūtra, which plainly follows the Kārikā in most respects but adds many more illustrative stories and polemics with later philosophic positions. It is markedly atheistic and makes arguments against the existence of God. It appears first in the 15th century and is probably not very much older. It has attracted a commentary by Vijñāna Bhikṣu, the eminent Vedāntist of the 16th century, entitledSāṅkhya-Pravacana-Bhāṣya or “Commentary expounding Sāṅkhya.” He also authored a small systematic treatise, the Sāṅkhya-Sāra (The Essence of Sāṅkhya). He introduced several innovations into the system, notably the idea that the number of the qualities is not three but infinite and that the guṇa-s are substances, not qualities.

2. Sāṅkhya’s Existential Quandary and Solution

The first premise of Sāṅkhya is the universal fact of suffering. There are many practical ways to ward off the darker side of life: such as self-defense, pleasures, medicine, and meditation. But, according to Sāṅkhya, all of them are of limited efficacy and at best can offer only temporary relief. The refuge offered by traditional Vedic religion is similarly unsatisfactory—it does not lead to complete purification (mainly because it involves bloody animal sacrifices), and the rewards it promises are all temporary: even after a happy and prolonged stay in heaven one will be reborn on Earth for more suffering.

Therefore the solution offered by Sāṅkhya is arguably superior: it analyzes the fundamental metaphysical structure of the world and the human condition, and finds the ultimate source of suffering, thereby making it possible to fight it effectively. Cutting the root of rebirth is the only way to final emancipation from suffering, according to Sāṅkhya.

Sāṅkhya analyzes the cosmos into a dualistic, and atheistic scheme. The two types of entities that exist, on Sāṅkhya’s account, are Prakṛti or Nature and puruṣa-s or persons. Nature is singular, but persons are numerous. Both are eternal and independent of each other.

Creation as we know it comes about by a conjunction of these two categories. Nature, though unconscious, is purposeful and is said to function for the purpose of the individual puruṣa-s. Aside from comprising the physical universe, it comprises the gross body and “sign body” (or “subtle body”) of a puruṣa. The sign body of a puruṣatransmigrates: after the death of the gross body, the sign body is reborn in another gross body according to past merit. An escape from this endless circle is possible only through the realization of the fundamental difference between Nature and persons, whereby an individual puruṣa loses interest in Nature and is thereby liberated forever from all bodies, subtle and gross. Characteristic of Sāṅkhya is a metaphorical but consistent presentation of the puruṣa as a conscious, unchangeable, male principle that is inactive, while Nature is the unconscious, forever changing, female principle that is active, yet subservient to the ends of the puruṣa. This is reminiscent of the cosmic dualism in Indian religions such as Tantrism, where the spiritual supreme male God mates with his female Śakti (Power) resulting in creation.

Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇa-s or qualities. The highest of the three issattva (essence), the principle of light, goodness and intelligence. Rajas (dust) is the principle of change, energy and passion, while tamas (darkness) appears as inactivity, dullness, heaviness and despair. Prakṛti as unmanifest, pure potentiality is the substrate of the whole world, while in her manifest form she has twenty-three interdependent structures (tattva-s). Of the latter the highest is intellect or buddhi: it is not conscious, but through its closeness to puruṣa it appears to be so. The others are egoism, mind, senses, biological abilities, the sensibilia like color and the elements (earth etc).

3. Epistemology

Sāṅkhya recognizes only three valid sources of information: perception, inference and reliable tradition. The ordering is important: we use inference only when perception is impossible, and only if both are silent do we accept tradition. A valid source of information (pramāṇa) is veridical, yielding knowledge of its object. Perception is the direct cognition of sensible qualities (such as color and sound), which mediate cognition of the elements (such as earth and water). Perception, on the Sāṅkhya account, is a complex process: the senses (such as sight) cognize their respective objects (color and shape) through the physical organs (such as the eye). And these senses are themselves the objects of cognition of the psyche (which in turn is comprised of three faculties—the mind (manas), the intellect (buddhi), and the ego (ahaṁkāra). The mind for its part internally constructs a representation of objects of the external world with the data supplied by the senses. The ego contributes personal perspective to knowledge claims. The intellect contributes understanding to knowledge. The puruṣa adds consciousness to the result: it is the mere witness of the intellectual processes. According to a simile, thepuruṣa is the lord of the house, the tripartite psyche is the door-keeper and the senses are the doors.

