Philosophy of Architecture
The relation between philosophy and architecture is interrogative and propositional. It is about asking questions concerning the meaning of human habitation—what it means to live in built environs—and about evaluating plans and design projects where human flourishing and social progress can best occur—in what kinds of buildings, interior spaces and urban precincts. The following sets of questions address issues—aesthetic, ethical, and political issues, as well as metaphysical and epistemological concerns—that relate philosophy to architecture. Although philosophers and architectural theorists (and often design practitioners) can each be expected to have an interest in any or all of these questions, as scholars or public intellectuals of a kind, architectural theorists have played as much, if not more, of a role in shaping the field than philosophers have. There are historical reasons for this, having much to do with the origins and evolution of different academic disciplines and critical perspectives: the questions likely to be posed by one or the other, for a given period (or perennially in some cases) and the people most concerned to ask them. Here are the questions:
- What is the philosophy of architecture about? How is, how can, and how should philosophy be connected to architecture?
- How and in what ways is architecture concerned with aesthetics? How and in what ways is architecture concerned with ethics? Is there a connection?
- What are architecture’s relations to social and political concerns and what does this tell us about the knowledge and discipline of architecture?
The focus of the article is on aesthetic and ethical issues which are, on virtually all accounts, the mainstay of philosophy of architecture. A consideration of ethical issues in architecture in relation to the aesthetic ones quickly segues into architecture’s relation to social theory and political philosophy.
Table of Contents
- Architecture: Discourse and Practice
- Key philosophical Issues
- Philosophical Movements and Ideas in Architecture
- Post-structuralism and Power
- Selected Lines of Inquiry into Philosophy of Architecture
- References and Further Reading
The mixed character of architecture comes from it being a subject of overlapping philosophical and theoretical discourses as well as a category of creative practices. Philosophy of architecture has long been associated first and foremost with aesthetics. While architecture may be an art form, it is not a branch of aesthetics. In fact (or instead), a case can be made for relocating architecture, as philosophically considered, primarily, though by no means exclusively, within ethics and social and political philosophy. From a philosophical perspective, Winter’s (2001) survey article “Architecture” appears to be located where it belongs, in The Routledge Companion to Aesthetics rather than a volume on social and political thought or ethics. But from an architectural theorist’s point of view, or the viewpoint of a geographer or city planner, classifying architecture as a topic within aesthetics may seem too narrow or conforming. Of course, treating architecture within aesthetics does not preclude consideration of it from other points of view and it would be equally legitimate to have entries on architecture in companions to social philosophy or evolutionary psychology. Nevertheless, from these other points of view, placing the philosophy of architecture primarily in aesthetics is misleading. A survey of theory journals like Assemblage, Grey Room, or Architectural Theory Review shows that philosophy remains an important source of ideas and validation, but references to philosophical aesthetics are limited. The philosophical study of architecture raises questions in several philosophical sub-disciplines, and many design practitioners show a greater interest in ethical and political issues than aesthetic ones.
The question of where to place the philosophy of architecture is not simply a matter of preference or a topographical question of little importance. Instead, the issue can be linked to architectural practice in ways that enlarge our conceptions of architecture, architectural practice, and the architect. In any case, the question of where to locate the philosophy of architecture highlights significant differences between architectural theorists and philosophers, as to how to conceptualize, analyze, and address a range of topics of common concern.
While philosophers of art and aesthetics are still more likely to consider architecture than are social philosophers and ethicists, architectural theorists see the connection with ethics and social and political issues as more relevant and important. However, by considering the concerns of both philosophy and architectural theory, philosophy of architecture enlarges its conceptual and critical domain in ways that impact both philosophical and architectural theoretical approaches to architecture.
Architecture can and has been conceived as an intrinsically philosophical enterprise—grounded in aesthetics and ethics (incluing theories of human nature)—and also in elements of social and political philosophy. Architects, landscape architects, and designers are responsible for creating spaces and fashioning the world (materially and ideationally) in which people live and interact. In so doing they promote as well as undermine certain values, understandings, and ways of living.
One need not cite utopian characterizations of “the City” to make the point that architecture is concerned with material realizations of visions of the good and what it means to live well. Urban culture manifests itself in its architecture. Debates over the future and planning of the City, including schemes that either rehabilitate or disavow utopian traditions, reinforce this important role. Although Ballantyne and Winters both discuss the aesthetic evaluation of architecture at length, they both believe that “we should evaluate buildings according to how well they make possible desired forms of life” (Goldblatt and Paden 2011, 4). Thus, the final standard of architectural value for them is the ethical (Ballantyne 2011; Winters 2011).
Adopting a historical perspective for these concerns, in a 1949 editorial for the Architectural Review announcing a new feature of the review called the “Canon,” the editors (including Nikolaus Pevsner) bemoaned the fact that architectural theorists had long lacked the common source material “necessary for the construction of the framework within which any who are so disposed may begin to discuss the theory and philosophy of architecture.” They stressed the need for a theoretically informed architectural criticism, regarding it as essential to understanding and improving the then current state of architecture and the architectural profession in Britain.
The perceived absence of any such canon or framework for a theory and philosophy of architecture, may have undermined or hindered informed architectural criticism in Pevsner’s mind, but it has not stopped speculation on the nature of the relation between philosophy and architecture—including accounts that are quite general and self-aggrandizing. Mueller (1960, 39-43) described the relations as follows.
Both philosophy and architecture are edifying … [They] make possible all other values of life or all other arts … Architecture is their spatial, philosophy their spiritual home. In one and the same act, philosophy and architecture enclose man in their shell and structure, and disclose open vistas, new horizons, spiritual possibilities of expansion and self-realization … architecture [expresses] an underlying world-view, a cultural whole, the spirit of an epoch or a people, a dominant value of life—all transcriptions of philosophy… Philosophy and architecture have the coming task of healing the split of knowledge and feeling, of individual and community…
One source of Sigfried Giedion’s often quoted but obscure claim that the main task of architecture is “the interpretation of a way of life” valid for the times (1974, xxxiii) can be found in Immanuel Kant. Although Kant (“Analytic of the Beautiful” in The Critique of Judgment (1790)) claimed that function limits the potential beauty of buildings, he also claimed that beautiful art has “‘spirit’ by means of which ‘aesthetic ideas’ can be expressed” (Goldblatt and Paden 2011, 3). Presumably, it is this “expressive” dimension of architecture that Giedion has in mind. It is however one thing to say that architecture has an expressive dimension and another to suggest that a building is capable of expressing the spirit of an age.
Modern philosophical discourse on architectural practice can be traced to Kant, John Ruskin (1849), more directly to Martin Heidegger (1951), Pevsner (1936), Giedion (1974), and more recently to Roger Scruton (1979) and Karsten Harries (1997). (See Haldane 1999.) In the 20th century, the discourse has focused on architecture’s seeking to articulate its identity and special relevance by embodying or expressing the social, political, economic and personal character of the times. Other figures, from the philosophical side, include Warwick Fox (2000), Malcolm Budd (1995), Christine Smith (1992), and Tom Spector (2001). Among many widely discussed prominent architectural theorists and practitioners who have contributed to a philosophy of architecture are Vitruvius (First century Roman authority), Le Corbusier, Adolf Loos, Robert Venturi, Bernard Tschumi, Frank Gehry, and Daniel Libeskind.
The key underlying question for all of the preceding philosophers and architectural theorists and practitioners is “What is the philosophy of architecture about?” At the same time, we can also turn to ask “How is, how can, and how should philosophy be connected to architecture?” and both of these beg the question “What is architecture?”
The question “What is architecture?” has commonly focused first on how architecture is to be distinguished from “mere” building; and second, on its relation to art. Answers have often depended on how one has sought to reconcile or prioritize Vitruvius’s three elements of architecture: firmitas (durability, firmness), utilitas (convenience, commodity, practicality, function), and venustas (beauty, delight). Given the Vitruvian perspective, it is questionable whether these three elements could ever allow one to surmise, let alone deduce, fundamental architectural principles governing every significant work. It is doubtful that such principles could ever be extrapolated from observations of the material, functional or aesthetic attributes of a building—its “durability”, “convenience” or “beauty.” In any case, Vitruvius’s The Ten Books of Architecture (c. 15 B.C.E.), has been the most common source employed by architectural theorists and philosophers concerned with articulating the nature of architecture. (Spector (2001) structures his book around Vitruvius’s three elements.)