For Sāṅkhya , perception is reliable and supplies most of the practical information needed in everyday life, but for this very reason it cannot supply philosophically interesting data. Things that can be seen are not objects of philosophical inquiry. There are many possible reasons why an existent material object is not (or cannot be) perceived: it may be too far (or near), or it is too minute or subtle; there may be something that obstructs perception; it may be indistinguishable from other surrounding objects or the sensation produced by another object may be so strong as to overweigh it. A fault of the sense-organs or an inattentive mind can also cause a failure of perception.

For philosophy, the central source of information is inference, and this is clearly emphasized in Sāṅkhya. Īśvarakṛṣṇa appears to recognize three kinds of inference (SK 5b) (as evidenced by his clear reference to the Nyāya-Sūtra 1.1.5): cause to effect, effect to cause and analogical reasoning. The first two types are based on the previous observation of causal connections. Therefore they cannot lead us to the sphere of the essentially imperceptible. Thus all metaphysical statements are based on analogical inference—such as: the body is a complex structure; complex structures, like a bed, serve somebody else’s purpose; so there must be somebody else (the puruṣa) that the body serves. Of course the analogies utilized are themselves analogies of the causal relation; so it would be a little more appropriate to say that they are analogical reasonings from the effect to the cause, but traditionally the three classes of inference are considered mutually exclusive.

The two members of an inference are the liṅga, ‘sign’ (the given or premise) and theliṅgin, ‘having the sign’, i.e. the thing of which the liṅga is the sign (the inferred or conclusion).

The last valid source of information, āpta-vacana, literally means reliable speech, but in the context of Sāṅkhya it is understood as referring to scriptures (the Vedas) only. While the validity of scriptural authority is affirmed, its importance is downplayed: they are never used to derive or confirm philosophical theses.

4. Metaphysics

Sāṅkhya is very fond of numbers, and in its classical form it is the system of 25 realities (tattva-s). In standard categories it is a dualism of puruṣa (person) and Prakṛti (nature); but Prakṛti has two basic forms, vyakta, “manifest,” and avyakta, “unmanifest,” so there are three basic principles. Puruṣa and the avyakta are the first two tattva-s; the remaining twenty-three from intellect to the elements belong to the manifest nature.

The relation of the unmanifest and manifest nature is somewhat vague, perhaps because there were conflicting opinions on this question. Later authors understand it as a cosmogonical relation: the unmanifest was the initial state of Prakṛti, where the guṇa-s were in equilibrium. Due to the effect of the puruṣa-s this changed and evolved the manifold universe that we see, the manifest. This view nicely conforms to the standard Hindu image of cosmic cycles of creation and destruction; but it is problematic logically (without supposing God) and Īśvarakṛṣṇa – without directly opposing it – does not seem to accept it. He says that we do not grasp the unmanifest because it is subtle, not because it does not exist; and that implies that it exists also at present, as an imperceptible homogenous substrate of the world.

It is a notable feature of Sāṅkhya that its dualism is somewhat unbalanced: if we droppedpuruṣa from the picture, we would still have a fairly complete picture of the world, asPrakṛti is not inert, mechanical matter but is a living, creative principle that has all the resources to produce from itself the human mind and intellect. Sāṅkhya thus looks like a full materialist account of the world, with the passive, unchanging principle of consciousness added almost as an afterthought.

a. Causality

According to Sāṅkhya, causality is the external, objective counterpart of the intellectual process of inference. As Sāṅkhya understands itself as the school of thought that understands reality through inference, causality plays a central role in the Sāṅkhya philosophy. According to Sāṅkhya, the world as we see it is the effect of its fundamental causes, which are only known through their effects and in conjunction with a proper understanding of causation.

The Indian tradition conceives of causality differently from the recent European tradition, where it is typically regarded as a relation between events. In the Indian tradition it rather consists in the origin of a thing. The standard example of the causal relationship is that of the potter making a pot from clay, where the cause par excellence is taken to be the clay. The Sāṅkhya analysis of causation is called sat-kārya-vāda, or literally the “existent effect theory,” which opposes the view taken by the Nyāya philosophy. Perhaps sat-kārya is better rendered as “the effect of existent [causes]”; it stands for a moderate form of determinism. In the commentaries it is normally explained as the view that the effect already exists in its cause prior to its production. Understood literally, this is not tenable—if the cause existed, why was it not perceived prior to the point called its production? Rather the theory states that there is nothing absolutely new in the product: everything in it was determined by its causes.