Whether, or to what extent, architecture is to be regarded as an art has long been disputed. One could perhaps just conceive of architecture as a craft pertaining to the fashioning of useful buildings. Nevertheless, Vitruvius, like most architectural theorists, sees the aesthetic (venustas) as essential to architecture. However, if architecture is an art, it is unusual and perhaps unique in that, unlike other art (music, sculpture, visual arts), utilitas (function) is also regarded as an essential part of architecture. While music, drama and the other arts, may serve many functions, including those that are purely aesthetic, and are “practical” in various ways, none of these functions are regarded as intrinsic to their status as an art or to their ontological status—that is, to what they are.
Functionality (utility, purpose, practicality, and so forth) is however, necessary to architecture. Graham (1989, 249) says “[A]esthetic functions in music and painting [and so forth] can be abandoned without loss to their essential character as worthwhile objects of aesthetic attention … But the same cannot be said for architecture. A building which fails in the purpose for which it is built [no matter how aesthetically pleasing] is an architectural failure, whatever other merits it may have.” Even those modernists who see form as preeminent and imply that the inverse of the adage holds true (that function must follow form) may agree with Graham on this. An aesthetically designed material arrangement that has no function or extra-aesthetic purpose may be regarded as a sculpture, and possibly even a “building.” However, on the accounts stemming in theory from Vitruvius, apart from it having some (not wholly aesthetic) function (utilitas), no matter how changeable (the functions of buildings may of course change) or nondescript, it cannot be regarded as architecture.
Given that the elements in the Vitruvian triad are all ingredient in architecture to some degree, the central issue concerning the nature of architecture often rests on determining which of these indispensable elements does or should take precedence and why. Given that the aesthetic (or aesthetic concern) is always necessary, though to what extent, and whether dictated primarily by form or function is disputed, the history of architectural theory can be seen as a debate between those who place emphasis on form rather than function or vice-versa. Graham (1989, 252-3) says “The philosophical dispute between the two lines of thought suggested here—function should determine form and form should determine function—is arguably the basis of the history of architecture in the last 120 years. It is around these themes that the differences between architects of the late 19th century and the Modernists are best understood.”
Whereas the arts typically are regarded as non-functionally valuable for their own sakes, Winter is saying that not only is architecture functional, but also that its aesthetic values are integral rather than incidental to its functionality. Lagueux (2004) claims that the link between ethics and aesthetics is intrinsic. Ethical problems are at one and the same time aesthetic problems for the architect. This is one, if not “the” defining feature of architecture.
Theory and practice may diverge in addressing this question of precedence. In practice, it is clear that some architecture is concerned primarily with function and the performance of buildings however this is conceived (occupationally, economically or in terms of durability, and so forth), and some largely with form. The symbolic and mnemonic demands placed upon commemorative architecture, for instance, typically result in designs with a strong emphasis on form. Of course, the expectation that a monument or memorial convey memories and ideas about the past also entails a kind of functionalist—that is, performative—reasoning. The two elements are not so easily distinguished.
Theoretically speaking, however, the need for a far closer connection between function and form has frequently been envisioned. Some claim that buildings in which form and function are closely related make for better architecture. Those who argue that they do (Pevsner 1937, 11) see a mismatch between form and function (for example, if a commercial establishment were designed to look like a church) as a deception, a fraud, or perhaps morally uncertain. Graham (1989, 252) claims that while “copying of styles and the extensive use of facades” may in a sense be deceptive, it is not immoral, and yet “other things being equal, [ideally] such deception is better avoided, if it can be.” But why its avoidance would be preferable is unclear, and views on the subject are mixed and have changed over time. According to the 19th century horticulturalist and architectural critic John C. Loudon (1822, 1013), “A barn disguised as a church would afford satisfaction to none but those who considered it as a trick. The beauty of truth is so essential to every other kind of beauty that it can neither be dispensed with in art nor in morals.”
Contrast this sentiment with Venturi’s celebration of the “decorated shed” 150 years later in Learning from Las Vegas (Venturi, Brown & Izenour 1972), or the notoriety granted Gehry with his “Binoculars Building” in Los Angeles and his collaboration with artists Claes Oldenburg and Coosie van Bruggen on the building’s entrance façade. Graham’s (and Loudon’s) view is likely rooted in a normative presupposition about the relation between form and function; that it is better to have them “unified” in some sense. Graham (1989, 252) says “a building which declares its functions openly and yet at the same time succeeds in conveying all those attributes which the use of a façade aimed to do, would be preferable.” But why and in what way it would be preferable remains unclear. Watkin (1984) thinks that this talk of deception is misguided and that in any case, architecturally speaking, there is nothing wrong with such practices.
Louis Sullivan, the architect responsible for developing the architecture of the late 19th century skyscraper in Chicago, is known for the principle—“form follows function”—around which possibly most debate in modern architecture and design has focused. Augustus Pugin, known for his work on the Gothic revival, made much the same point. He argued against architectural features unrelated to the purpose of a building. For Sullivan, the principle was metaphysically grounded—a kind of law of nature that was normative.
“Form follows function” was seen by some as an inviolable principle offering unique design solutions. It is closely associated with modernist architects early in the 20th century and later. Adolf Loos famously denounced building ornament as a crime for it was superfluous to function and consequently immoral. Frank Lloyd Wright, Sullivan’s assistant at one time, also adopted the principle. The debate on just how the principle is to be interpreted and applied, as well as its validity on any interpretation, is ongoing.
Granted that the proposed use of a building will naturally influence its form (its design), the idea that “use” determines the form seems far too prescriptive. After all, many quite disparate forms might equally well serve a building’s function. The idea that any particular architectural design—no matter how fitting—is more or less uniquely dictated by the precise function can be little more than a retrospective and wishful justification for one’s own design choices. The dictum “form should follow function” is more likely to be the case, or be the case to a far greater extent, with engineering or industrial design (for example, a fuel injector or a heart valve) than with architecture. Questions remain. Just how is one to justify a dictum “form should follow function?” Is it a metaphysical or a normative ethical principle and/or principle of aesthetics? Is it some other kind of irreducible architectural principle? Is the dictum’s justification meant to be logical, rational and/or affective, or in some way grounded in experience or phenomenology?
Le Corbusier’s modernist architecture seeks to create, influence, redefine or even determine the functions that architectural shapes and spaces (not simply “buildings”) are used for. For Le Corbusier, architecture is art. However, the idea that form can influence or even determine function and thereby shape human behavior and communities makes the architect more than, and other than, an artist. It makes the architect a social engineer and planner of sorts as well as likely a moralist and visionary (albeit not necessarily a good visionary). As Corbusier conceived it, the architect is, to various degrees, able to control the uses that designed space is put to—how occupants move in such spaces, how they live in them—and perhaps even the kinds of thoughts and inclinations they have as a result of experiencing designed space in certain ways. Needless to say, questions remain regarding the extent to which Corbusier was successful. Not everyone liked the results.
The idea that building form affects its occupants, physically and/or mentally, is not new. Different metaphysical systems have postulated how this works long before the terms of “form” and “function” became part of the modernist vocabulary. For Renaissance humanist architects, for example, relations of resemblance or similitude embedded in neo-Platonic doctrine suggested that church domes be designed to emulate the vault of heaven, while belief in a force of sympathetic attraction accounted for why the eye is drawn upwards upon entering the sanctuary. By comparison, in the early 19th century Loudon and his contemporaries turned to then current theories of “associationism” to explain why buildings should look certain ways. (A barn should look like a barn, a church like an ecclesiastical building—particularly a Gothic one according to the aesthetic predilections of the day.) Arguably, the “form follows function” equation is the more empirical and deterministic, largely behavioral and socially normalizing, successor to associationism.
Le Corbusier was principally concerned with domestic habitation (housing). His architecture was not intended to service preconceived ideas about what such habitation should be, but to create new and as yet undetermined possibilities for living. The modernist realizations of these undetermined possibilities for habitation were often considered failures. Judged “ugly” or not, iconic modernist building types were found to be unpleasant to live or to work in. High-rise blocks of flats and urban housing estates like Pruitt-Igoe in St. Louis (famously dynamited in 1972, only 16 years after its completion) were routinely derided as “eyesores” for their monumental scale and visual monotony and condemned for their crowdedness, exposure to uninvited surveillance and characteristic disrepair. Architectural historian and critic Charles Jencks (1977) famously described the demolition as the day modern architecture officially died.