The following five considerations are used in an argument for the sat-kārya-vāda: (a) the nonexistent cannot produce anything (given the assumed definition of “existence” as the ability to have some effect); (b) when producing a specific thing, we always need a specific substance as material cause (such as the clay for a pot, or milk for curds); (c) otherwise everything (or at least anything) would come into being from anything; (d) the creative agent (the efficient cause) produces only what it can, not anything (a potter cannot make jewelry); (e) the effect is essentially identical with its material cause, and so it has many of its qualities (a pot is still clay, and thus consists of the primary attributes of clay). This last argument is utilized to determine the basic attributes of the imperceptible metaphysical causes of the empirical world: the substrate must have the same fundamental attributes and abilities as the manifest world.

b. Prakṛti and the three guṇa-s

The term “prakṛti” (meaning nature and productive substance) is actually used in three related but different senses. (1) Sometimes it is a synonym for the second tattva, called“mūla-prakṛti” (root-nature), “avyakta” (the unmanifest) or “pradhāna” (the principal). (2) Sometimes it is paired with “vikṛti” (modification); “prakṛti” in this sense could be rendered as “source.” Then the unmanifest is prakṛti-only; and the intellect, the ego and the five sense qualities are both prakṛti-s and vikṛti-s – thus producing the set of eight prakṛti-s. (The remaining sixteen tattva-s are vikṛtis-only, while the first tattva, the unchanging, eternal puruṣa is neither prakṛti nor vikṛti.) (3) And in most cases, “prakṛti” means both the manifest and the unmanifest nature (which consists of the twenty-fourtattva-s starting from the second).

Prakṛti” is female gendered in Sanskrit, and its anaphora in Sāṅkhya is “she,” but this usage seems to be consistently metaphorical only. Prakṛti, in its various forms, contrasts with puruṣa in being productive, unconscious, objective (knowable as an object), not irreducibly atomic, and comprised of three guṇa-s.

The unmanifest form of Prakṛti contrasts with the manifest form in being single, uncaused, eternal, all-pervasive, partless, self-sustaining, independent and inactive; it is aliṅgin (known from inference only). Ironically, all these attributes with the exception of singleness also characterize the puruṣa, thus some ancient Sāṅkhya masters did call thepuruṣa also avyakta (unmanifest).

Sāṅkhya analyzes manifest Prakṛti—the world, both physical and mental—into three omnipresent aspects, the guṇa-s. This is one of Sāṅkhya’s main contributions to Indian thought. “Guṇa” variously means ‘a thread, subordinate component, quality or virtue. Here it is not just any simple quality but rather a quite complex side or aspect of anything materially existent. (The puruṣa has no guṇa-s.) The guṇa-s cannot be understood as ordinary qualities: their names are nouns, not adjectives; they are not simple, and they don’t have degrees; they themselves have qualities and activity; they interact with each other; they do not have a substrate or a substance distinct from themselves to inhere in. But neither are they substances: they cannot exist separately (in every phenomenon all the three guṇa-s are present), they are not spatially or temporally delimited, they do not have separate individuality, and they can increase or decrease gradually in an object.

They are generally characterized as the real actors, even in mental phenomena such as cognition; they are the substrata for each other and they are interrelated in various ways. They “subdue, give birth to and copulate with” each other. In other words, they compete but also combine with each other, and they can even produce each other. They cooperate for an external purpose (the puruṣa’s aim) like the parts of a lamp – the wick, the oil and the flame.

Their names are quite obscure, perhaps intentionally: they resist any facile simplistic interpretation, forcing us to understand them from their description instead of the literal meaning. The name of the first guṇa, “sattva,” means sat-ness, where the participle “sat” means being, existent, real, proper, good. “Sattva” is additionally often used for entity, existence, essence and intelligence. Sattva is light (not heavy). Its essence is affection, its purpose and activity is illuminating. “Rajas,” the name of the second guṇa, means atmosphere, mist, and dust. Rajas is supportive like a column but also mobile like water. Its essence is aversion, its purpose is bringing into motion and its activity is seizing. The name of the third guṇa, “tamas,” means darkness. Tamas is heavy and covering. Its essence is despair, its purpose is holding back, and its activity is preservation.