However, refusing to unthinkingly yield to preconceived and possibly worn-out notions of habitation can hardly be said to lead to the conclusion that a building’s function follows (or should follow) its form in some highly determinate manner. Likewise, a suburban estate clothed in neo-traditional garb, with encircling gardens, front porches and pathways for pedestrian interaction, is no more guaranteed to produce community than a block of council flats, however well-designed either may be. One can read Le Corbusier’s dictum that “the house is a machine for living in” as a useful prompt for thinking about possibilities for and limitations on architecture’s capacity to provide for human wellbeing and social vitality.
The affective capacity of architecture is the driving idea behind modernism—one that still exercises considerable influence. This can be seen particularly in the formally inventive work by Gehry, Zaha Hadid and other of contemporary architecture’s best known designers. However, the idea has had a far more lasting influence in other design disciplines such as city planning. Thus, it is claimed that certain kinds of public spaces enhance democratic (or totalitarian or socialist, and so forth) values while others are constructed to promote alternative sets of values and ways of thinking and behaving. The broad claim is that the function as well as ethos (moods, motivations, ethics) of buildings, parks, neighborhoods or entire cities follow from their design (form).
It is easy to see how design, choice of material and planning (form), may enhance or curtail certain values and functions. But just as in the case of those who claim “form follows function,” only an ideologue would claim that function is determined by, or should be determined by, form and form alone. Innovation of form may influence, expand and otherwise alter our understanding of function in some cases, but this still falls short of strict adherence to the direct causal connection implied by Le Corbusier’s mechanical analogy. A parking lot must have a place to park cars and a laundromat a place where clothes can be cleaned. Whether one is building a home, factory or an airport, the building’s intended function needs to be taken into account. But if such function does not follow from its form alone, then any dogmatic (absolute) interpretation of Le Corbusier’s version of modernism will fail.
Furthermore, there are various kinds of built environments, communities, dwellings, public spaces, and kinds of cities that people enjoy or dislike (often at the same time). None may be intrinsically better than any other when judged by a single criterion, whether that criterion is “form follows function” or vice versa. Some may suit the “well-being” of particular individuals better than others. “Which is better Paris or London…the city or the county?” are questions that have no determinate answer unless one regards them, as one should, as questions about preferences. Certain goals of development and the realization of one kind of community or public space will often preclude others- although they need not.
Graham (1989, 255) says “a style of architecture which satisfies both functional and aesthetic considerations and has a greater unity is intelligible as an ideal, and one to which many generations of architects have aspired.” It is not difficult to see why architecture that satisfies both kinds of considerations in some unified way, and there may be various equally fine ways of doing so, is desirable. To see this as an ideal is to see aesthetics as intrinsic to architecture (and design). But this ideal is incompatible with the ideology on either side of the form versus function debate. Architecture that achieves such unity will have succeeded in embedding its function in its form and expressing it by means of its form. The ability to achieve this in various ways and to various degrees is an essential part of the architect’s (designer’s) capability qua architect.
However, just how and to what extent buildings can convey meaning or ideas regarding function, as opposed to having meaning and ideas attributed to them, is controversial (Whyte 2006; Graham 1989, 256). For instance, Parsons and Carlson (2008) claim that aesthetic judgments of buildings depend directly upon satisfying functional requirements. Nonetheless, even when buildings appear perfectly suited to their purposes (for example, churches, sport stadiums, schools, prisons) they do not entail meaning and value independent of context and associations accrued through time and place. Meaning and value are virtually always contextualized.
Social Engineering (the “possibility of making society”) and physical determinism (influencing or determining human behavior through space) are ideas that preceded Le Corbusier. They have been deeply imbedded in modern design and urban planning from the start (see Lawhon 2009) and they continue to be influential. An important supposition underlying such ideas is captured by David Brain (2005, 233) who says, “In the context of the urban landscape, every design and planning decision is a value proposition, and a proposition that has to do with social and political relationships.” More recently these issues have re-appeared in the debate on “New Urbanism” as well as with self-reflective questions concerning the nature and aspirations of contemporary architecture and planning.
New Urbanism is a movement codified in the Congress for the New Urbanism’s (CNU) charter (Leccese and McCormick 2000) and identified by a set of 27 principles and evaluative ideas about how cities, particularly suburban cities, should be organized. The CNU sees architecture as the means to social engineering, making for genuine community. The appeal to “community” is ubiquitous in contemporary architectural discourse, partly because notions of “community” are often invoked as a justification by practitioners on behalf of favored design practices. New Urbanism is hard to pin down because just which projects meet or fail to satisfy the CNU’s principles is disputed. Many of the movement’s aims are clearly aligned with late 20th century showcase communities like “Seaside” and the Disney Corporation’s “Celebration” in Florida. The term has been applied retrospectively to the post World War II planned suburban community “Levittown” and additional developments in Pennsylvania and New York built in the late 1940’s and 50’s. New Urbanism aims to provide an alternative, a remedy to suburban sprawl and urban decay and bring about much needed social and political change through design and planning. In this regard it shares features with the anti-sprawl “Smart Growth” planning movement.
The CNU charter proposes that cities and towns should “bring into proximity a broad spectrum of public and private uses to support a regional economy that benefits people of all incomes” (principle 7). Proximity requires that “many of the activities of daily living should occur within walking distance, allowing independence to those who do not drive, especially the elderly and the young” (12). The movement’s followers promise to design civic buildings and public gathering places that “reinforce community identity and the culture of democracy” (25). Such principles demonstrate New Urbanism’s self-conscious concern to bring urban planning into line with certain ethical (including social and political) standards and values. These are the values that its charter delineates as consonant with what democracy, social justice, and more generally “human flourishing” require in a contemporary urban environment. This objective calls to mind Giedion’s and Harries’s view of the architect as, in equal parts: social visionary, political provocateur, and savior. It sees the principle task of the architect or planner as one of interpreting and helping to build, in Giedion’s terms, “a way of life valid for our time.” More pointedly, New Urbanism illustrates Lagueux’s (2004) contention that architecture and ethics are indissolubly joined.
This raises the question as to whether these aims can be realized unless democratic institutions and a foundation of social and economic justice are, to a degree, already operative in the spheres where decisions about development take place. Without such a foundation, development remains in the hands of the kind of “conventional development regime” that Brain (2006, 18-19) cites as (partly) responsible for urban sprawl and inner-city decay in the first place. This regime is constituted by “an interlocking system of financing formulas, measures of market feasibility, product types, zoning categories, environmental impact assessments, and routinized planning practices” that make it virtually impossible to undertake projects “that don’t fit standardized categories.”
Those theorizing the nature of urban development often insist that planning be used in ways that enhance and shape the democratic character of the city. But this is not an easy thing to define, as if democratic values were simply decided by consensus—doubtful, given the possibility the “tyranny of the majority” is always a possibility. Moreover, how can the manipulation of the physical environment through architecture contribute to the inculcation of democratic character and values? This has been the most significant question for urban planning since its inception. It is a question only partly about technique.
Physical determinism addresses an important aspect of social engineering in relation to planning in asking how, and to what extent, certain values and ways of life (human behavior) can be inculcated though the physical (planned) environment. In city planning and urban design, physical determinism is underscored by belief that human behavior is determined by environment. It “implies that the design influences residents’ behavior according to some pattern desired by the designer” (Lawhon 2009, 14).
Sociologist Herbert Gans describes the “fallacy of physical determinism,” which addresses a central aspect of “rational goals-means determination” in questioning the extent to which goals made explicit in the design process can be realized by the physical instantiation of a design. He explains (1968, vii) that “Planning is a method of public decision-making which emphasizes explicit goal-choice and rational goals-means determination, so that decisions can be based on the goals people are seeking and on the most effective programs to achieve them.” However, problems arise when there is the lack of explicit goal-choice, or when some superficially well-defined goal-choices turn out to be nebulous. Insofar as goal-choices involve evaluative and interpretive concepts (for example, “democratic values” or “security”)—concepts whose meaning vary widely relative to ethnic, economic, political, religious and other social groups—what may seem like clear choices may gloss over deep divisions.
The fallacy of physical determinism is meant to question the link between physical design concepts and social outcomes. Gans argues (1968), for example, “that the social homogeneity [race and income] of residential areas based on the neighborhood unit was the chief reason for the success of these neighborhoods and that physical determinism was not a chief determining factor in how successful neighborhoods actually were in forming cohesive, stable units” (Lawhon 2009, 13). But Gans’ criticism, narrowly interpreted, is a broadside that misses the significant claim (that geo-spatial environment does affect behavior) by attacking its haplessly over-generalized cousin (geo-spatial environment determines behavior in a quasi-metaphysical sense of determinism). A severe economic recession can bring down even the most successful and socially homogenous residential area, and no amount of urban planning is going to bring about happily integrated communities of different socio-economic and racial backgrounds, with the kinds of race and class divisions that existed in many cities in the near past and that still largely exist in most cities.
Given that very few design professionals hold the kind of strong determinism that the fallacy of physical determinism applies to, it is not this aspect of planning that needs to be queried. The challenges are instead twofold. First, it is the notion of “desired social outcomes” that requires and has received attention. But to reiterate, this part of the problem, that of articulating an adequate and justifiable goal-choice, is an issue that is not wholly, not even primarily, architectural. It is ethical. Jane Jacobs in her classic book and criticism of 1950’s style rationalist planning, The Life and Death of Great American Cities (1961), understood this, and it was this that enabled her to redefine the relation between physical design concepts and desired social outcomes.
The second challenge is fundamentally design based. Given that behavior, and thought, is affected by environment, the question for planning professionals is how to construct an environment in ways that help effect (not determine) behavior: that help to inculcate desirable values (for example, democratic and other social values), and that are also responsive to the values, at least some of the values, of the inhabitants. The question, at the center of modern architectural planning, remains “what is the nature and character of a range of likely effects (plural) and how do these engage with ethics?” The notion of community has had a contested part to play in New Urbanism, but so too have other central social and political ideas that relocate the principal focus of architecture in relation to philosophy from aesthetics to social and political philosophy and ethics. The Aristotelian notion of what it is to “live well” (human-flourishing) has become closely connected to questions about how the built environment can either enhance or detract from a virtuous and otherwise “good” life (compare Ballantyne 2011 and Winters 2011). From this perspective, the goal and “art” of architects and other design professionals is to enhance the “good” life by adhering to established design principles, while also inventively suggesting ever “better” ways of living.
This heightened connection between philosophy and architecture—practical as well as theoretical—involves both an enlargement and reconfiguration of what we take architects, design professionals, and even engineers, to be and to do. Architects in particular, most noticeably the icons of 20th century architecture, have embraced and promoted themselves not only as arbiters and promulgators of taste (an aesthetic function), but also of value: as visionaries capable of addressing fundamental social and political issues, even spiritual ones (for example, national identity and aspirations) through innovative design in ways that others are simply unable to do—an ethical function bordering at times on the salvific.
Seen from the perspective of the design professional, living up to such a new understanding of their role may seem daunting. Design professionals are first and foremost just that. They are not, on the face of it, ethicists, nor does it seem that they need to be politically active or concerned in their own right, in order to conduct their professional lives. The issue then is whether it only their expertise as “technicians of space” that is required, or whether “architecture” now also implies that practitioners engage with places as designers and citizens—both with a broad understanding of ethics, social philosophy, and so forth.
The principal, though not sole question concerning architecture in relation to aesthetics is whether architecture, or at least some architecture, is art. Granted that at least some architecture is art, then issues relating to the connection between architecture as an art form and ethics can and have been raised. Likewise, architecture’s concern with ethics is highlighted when asking “Is architecture an art form?”
The question seems to be of more concern to those interested in philosophical aesthetics than to either architects or architectural theorists. Nevertheless, it is central to the philosophy of architecture. Just how the aesthetician or architectural theorist responds to the question is determined by their particular accounts of what a work of art is, or their ontology of art—if they have one. If an artwork is characterized as necessarily non-functional, then there would be reason to exclude virtually all works of architecture as objects of art.
Still, one can deny that architectural objects are objects of art while maintaining that there is or should be an aesthetic dimension to architectural objects. Architecture can be judged on aesthetic grounds in accordance with aesthetic standards of one kind or another—though arguably they either cannot be or should not be judged on aesthetic grounds alone—without thereby being regarded as art objects proper. It is pointless however to deny that some buildings are “beautiful” or that they may engender an aesthetic experience, leaving aside how such an experience is to be understood.
Some architects may regard architecture as an art form. But for those that do, the reason has less to do with a preconceived idea of the nature or ontology of art, than with understanding such an assignation as honorific in some sense. If architectural objects can be art objects, then architects must be artists, along with demonstrating whatever else—technical skill for example—that may be involved in being an architect.
From the perspective of architecture as an applied practice rather than the philosophy of architecture and aesthetics as scholarly disciplines, the question of whether architecture is an art form, and buildings objects of art, could be seen as resting on an ambivalence between art or being an artist on the one hand, and being “artful” and showing due concern for enhancing the aesthetic aspect of the built environment on the other. The O.E.D. defines “artful” as “Displaying or characterized by technical skill,” or “That [which] has practical, operative, or constructive skill; dexterous, clever.” Thus, not only can surgeons and architects be artful, but so too can cooks, car mechanics and thieves.
At times, when a level of “artfulness” displayed is of a very high or remarkable standard, it might be and sometimes is said, that the product is a work of art. Julia Child was an artist in the kitchen, much in the same way that skillful and inventive surgeons might be “artists” in the operating room, teachers in the classroom, and certainly hairdressers in the salon, and so forth. And, although there is undoubtedly an aesthetic dimension in cooking (as well as an architectural dimension if a kind of structure (form) or performative value (a function) is manifest by a certain dish), the aesthetic appears to play a particularly essential role, at least as a desideratum, in architecture.
In his essay “Is Architecture Art?” Davies (1994, 37) never questions whether buildings can be artworks. He says, “it seems obvious that many works are uncontroversial both in being buildings and works of art.” The issue, however, is not whether they are so acclaimed but whether they should be. Those who proclaim such buildings as artworks do not necessarily rely on some articulated and defended notion of art. Their acclaims appear to be largely honorific; another way of saying that such buildings are beautiful and remarkable. It doesn’t necessarily follow that everything that is beautiful is a work of art. Davies’ concern is rather with what kind of artworks they might be, with their resemblance to some kinds of artworks but not others, with the role of the designer’s intentions in determining artfulness, and with technical virtuosity, site, and culturally specific contexts underpinning their status as art objects. He asks: are buildings that are artworks “singular as are hewn sculptures, or instead admit of multiple instances (as do cast bronzes, novels, symphonies, and the like” (1994, 43)?
The claims Davies sees as uncontroversial—that architecture (buildings) may be art; that some specific buildings are artworks, and that some architects (and then only sometimes) are artists—others maintain are confused or mistaken. The view is that such claims carelessly, albeit at times on theoretical grounds, conflate the aesthetic dimension of architecture for art. The last claim is mistaken in particular for seeing architects not as “artful” practitioners, but as artists. Architects may artfully design buildings and houses that enhance the lifestyles and values of their occupants or even suggest new and alternative ones. They may design spaces that promote democratic values, sociability and neighborliness, and workplaces that are particularly well-suited to the specific needs of workers. But in so doing they are practicing architecture—applying their skills—rather than functioning as artists. But, even where aesthetic concerns are predominant, it may just be a way of talking to call their products works of art.
Architecture’s concern with ethics is perhaps more clearly highlighted when asking about its relations to social and political concerns. What does this tell us about the knowledge and discipline of architecture?
Works of architecture—not just great or iconic works, but those where design is manifest in practical concerns—are also aesthetic achievements. A well-built house, for example, is not a bunker but potentially a home—where the notion of it being a home has an aesthetic and moral valence that ideally contributes to the well-being of its inhabitants. Architecture is often judged in terms of aesthetic and technical, rather than moral, criteria. Yet, the view that judgments based on aesthetic criteria are independent of those based on moral criteria has a history of being challenged. The idea that the aesthetic value of an art work, including architecture, is independent of moral considerations, and so should properly be judged apart from such considerations—the view in philosophical aesthetics known as “aestheticism” or “autonomism”—is perhaps more easily disputed in architecture than in any other aesthetic endeavor. Even on the face of it, architecture impacts our daily lives in ways that are morally significant. Architecture’s concern with aesthetics is mediated in ways that, according to some, make it an essentially ethical discipline.
As we have seen, various understandings of the relation between form and function already contain ethically normative precepts. Adolf Loos’s functionalism, as implied in his claim about ornament and crime, is ethically as well as architecturally grounded. While some architectural theory remains focused on Vitruvius’s elements and the relation between form and function, contemporary discussion about the relationship between architecture (including landscape architecture, and other planning and design professions) and ethics (including social and political philosophy), has refocused the discussion in different terms.