In more modern terms, these three guṇa-s may be paraphrased as coherence / structure / information / intelligence (sattva); energy / movement / impulse / change (rajas); and inertia / mass / passivity / conservation (tamas). The depth of this analysis is the extent to which it grasps the structure of both the external and the internal world.

c. Puruṣa

Puruṣa,” the name of the first tattva (reality) literally means “man” in Sanskrit (though it often is used for the wider concept of person in Sanskrit and the Sāṅkhya system, as the Sāṅkhya system holds that all sentient beings are embodied puruṣa-s: not simply male humans). In the Sāṅkhya philosophy, “puruṣa” is metaphorically considered to be masculine, but unlike our concept of virility it is absolutely inactive. It is pure consciousness: it enjoys and witnesses Prakṛti’s activities, but does not cause them. It is characterized as the conscious subject: it is uncaused, eternal, all-pervasive, partless, self-sustaining, independent. It is devoid of the guṇa-s, and therefore inactive and sterile (unable to produce). It can be known from inference only. As puruṣa is essentially private for every sentient being, being their true self, there are many irreducibly distinct puruṣa-s. If Prakṛti is equated with Matter, puruṣa may be equated with the soul. If Prakṛti is equated with the World, puruṣa may be equated with the (true) self. If Prakṛti is understood as Nature, puruṣa can be understood as the person.

As the immaterial soul, puruṣa is not known through direct perception. Five arguments are given to prove its existence. (1) All complex structures serve an external purpose, for instance, a bed is for somebody to lie on; so the whole of nature, or more specifically the body – a very complex system – must also serve something different from it, which is thepuruṣa. (2) The three guṇa-s give an exhaustive explanation of material phenomena, but in sentient beings we find features that are the direct opposites of the guṇa-s (such as consciousness or being strictly private), and thus they need a non-material cause, which is the Puruṣa. (3) The coordinated activity of all the parts of a human being prove that there is something supervising it; without it, it would fall apart, as we see in a dead body, hence the puruṣa must exist. (4) Although we cannot perceive ourselves as puruṣa-s with the senses, we have immediate awareness of ourselves as conscious beings: the “enjoyer,” the experiencing self is the puruṣa. (5) Liberation, or the separation of soul and matter, would be impossible without their being separate puruṣa-s to be liberated, thus puruṣa-s must exist.

An important difference between schools of Indian philosophy that recognize mokṣa(liberation) as an end is the accepted number of souls. In Buddhism there is no separate soul to be liberated. In Advaita Vedānta, there is one common world-soul, and individuality is a function of the material world only. Sāṅkhya adduces three arguments to prove that there is a separate puruṣa for each individual: (1) Birth, death and the personal history of everybody is different (it is determined by the law of karma, according to our merits collected in previous lives). If there were one puruṣa only, all bodies should be identical or at least indistinguishable for the function of the self orpuruṣa is to be a supervisor of the body. But this is clearly not so. Hence, there must be a plurality of distinct puruṣa-s. (2) If there were only one puruṣa, everyone would act simultaneously alike, for the puruṣa is the supervisor of the body. But this is clearly not so. Hence, there must be a plurality of distinct puruṣa-s. (3) If there were only onepuruṣa, we would all experience the same things. However, it is evident that the opposite is true: our experiences are inherently diverse and private, and they cannot be directly shared. Hence, there must be a separate puruṣa for us all.

In time, it became difficult to follow most of the arguments given above: if puruṣa is really inactive, it cannot supervise anything, and cannot be the source of our individual actions. Also if puruṣa has no guṇa-s (qualities), one puruṣa cannot be specifically different from another. These problems perhaps grew under the influence of the concept of the absolutely unchanging and quality-less spiritual essence elaborated in Vedānta philosophy and were thus, arguably, not part of the original Sāṅkhya philosophy. The influence of Advaita Vedanta on Sāṅkhya seems to involve a reinterpretation of two attributes of puruṣa: inactivty came to be understood as unchangingness, while having no guṇa-s was taken to mean that it has no qualities at all.