Thus, Lagueux (2004) argues for an intrinsic connection between architecture and ethics, distinguishing this connection from art forms and professions in which, he argues, any connection with ethics is extrinsic. He claims that architectural problems are, at one and the same time, ethical problems and that the two, being intrinsically related though not identical, must be solved at the same time and in the same way. This alleged connection between architecture and ethics may be seen to be a reformulation or evolution of the Vitruvian problem, where the notion of function or utility (or essential function) is interpreted as irreducibly ethical in part, and the “ethical” is understood to include judgments about value—about what is “good” as well as about what is right.
Even if it is true that interventions in the urban landscape have ethical implications as Brain believes, this would not necessarily substantiate Lagueux’s claim that architecture should recognize its inherently ethico-political character. The two sets of problems might best be kept separate and, to a degree, resolved separately. Nevertheless, in practice there may be reason to believe he is right, even if no sharp distinction can always be made between architecture and other disciplines (for example, medicine and biology) as to whether ethical considerations are intrinsic.
Lagueux’s claim regarding architecture and ethics as opposed to other disciplines may seem implausible. Medicine, for example, inevitably confronts its practitioners with practical moral problems and dilemmas that must be considered in relation to the concrete details of the situation. Lagueux does not deny this, but claims that such moral problems remain moral problems and that there is no fundamental or intrinsic connection between the medical and ethical aspects of the problem. One might, for instance, bring in an ethical specialist for advice—as indeed is often the case. Lagueux needs to explain why he sees architecture as having resources for dealing with the moral issues it raises that medicine lacks. If doctors not trained in ethics cannot deal with the issues, what qualifies similarly untrained architects to do so?
Lagueux would say that insofar as architects are not ethically competent, they are also not architecturally competent. In other words, unlike the case of medicine, ethical and aesthetic problems are linked in such a way that ideally they must be resolved at one and the same time—even in the absence of any unique solution. Insofar as architecture (or the architect) does not have resources for dealing with the moral issues it fails as architecture. Lagueux’s claim is that, unlike the case of medicine, the architect qua architect requires ethical training because they cannot practice architecture without it. He does not also claim that architecture is unique in this respect as against all the other arts (for example cinematography), in that it alone has ethical and aesthetic issues intrinsically linked. In any case, even if one denies that Lagueux’s claim is universally true, one might accept it as characteristic of architecture.
Since Lagueux sees aesthetics and ethics as intrinsically connected in architecture in a way they are not in other disciplines, architecture for Lagueux is characterized by the way it presents the practitioner with ethical problems linked to aesthetic ones. For example, the placement of windows and doors in a building should be done in such a way that it satisfies both aesthetic considerations like pleasing views, as well as ethical ones such as due concern for neighbors’ privacy. A more complex example would be designing a public atrium as part for a corporate complex where due consideration is given on the one hand to its utility as public accessible space—responding to the needs, desires and values of those who inhabit and traverse the space—and on the other to perhaps the conflicting concerns, or incommensurate values, of those inhabiting neighboring work environments. A more abstract case yet might be the construction of a public space—a park or a square—designed to be aesthetically pleasing but also, by means of its design, to promote certain civic and democratic values.
As a field that engages multiple disciplines, philosophy of architecture can be aligned with currents of inquiry seen across the humanities. Before Pevsner penned his 1949 editorial in Architectural Review and to a greater extent since the 1960’s, architectural theory has provided a philosophical gloss for architectural criticism, design practices and education. Much of what counts as scholarship on architecture has come to resemble a history of philosophical ideas. The changeable terrain and contingencies of practice have resulted in a continuing critical reappraisal of the discipline’s terms, and intellectual and aesthetic traditions (including the Vitruvian triad and its legacy). Theory has been informed to a large extent by continental European philosophy. Movements such as German idealism, phenomenology, structuralism and post-structuralism, the Frankfurt School, neo-Marxism, psychoanalytic theory, and feminist and deconstruction (literary) theory have found an audience among architectural historians, theorists and practitioners at the “cutting edge” of design.
Arguably, the autonomy of architecture, like other creative arts (for example, film), is made questionable by what some have described as the indeterminate, mixed or “hybrid” character of the discipline and by the critical writing architecture attracts. This includes theory that treats creative disciplines as primarily demonstrative of philosophical truths, rather than productive of ethical insights into the human condition. In his effort to provide a more comprehensive account of the field, Andrew Benjamin, who has written extensively on architecture and the continental tradition, proposes to “think the particularity of the architectural” and devise a uniquely “architectural philosophy” (2000, vii).
Whether Benjamin’s undertaking, or any other, has provided the kind of framework for the philosophy of architecture that Pevsner desired, is open to question. Much depends on how “philosophy” is itself understood and where one stands in relation to history, theory, or practice. Adopting an “honorific” conception of philosophy, for instance, privileges its modes of interrogation as the means to clarify and adjudicate claims of truth arising in these areas. Another view, common in schools of architecture and shared by practitioners seeking intellectual rigor for their work, requires that a “philosophy”—guiding principles or a theoretical exegesis—accompany each design project.
Idealism, specifically the movement with origins in late 18th and early 19th century German philosophy and bearing the imprimatur of Kant and especially Hegel, is significant for treating works of architecture as objects of our consciousness, their meaning and value being variable, though ultimately determined by the mind’s responsiveness to the material world. As McQuillan points out in his article on German Idealism, the movement is remarkable for its systematic treatment of several philosophical disciplines, including aesthetics, to which one can add art history which followed as a recognizable discipline later.
Architectural history is largely an offshoot of art history. German idealist historians writing in the mid- to late 19th and early 20th centuries (Schnaase, Semper, Wölfflin and Warburg and others; see Podro 1982) contributed much to the formation of art and architectural canons. Critical historiography on architecture developed alongside Hegelian notions of Zeitgeist (the spirit of the age manifest in art forms) and Weltanschauung (the notion that art represents a people’s worldview). Philosophical debate on the nature of architecture was given impetus by comparative analyses fostered by this tradition and the view that saw art forms categorised according to their purported capacities to manifest universal truths.
The influence of Hegel and idealism can be seen in Pevsner’s writing on the origins of the modern movement, notably in Pioneers of the Modern Movement (1936). In this seminal text, developments in architectural form manifest an emerging functionalist aesthetic and spirit indicative of the modern age. There is a strong sense of historical determinism behind this movement. Hence, in Pioneers there is dramatic language of “stages being set,” of heroic architects “appearing on the scene” and of designs “ahead of their time” (122, 132, 136). Historical determinism imposes a particular challenge to expectations for an architect’s autonomous control of a work and the capacity of a cohort of avant garde architects to initiate a new direction for contemporary design. Idealism’s legacy is perhaps best seen in its contribution to subsequent philosophical movements (like Husserl’s phenomenological idealism) and in the broad expectation that art and architecture contribute to understanding the historical moment.
The particular nature and significance of architecture has often been discussed in terms of ways that buildings (or some of them anyway) can be experienced. Among philosophers and architectural theorists and designers, there is the broad expectation that different types of buildings, and public and private spaces, engage human perceptions and feelings in ways that both shape and are shaped by patterns of human behaviour and self-consciousness. There is a corresponding and overlapping set of interests, expressed within and outside the academy, questioning how cities allow for distinctive forms of “urban experience” or how certain kinds of public or monumental architecture or “heritage” precincts make for an experience of history that is distinctive, stimulating, and productive of good citizenship. Social, political and ethical contexts for architecture and urban design are raised by such studies as well as others.
From the perspective of moral philosophy, a subset of aesthetic concerns focuses specifically on what an “aesthetic experience” of buildings might be as a means of grounding claims of value. For instance, Michael Mitias (1999) proposes that an “adequate analysis” of the experience of architecture is possible and this is the “safest road” to a reasoned understanding of what architecture is about, for evaluating it and for finding principles of education in architectural aesthetics. He questions:
Under what theoretical and perceptual conditions it is possible to experience, appreciate and evaluate a building as an architectural integrity, in its own terms, without appealing to, or relying on, an external or implied philosophical, ideological, political, or social agenda? (61)
Thoughts on what an experience of architecture may be, acquire greater conceptual rigour in the context of phenomenology. This has been understood as either a disciplinary field in philosophy alongside other studies like ontology and epistemology, logic and ethics, or as a more specific movement in the history of philosophical ideas informed by, among others, Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Gaston Bachelard. Phenomenology studies the “appearances of things, or things as they appear in our experience or the ways we experience things, [and] thus the meaning things have in our experience” (Smith 2003). When studying buildings, particularly for their existential and transcendental value, the phenomenologist emphasises the subject, subjective or first person view of architecture as a condition of conscious awareness. In the work of Christian Norberg-Schulz (1980 ), phenomenology is concerned with the concept of the “genius-loci” whereby the distinctive character or spirit of a place is reinforced by patterns of human settlement and acts of building and dwelling. Urban form, architecture and contrived landscapes that aim at “place-making” elicit a similar concept.