The problem appears to have been first formulated by opponents in the Nyāya and Vedānta schools, and the author of the Yukti-dīpikā is also aware of it. The answer emerging, first in Vācaspati Miśra and then more elaborately in Vijñāna Bhikṣu, involves the innovation of the theory of “reflection”: as the image in the mirror has no effect on the object reflected and the mirror remains unchanged, but the image can be seen – so the unchanging puruṣa can reflect the external world, and the material psyche can react to this reflection. In responding to the problems brought about by the influence of Advaita Vedanta on Sāṅkhya, these authors appear to have responded by formulating a version of Sāṅkhya that comes fairly close to the superimposition theory of Advaita Vedānta, according to which an individual person is a cognitive construction that comes about by the error of mixing up the qualities of objects upon the quality of pure subjectivity. (For more on this issue, see Shiv Kumar pp. 39–43, 102–109, 250–253 and Shikan Murakami in Asiatische Studien 53, pp.645–665, who give insightful analyses of the problem in the classical schools.)

In Īśvarakṛṣṇa’s Sāṅkhya-Kārikā, however, the inactivity of the puruṣa does not seem to involve absolute incapability for change: the same word (a-kriya, “without activity”) is used also for the unmanifest nature, the substrate of all material manifestations. Arguably, it means only inability to move in space or to have mechanical effect. As it is clear from the above arguments, puruṣa is the determinative factor of our actions – and that presupposes that it changes in time (otherwise we would always do the same thing). So it must be the locus either of volition or of some hidden motivation underlying it. And although it is “a lonely, uninterested spectator, a witness unable to act,” it does like or dislike what it sees: it can suffer (this is, after all, the existential starting point for Sāṅkhya). It cannot be the locus of our whole emotional life (passions are explicitly said to reside in the intellect), but it must be considered the final source of our conscious feelings.

This is a controversial issue. Many modern scholars understand puruṣa as strictly unchanging; some of them (for example, A.B. Keith) are led by the inconsistencies following from this to consider Sāṅkhya as a hopeless bundle of contradictions. Larson (in Larson and Bhattacharya, pp. 79–83) translates “puruṣa” as “contentless consciousness;” it is not only unchanging but also timeless and outside the realm of causality (a somewhat Kantian concept). He tries to solve some of the difficulties by proposing that the multiplicity of puruṣa-s be understood as essentially epistemological in nature— and ontologically irrelevant.

d. Evolution, Humanity and the World

For Sāṅkhya, creation consists in the conjunction of the two categories of Prakṛti andpuruṣa(s). How this comes about is left somewhat of a mystery. As a result of this conjunction, the puruṣa is embodied in the world and appears to be the agent, and moreover Prakṛti seems to be conscious as it is animated by puruṣa-s. The relation between a puruṣa and Prakṛti, according to the Sāṅkhya-Kārika are like two men, a lame man and a blind man, lost in the wilderness; the one without the power of sight (activePrakṛti) carrying the cripple (conscious puruṣa) that can navigate the wild. Their purpose is twofold: the puruṣa desires experience—without blind nature, it would be unable to have experiences; and both Prakṛti and puruṣa desire liberation (in keeping with the simile, both nature and the person, the blind and the lame, desire to make their way home and part ways). Liberation is forestalled, on the Sāṅkhya account, because puruṣabecomes enamored with the beautiful woman, Prakṛti, and refuses to part ways with her.

The nature of the puruṣaPrakṛti connection is prima facie problematic. How can the inactive soul influence matter, and how could an unintelligent substance, nature, serve anybody’s purpose? Puruṣa is unable to move Prakṛti, but Prakṛti is able to respond topuruṣa’s presence and intentions. Prakṛti, although unconscious, possesses the capability to respond in a specific, structured way because of its sattva guṇa, the information–intelligence aspect of nature. The standard simile in the early Sāṅkhya tradition explains that as milk (an unconscious substance) starts to flow in order to nurture the calf, Prakṛtiflows to nurture puruṣa. In later texts, illumination and reflection are the standard models for this connection (puruṣa is said to illuminate Prakṛti, and Prakṛti reflects the nature of puruṣa), thus solving the problem of how Prakṛti and puruṣa can seemingly borrow eachothers properties without affecting eachothers essential state.