Phenomenology is an influential movement in architectural theory, though its interpretation and application is far from univocal. Its proponents vary in their commitment to its key terms and thinkers, and take its applications and implications (tendencies like transcendentalism or existentialism) in different directions. For Alberto Perez-Gomez (1983), for instance, transcendental phenomenology informs a particular perspective on modernism, supporting the contrast of creative “poiesis” and meaning, on the one hand, and architecture’s representation as plans and drawings—along with its rationalised construction and role as consumerist object—on the other. Theorists who contribute to this and parallel lines of thinking include Juhani Pallasmaa, Dalibor Vesely and Karsten Harries. Architectural practitioners like Steven Holl and Peter Zumthor cite the influence of phenomenology upon their designs.
Phenomenology is influential on architecture, though it provides no clear and categorical definition of architecture. This is partly because there are social grounds for experiencing buildings and semantic considerations that characterise architectural aesthetics according to cultural differences, including discriminations between “high” and “low” art. Whether the function of buildings makes for a different kind of experience from the pleasure derived from their beauty or perception of any likely “architectural integrity” they may have is also at issue. So too is the possibility there are conditions that make for an experience of “bad” architecture. Consider whether places like detention centres can be improved by designing with the genius-loci in mind.
Widely attributed to the pioneering work of Ferdinand de Saussure, structuralism was a movement introduced into a number of academic disciplines in the 1950s and 60s. It was an outgrowth of interests in linguistics, semiotics, and allied studies of language. It was influential in anthropology, with work by Claude Lévi-Strauss. Structuralism’s subsequent appeal for architectural theorists was largely due to its promise of a more philosophical, systematic or “scientific” framework for what had long been presupposed (some believe since the Renaissance; others since Vitruvius) that architecture was akin to language and that, like written text, architectural form exhibited a grammar-like structure for conveying meaning. According to this reasoning, material details (classical orders, ornament, and so forth) of buildings or series of building facades, are conceived as metonymic wholes, possessing semantic content and conceivably ethical worth (valence) for communicating meanings and values within social formations and from one generation to the next. Victor Hugo more or less espoused the idea in Notre-Dame de Paris where he bemoaned the arrival of the printing press and cheaply reproduced books. He counterpoised the fluidity and unreliability of the written word with the heyday of architecture in the form of the gothic cathedral on which he believed meanings were artistically manifest in stone—thus acquiring greater permanency and social relevance.
Linguistic structuralism promised not so much a philosophy of architecture; rather, it required that study of architectural aesthetics conform to the model and ideal of language and adhere to what amounts to an empiricist conception of knowledge. Structuralism’s methods worked to establish a fundamental opposition between (i) architectural form and function—privileging the communicative capacity of architectural aesthetics over a building’s other performative roles (as structure, shelter, or its function as a commodity, and so forth)—and (ii) between architectural form as a category of signifiers, and a largely pre-existing context of potentially meaningful artifacts, signified entities or referents.
Accordingly, Umberto Eco (1968) effectively recast the Vitruvian terms of form and function as elements in a culturally-grounded system of architectural signification, thereby denying the precedence and determining influence the modernists gave to one term over the other:
In other words, the principle that form follows function might be restated: the form of the object must, besides making the function possible denote that function clearly enough to make it practicable as well as desirable [emphasis in original], clearly enough to dispose one to the actions through which it would be fulfilled. (186)
Eco moves to distinguish between primary (denotative) and secondary (connotative) functions, neither more important than the other, but each dependent upon the other to form a “semiotic mechanism” (188). Hence, the form of either a barn or a church allows them to function as habitable spaces of a kind (their primary function) and these forms denote this purpose. Their doors “tell” us there is space inside; their windows “tell” us there is light with which to see and so forth. The combination and arrangement of building details work alongside cultural codes to connote (their secondary function) that the first building type, the barn, is just that, merely a building, while the second possesses architectural significance. Roland Barthes complicates the idea that architectural signs are composed by the one-to-one correspondence between signifiers and signifieds. In “Semiology and the Urban” (1971) he emphasizes the transience of urban life so that meanings are not fixed by such a correlation, but temporary and mobile.
Among architectural theorists and practitioners, renewed emphasis in the 1970s and early 80s on the meaningful interpretation of architectural and urban typologies (the classification and comparison of the formal and visual characteristics of building types and urban forms) reinforced the linguistic model. Reyner Banham (in Baird and Jencks, 1969, 101) rejected the move, believing that arguments in support of architectural semantics were merely promoting a new ideology of monumentality in the service of social elites rather than a more rational formalism and egalitarian (that is, functionalist) approach to design. Contributions to the debate over meaning versus functionalism in architecture were published in the first book in English on the subject, Meaning in Architecture (Baird and Jencks, 1969). Additional titles promoting the language of architecture appeared in quick succession, including Venturi, Brown & Izenour (1972) and Jencks (1977). Arguably, Banham’s functionalism and egalitarianism were pushed aside in preference for the stylistic eclecticism and populism allowed for in these books.
Borrowing from Noam Chomsky’s linguistics, Peter Eisenman began a series of experimental projects in the 1970s. These were primarily small houses designed with highly complex forms and models resembling abstract geometric compositions. Though the projects were often accompanied by equally complex theoretical exegeses, Eisenman nonetheless believed that his viewers were able to understand their meaning as they were purportedly derived from the same linguistic and syntactical structures used to express everyday thoughts. The architect-theoretician tried to relate formalism and linguistics logically, distinguishing between meanings that were semantic and those that were syntactical or integral to architecture’s coherence as an object. For Eisenman, formalism was the displacement of the semantic content of a design with the syntactic. The promise of freedom attributed to this displacement underscored Eisenman’s desire to create architecture that was autonomous and free from external constraints arising from pre-established meaning and practical necessity. His view of the “paradoxical nature” of architecture prefigured his subsequent interests in deconstruction and theories of conceptual and “cardboard” (unbuilt) architecture. This includes architectural drawings and plans for projects that may never be built or could not be built.
Structuralism is largely appraised today for the movements that followed and perhaps were reactions to it, variously assembled under the banners of “postmodernism” or “post-structuralism.” Its demise was perhaps due in part to the cumbersome vocabulary developed to describe systems of signification (de Saussure’s terms of and distinction between langue and parole, the division of “signs” into “signifiers” and “signifieds,” Eco’s denotative and connotative functions, and so forth). Questions also arise about the reality behind these terms and equally obscure concepts like Eisenman’s “wellness.” While the vocabulary and concepts might provide the theorist with a framework for describing architectural meanings, they are also largely a-historical and overly formulaic. Structuralism leaves us with the question of whether the so-called “paradoxical nature” of architecture as a system of signification can be reconciled with its determination by, and determining influence on, power and politics.
Drawing on heterogeneous writing, principally by Jean-François Lyotard and Jean Baudrillard, and popularized by architect-critics Charles Jencks and Charles Moore, the underlying aims, scope, and methods of postmodernism are subject to considerable debate and contestation (Habermas 1982; Jameson 1991). Defying easy description, Hal Foster, in The Anti-Aesthetic (1983), nonetheless identifies two distinct and opposing strains of thought behind postmodernism’s claims. Together, they account for the equally imprecise and ambivalent position of the movement in the history of ideas about architecture.
One the one hand, postmodernism was a reactionary movement; it encouraged opposition to certainties that grounded modernism and modern architecture; it challenged the idea that social progress was adjunct to rational design, for instance, or that building form was relatable to function in a pre-determined way or that any epistemology like semiotics could fully encompass the fluidity, ambiguity and impermanence of meaning. This variant of postmodernism accepted the status quo and rejected, notably in work by Jencks and Moore, the “high art” status of International modernism. It embraced populism based on architectural aesthetics characterized by historicist motifs and bricolage. On the other hand, postmodernism can be seen as a critical stance towards modernism that sought to reappraise its claims to truth, as well as reinforcing, perhaps indirectly, the semiotician’s undertaking to provide a more thorough account of architectural meaning.
Along with joining the chorus of scholars asking “What was postmodernism?” it is worth standing back from the particular claims of its leading figures and examining how philosophical movements such as this have engaged “the question of history” (Attridge and others 1987) and utilize (or eschew) forms of historical investigation to produce insightful architectural criticism or novel design styles. One can investigate how philosophical concepts are appropriated and possibly misinterpreted by practitioners when the practical demands of clients and corporate patrons intercede or architectural media weighs in with a market for design novelty and appealing visual imagery.