In consequence of Prakṛti’s connection with the soul, Prakṛti evolves many forms: the twenty-three tattva-s (realities) of manifest Prakṛti. The character of this evolution (pariṇāma) is somewhat vague. Is this an account of the origin of the cosmos, or of a single being? The cosmogenic understanding is probably older, and it seems to predominate in later accounts as well. In a pantheistic account the two accounts could be harmonized, but pantheism is alien from classical Sāṅkhya. Īśvarakṛṣṇa is again probably intentionally silent on this conflicting issue, but he seems to be inclined to the microcosmic interpretation: otherwise either a single super-puruṣa’s influence would be needed (that is, God’s influence) to account for how the universe on the whole comes about, or a coordinated effect of all the puruṣa-s together would be required—and there seems to be no foundation for either of these views Sāṅkhya.

The central mechanism of evolution is the complicated interaction of the guṇa-s, which is sensitive to the environment, the substrate or locus of the current process. Just as water in different places behaves differently (on the top of the Himalaya mountain as ice, in a hill creek, in the ocean, or as the juice of a fruit) so do the guṇa-s. In the various manifestations of nature the dominance of the guṇa-s varies—in the highest forms sattvarules, in the lowest tamas covers everything.

The actual order of evolution is as follows: from root-nature first appears intellect (buddhi); from it, ego (ahaṁkāra); from it the eleven powers (indriya) and the five sensibilia (tanmātra); and from the tanmātras the elements (bhūta).

The function of the buddhi (intellect) is specified as adhyavasāya (determination); it can be understood as definite conceptual knowledge. It has eight forms: virtue, knowledge, dispassion and command, and their opposites. So it seems that on the material plane,buddhi is the locus of cognition, emotion, moral judgment and volition. All these may be thought to belong also to consciousness, or the puruṣa. However, on the Sāṅkhya account, puruṣa is connected directly only to the intellect, and the latter does all cognitions, mediates all experiences for it. The view of Sāṅkhya appears to be that whensattva (quality of goodness, or illumination) predominates in buddhi (the intellect), it can act acceptably for puruṣa, when there is a predominance of tamas, it will be weak and insufficient.

The ego or ahaṁkāra (making the I) is explained as abhimāna—thinking of as [mine]. It delineates that part of the world that we consider to be or to belong to ourselves: mind, body, perhaps family, property, rank… It individuates and identifies parts of Prakṛti: by itself nature is one, continuous and unseparated. It communicates the individuality inherent in the puruṣa-s to the essentially common Prakṛti that comprises the psyche of the individual. So it has a purely cognitive and a material function as well—like so many principles of Sāṅkhya.

The eleven powers (indriya) are mind (manas), the senses and the “powers of action” (karmendriya), the biological faculties. The senses (powers of cognition, buddhīndriya) are sight, hearing, smelling, tasting, and touching—they are the abilities, not the physical organs themselves through which they operate. The crude names of the powers of action are speech, hand, foot, anus and lap. They symbolize the fundamental biological abilities to communicate, to take in or consume, to move, to excrete and to generate.

Manas” (often translated as “mind,” though this may be misleading), designates the lowest, almost vegetative part of the central information-processing structure. Its function is saṁkalpa—arranging (literally ‘fitting together’) or coordinating the indriya-s. It functions partly to make a unified picture from sense data, provided by the senses, and partly to translate the commands from the intellect to actual, separate actions of the organs. So, it is both a cognitive power and a power of action. (Later authors take “manas” to also designate the will, for saṁkalpa also has this meaning.)

Intellect, ego and mind together constitute the antaḥ-karaṇa (internal organ), or the material psyche, while the other indriya-s (powers) collectively are called the external organ. The internal organ as an inseparable unit is the principle of life (prāṇa). In cognition the internal organ’s activity follows upon that of the external, but they are continuously active, so their activity is also simultaneous. The external organ is strictly bound to the present tense, while the psyche is active in the past and future as well (memory, planning, and the grasping of timeless truths).

The material elements are derived from the gross, tamas-ic aspect of the ego, which yields what Sāṅkhya calls tanmātra-s (only-that, that is, unmixed). These in turn yield the elements (bhūta, mahā-bhūta). The elements are ether (ākāśa), air, fire, water and earth. The tanmātra-s seem to be uncompounded sensibilia; perhaps subtle elements or substances, each having only one sensible quality: sound, touch, visibility, taste and smell. The gross elements are probably fixed compounds of the tanmātra-s: ether has only sound, air also touch, fire is also visible, water has in addition taste and earth has all the five qualities.

Human beings are a compound of all these. At death we lose the body made up of the five gross elements; the rest (from intellect down to the tanmātra-s) make up the transmigrating entity, called liṅga or liṅga-śarīra (sign-body), often known in English translations as the “subtle body.” The puruṣa itself does not transmigrate; it only watches. Transmigration is compared to an actor putting on different clothes and taking up many roles; it is determined by the law of (efficient) cause and effect, known also as the law of karma (action).

The world, “from the creator god Brahmā down to a blade of glass” is just a compound of such embodied liṅga-śarīra-s. The gods are of eight kinds; animals are of five kinds – and humans, significantly, belongs to one group only (suggesting an egalitarianism with respect to humans). Of course, the gods of Sāṅkhya are not classical Judeo-Christian-Muslim God; they are just extra-long-lived, perhaps very powerful beings within the empirical world, themselves compounds of matter and soul.

5. Liberation

Because Prakṛti is essentially changing, nothing is constant in the material world: everything decays and meets its destruction in the end. Therefore as long as the transmigrating entity persists, the suffering of old age and death is unavoidable.

The only way to fight suffering is to leave the circle of transmigration (saṁsāra) for ever. This is the liberation of puruṣa, in Sāṅkhya, normally called kaivalya (isolation). It comes about through loosening the bond between puruṣa and Prakṛti. This bond was originally produced by the curiosity of the soul, and it is extremely strong because the ego identifies our selves with our empirical state: the body and the more subtle organs, including the material psyche. Although puruṣa is not actually bound by any external force, it is an enchanted observer that cannot take his eyes off from the performance.

As all cognition is performed by the intellect for the soul, it is also the intellect that can recognize the very subtle distinction between Prakṛti and puruṣa. But first the effect of the ego must be neutralized, and this is done by a special kid of meditational praxis. Step by step, starting from the lowest tattva-s, the material elements, and gradually reaching the intellect itself, the follower of Sāṅkhya must practice as follows: “this constituent is not me; it is not mine; I am not this.” When this has been fully interiorized with regard to all forms of Prakṛti, then arises the absolutely pure knowledge of the metaphysical solitude of puruṣa: it is kevala, (alone), without anything external-material belonging to it.

And as a dancer, after having performed, stops dancing, so does Prakṛti cease to perform for an individual puruṣa when its task is accomplished. She has always acted for thepuruṣa, and as he is no longer interested in her (“I have seen her”), she stops forever (“I have already been seen”)—the given subtle body gets dissolved into the root-Prakṛti. This happens only at death, for the gross body (like a potter’s wheel still turning although no longer impelled) due to causally determined karmic tendencies (saṁskāra-s) goes on to operate for a little while.

Puruṣa enters into liberation, forever. Although puruṣa and Prakṛti are physically as much in contact as before—both seem to be all-pervading in extension—there is no purpose of a new start: puruṣa has experienced all that it wanted.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Asiatische Studien / Études Asiatiques 53 (1999): 457–798.
    • Papers of an 1998 conference; allows a glimpse at the state of current researches.
  • Chakravarti, Pulinbihari: Origin and Development of the Sāmkhya System of Thought. Calcutta: Metropolitan Printing and Publishing House, 1951.
    • A detailed account giving due weight to the Yukti-dīpikā.
  • Chattopadhyaya, Debiprasad: Lokāyata. A Study in Ancient Indian Materialism. Delhi: People’s Publishing House, 1959.
    • A highly unorthodox approach utilizing anthropological and even archeological sources to understand the origins of philosophical thought.
  • Kumar, Shiv: Sāmkhya Thought in the Brahmanical Systems of Indian Philosophy. Delhi: Eastern Book Linkers, 1983.
    • Looks at Sāṅkhya tradition from the outside, especially as it appears in Nyāya and Vedānta.
  • Larson, Gerald James. Classical Sāmkhya. An Interpretation of its History and Meaning.Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1979.
    • The standard book on the Kārikā and a useful summary of its antecedents.
  • Larson, Gerald James, and Ram Shankar Bhattacharya, eds. Sāmkhya. A Dualist Tradition in Indian Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1987. (Vol. IV. inEncyclopedia of Indian Philosophies.)
    • A good description of Sāṅkhya followed by summaries of practically all surviving works.

Author Information

Ferenc Ruzsa
Eötvös Loránd University

Categories: Indian Philosophy