Post-structuralism is another interdisciplinary movement that emerged in the 1970s and 80s as an extension and critique of structuralism. Its multiple strains are no more easily characterized than postmodernism. Post-structuralism is associated with writing by Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida, Julia Kristeva, Gilles Deleuze and other continental philosophers. Derrida’s work on deconstruction further popularized textual analyses for studies in the arts and humanities. Inspiring much architectural criticism and coinciding with highly publicized projects like Bernard Tschumi’s competition winning scheme for Parc de la Villette in Paris (1982) and Zaha Hadid’s unrealized design for Hong Kong’s Peak Club (1983), deconstruction encouraged further unpacking of modernism’s traditions, particularly functionalism. It promised designers a new generative grammar based on the ambiguity, fragmentation, and collision of architectural elements in which systems of representation and habitation were recognized as fluid and contingent. However, the popular reception of deconstruction as an exciting new architectural style may have overshadowed the movement’s critical impetus to firmly position language and meaning within a social matrix. This was enlivened by the dialectic of presence and absence whereby humankind retained a measure of freedom to shape its own identity.
Foucault’s work on knowledge and power develops a key theme of post-structuralism, though he does this in a distinctive (and, for some, idiosyncratic) way using methods that challenge conventional boundaries between modes of philosophical, historical and material analyses. The uneven reception of his oeuvre among architectural historians and theorists is perhaps due to the relatively few works containing explicit references to architecture or architects. Foucault’s analysis of the Panopticon prison in Discipline and Punish (1975) is well known and inspired many studies of space, knowledge and power in the context of disciplinary society.
In one frequently cited interview, Foucault (1982) left his readers with no doubt about the limited agency architectural greats like Le Corbusier or everyday practitioners have in shaping this milieu. It is one where social engineering results not from forms that follow functions (or vice versa) but from techniques of power that engage multiple levels of human experience (material, conceptual and authoritative, and possibly others):
After all, the architect has no power over me. If I want to tear down or change a house he built for me, put up new partitions, add a chimney, the architect has no control. So the architect should be placed in another category—which is not to say that he is not totally foreign to the organization, the implementation, and all the techniques of power that are exercised in a society. I would say that one must take him—his mentality, his attitude—into account as well as his projects, in order to understand a certain number of the techniques of power that are invested in architecture, but he is not comparable to a doctor, a priest, a psychiatrist, or a prison warden. (247-48)
Other works by Foucault have a bearing on philosophy of architecture. In an early work, The Order of Things (1966), for instance, Foucault adopted a quasi-structuralist approach to write an “archaeology of human reason” (also the subtitle of the book). Amongst other tasks he locates movements like phenomenology in a historical framework punctuated by ruptures in the representational structures or “epistemes” of Western discourse. Normally, the disciplines of ontology and epistemology would provide methods for this or similar analyses, but Foucault adopted a more radical approach; after all ontology and epistemology were themselves forms of philosophical inquiry with histories of their own and were already complicit in shoring up the phenomenologist’s claims to truth. His ambition, to stand apart from philosophy in order to see its deepest workings, made for a story of changing relations between signs and the things they came to signify. It was a history where new objects of knowledge appear, and old ones were lost. This allowed for concepts like “life,” “labor,” and “language” to emerge; to provide new foundations for sciences (biology, economics, and linguistics) to be formed, and to describe the human condition. On Foucault’s account, these terms helped shape a distinctly modern framework for an understanding of humanity and, arguably, the built environment and architecture as well.
Topics and lines of inquiry into philosophy of architecture have engaged one or more of the preceding movements and illustrate the breadth, intellectual richness, and relevance of the field. Consider a few of these.
The question raised early in this article, one that invites further inquiry and positions philosophy of architecture as propositional, “What is architecture?” begs consideration of the relations between the material substances and physical properties of buildings and their representation through various media. The key issue is how the materials, tools and techniques of architecture partly or wholly determine what architecture is or can be. Is designing and visualising buildings the same as thinking about their ethical or other value? Does visualising an ideal building or urban form contribute to its meaning or form part of an architectural experience?
The historical development, prevalence and the popular appeal of wide-ranging media, including conventional design and construction drawings and models, new digital media and even film, have shaped architectural discourse and underscored forms of professional expertise. Ways of representing or producing images of buildings, like plan-metric (two-dimensional), orthogonal or perspective drawings and, more recently, computer renderings of complex building forms, have supported various design and construction practices. These have also encouraged speculation on the capacity of architecture to embody ideas and entail a distinctive way of conceptualising the world. (For instance, Winters 2011 writes on the critical attitude cultivated by “paper”—delineated, but unbuilt or unbuildable—architecture.) This is a tendency that borrows reasoning from art history, studies of iconology and meaning and influential books like Erwin Panofsky’s Perspective as Symbolic Form (1927). The Euclidean character of visual space has been questioned and by some accounts, superseded by new visual regimes that challenge conventional understanding of relations between the architectural object and the viewing/inhabiting subject. Even building diagrams, popularly caricatured as the architect’s calling card when scribbled on dinner table napkins and taken to indicate a unique kind of self-reflection, can raise questions about architecture’s intertwined practical and philosophical aspects.
Studies of architectural media have also prompted philosophical reflection on architecture as affording understanding of transcendental values and existential meaning. For some architectural theorists, for instance, plans and drawings are representations of a second order, seemingly distant from all sense of time and place. For others, new digital media allow not only for the easy visualisation, rapid prototyping and construction of novel architectural forms, but also provide insight into the human condition in an era of globalisation and rapid technological change. On the one hand, issues raised by Walter Benjamin’s much cited essay in “The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction” (1935) run parallel to concerns for architecture given the representation and mass-reproduction of building forms and their contribution to dominant global culture. On the other, the dynamism of fluid building forms, so-called architectural “blobs” and forms inspired by Deleuze’s interest in “the fold” or “folded” spaces (1988), promises unheralded opportunities for self-invention and social renewal.
The utility of “representation” as a trans-historical category of critical analysis (in architectural theory and cultural studies, generally) is accompanied and in some cases countered by philosophical reflection on time, temporality, and transience whereby two- and three-dimensional images of buildings possess only limited value in themselves. In architecture, these themes are evident in arguments for the essential timelessness and fundamental intelligibility of Classicism (Porphyrios 1982) that renders it more than a style, or studies describing the physical characteristics of building materials and emphasizing the meaningfulness of weathering (Mostafavi and Leatherbarrow 1993). Building age and the register of weather, organic and human factors on timber, stone and other materials can be valorised as providing the necessary conditions for Heidegger’s concept and state of “being-in-the-world” whereby the alienation of human subjects from the material world of objects is overcome. These relatively recent studies are worth comparing to 18th and early 19th century aesthetic treatises on ruination, the sublime, and picturesque, though their provenance is not wholly attributable to them.
Conversely, on some accounts, architecture comes into its own when distanced from strict demands for functionality, conventional delineation, and commonly-held meanings (Benedikt 1991; Harbison 1991). Visionary schemes set in “cyberspace,” so-called “virtual” and “unbuilt” (also “paper”) architecture are described and valued for their intellectual content, provocative appeal, and their potential to liberate communities from what is construed as the deadweight of the past, historical building styles, and the conservatism of much architectural heritage. From this follow another set of issues discussed in the literature. One is whether or not an architectural work or proposition is complete when drawings are finished, independent of the design’s construction and prior to the project’s occupation and evaluation. If wholly propositional or paper architecture possesses a kind of creative integrity, this raises questions about the necessary contribution (or otherwise) of the project’s sites and settings (physical and performative) to the design process. Is the architect first and foremost a visionary, rather than merely a technician? If so, how can communities come to understand, share, and assess the architect’s largely utopian mission?
Questions concerning the integrity of a work of architecture and the autonomy of the architect as a particular kind of expert or visionary correspond to those asked about other kinds of artworks. Can a work of virtual architecture, a painter’s cartoon or unfinished symphony make a lasting contribution to an artistic canon, or must they invariably be “read” as secondary in importance, interpreted according to existing representational or technical (that is, social) norms? Is unbuilt architecture best left as it is, unrealised, or an unfinished masterpiece best left incomplete, thereby allowing audiences—and posterity—the freedom to fill in the missing pieces? If the latter proposition is correct, then is the meaning of an artwork invariably a social construct? Does the architect, artist, or composer ever have a lasting claim (in term of its meaning) over their work, as they intended it to be?
These questions highlight philosophical issues concerning a creative work’s contribution to culture and heritage, and they draw further attention to differences between architecture and other forms of art. Debates surrounding the preservation, restoration or adaptive re-use of iconic buildings, for instance, show up technical, social, and political contexts governing architectural value that may not be applicable to other artistic genres. The “Salk Controversy” is a case in point, where disagreement arose over plans for a building addition to Louis Kahn’s Salk Institute at La Jolla, thought by some to contradict the architect’s original design intention (Spector 2001, 166-84). The debate shows up differences in views regarding a building’s past and present integrity as an artistic object and how and to what extent the creative vision of an architect should be privileged over the needs of clients and users. Is the heritage value of either the Salk Institute building, or the stature of the architect Louis Kahn diminished by such additions?
Discourse on architectural heritage was shaped by historical figures like Viollet-le-Duc, Ruskin, and Pugin. Working to refurbish France’s medieval cathedrals, Viollet-le-Duc drew and then followed a fine line between restoring building fabric to its “original” (though invariably hypothetical) condition, on the one hand, and adapting the buildings to evolve according to modern standards of function, taste, and aesthetics, on the other. Drawing together both of these divergent positions was an emerging imperative that architecture, both old and new, should be relevant for the times. This perspective is taken up in architectural theory by Giedion and Harries, among others. This and additional views on architectural ethics and heritage have been enacted by the establishment of institutions such as the National Trust (UK) and its offspring of national and regional heritage councils, the International Council on Monuments and Sites (ICOMOS), and Docomomo, charged with the protection and preservation of modern architecture and urbanism. Awareness of the fluidity of heritage as grounds for questioning the relativity of architectural values has been sharpened by debates generated by controversial demolition and rebuilding projects. Famous episodes include the protracted commercial redevelopment of Paternoster Square at St. Paul’s Cathedral, London (1980s-90s); Venturi and Brown’s postmodernist addition (1991) to the National Gallery on Trafalgar Square (replacing the design famously condemned by Prince Charles as a “monstrous carbuncle”), and the rebuilding (completed 2005) of the Frauenkirche, Dresden, to include evidence of damage from Allied carpet bombing during the Second World War.
While perhaps always present in some measure, the ethical dimensions of architecture have never been as public and as apropos to the civic and political climate as in the early 21st century. Warwick Fox sees this situation as mainly the result of increasing environmental problems and a concern with the built environment as a heretofore neglected aspect of environmental ethics (2000, 1–12). Fox is partly right, but to see the relation between architecture and ethics exclusively in terms of environmental ethics, as commonly understood, is too narrow. For one thing, drawing on forms of historical, theoretical and practical (also professional) knowledge, architecture, more than most other humanities disciplines, is concerned with multiple conceptions of and concerns for the environment. Viewed as subjects of philosophical inquiry, distinctions between “architecture” and the “built environment,” and between either of these terms and “nature” or “the natural environment,” beg for ontological and epistemological elucidation.
Many of the philosophical concerns about architecture may be seen as a subset or variant of concerns for the built environment. They tend to arise in a cultural sphere, bound by interpretative traditions, entailing the formative concepts, historicity and rhetorical conventions, of the discipline. The primary function of the built environment seems to be to provide for habitation and the requisites of life. The question thus arises as to whether this primary function takes precedence over the aesthetic functions of architecture, specifically expectations for its artistry or meaning. Should what seems to be the primary function of the built environment to provide for habitation and the requisites of life take precedence over the aesthetic functions of architecture, specifically expectations for its artistry or meaning?
Moreover, the challenges architects and allied design professionals (particularly planners and urban designers) face in responding to demands for environmentally sustainable buildings with reduced energy consumption and lower carbon emissions, and for cities with greater resilience to global climate change, raise additional philosophical and ethical issues that Vitruvius and his annotators could hardly have imagined. Many of these raise questions about the meaning and scope of sustainability. Is it a matter of science and building technology or behavior—or both? Can buildings be designed sustainably in societies geared for endless growth and consumption? Can a city be made resilient to environmental disaster if this requires the pre-emptive destruction of neighborhoods in vulnerable areas—and possibly worsened levels of social injustice and inequality that may result?
While it may be assumed these concerns and issues have only appeared at the beginning of the 21st century, there are broader, longstanding and overlapping conceptual and practical contexts for locating them historically. In histories of ideas bearing on philosophy and environment (also nature), for instance, (Pratt et al 1999), one learns of the importance of arguments for the uniqueness of living species based on the geographic regions and climates they inhabit. In this regard, today’s environmentalists can be seen as developing thoughts expressed by natural theologians or geographers like Alexander Humboldt (1769-1859) or systemic botanists like John Hutton Balfour (1808-1884) who described life as a process emerging from interactions between living beings and their surroundings.
Humboldt, Balfour, Darwin, and others contributed to the scientific formulation of ecology as well as spatio-temporal frameworks whereby newly established facts of biological existence could also be used to describe urban societies and environments. Arguably, these frameworks contributed to interests in vernacular architecture and the model of “the primitive hut” (Vidler 1987) as these were interpreted as manifesting links between building forms, patterns of human settlement, and distinctive eras. Advancements in building technology over the course of the 19th and 20th centuries, particularly in the areas of sanitation, illumination, heating, and ventilation, reinforced a largely functionalist view of the interrelationship of building interiors, urban spaces and human wellbeing.
According to one line of thinking, our scientific and technological orientation towards control of the natural world is one contributing factor, not the solution, to environmental crises. The logical conflict of different criteria available to measure a building’s ecological sustainability, for instance (entailing its consumption of energy for lighting and heating versus the energy embodied in its materials and construction), demonstrates the limitations of conventional instrumental or practical reasoning. However, it seems fanciful to anticipate that another philosophy of nature and the built environment will appear—one that is more than merely functionalist and non-individualistic or post-humanistic—to underscore effective environmental activism and remediation.
The developments affecting architectural practices in the 21st century arise from the awareness of the link between the environment and human flourishing, though these developments are reducible to no one single concept about the environment. These include growing unease over hitherto unforeseen consequences of building technology and concomitant processes of industrialism and urbanization. Issues range from local ones such as “sick building syndrome,” pollution, and revelations of the toxicity of building sites, to broader concerns arising from the global warming and the depletion of natural resources, including energy resources. These developments have prompted new movements among design practitioners. They include calls for “green architecture” with its emphasis on sustainability and purportedly sustainable practices such as “cradle to cradle” design where building materials are chosen with their life cycles and future recyclability in mind. On a larger scale there is the move towards the “ecological restoration” of natural and urban landscapes aimed at reversing the consequences of environmental degradation or limiting the impacts of future flooding, bushfires and other disasters.
These and other developments directed towards more complete awareness, preservation or restoration of the environment have important subjective and ethical dimensions. These are evident not only in obvious political or design movements, but in ascetic—self-disciplining, restraining, and possibly abstaining—practices involving the design, furnishing, and maintenance of the home, the water-wise planting, and rigorous inspection of the suburban garden for invasive species and noxious weeds. What emerges from such practices is a relationship between thought and experience mediated by an understanding of environs, surrounds, spaces, and choice regarding possible ways of living in them.
Given the lines of inquiry outlined in this article, it should become clear there is no one single relation between philosophy and architecture. Rather, there are likely multiple connections that make this an important multi-, inter- and trans-disciplinary field, and these connections can be brought to bear to consider the formation of architectural historians, theorists, and designers as particular kinds of intellectuals and “philosophical” agents with responsibilities for the built environment.
Consequently, the opening question “What is architecture?” leads to another. “What is an architect?” There are a variety of answers. One set of responses is to describe what an architect does, namely design, as a distinctive activity that is not only creative and imaginative, comparable to other forms of “art,” but also both critically and practically oriented. Donald Schön in his book The Design Studio (1985) coined the phrase “reflection-in-action” to describe design and, like many design educators, valued the design studio as a unique arena for cultivating creativity and innovation, and for devising novel solutions to social, technological and pragmatic problems. Indeed, it is a common view that design and studio practice are means of articulating just what the pressing problems of the day are or will soon be. There are many “philosophies” and metaphors of design, including descriptors such as “problem-setting” versus “problem solving” and “lateral thinking”—that old shibboleth of many devotees of design and “the creative industries.” There are also different ways of describing what the ideal design process should be (rational, but not linear; reiterative, cyclical, and so forth).
For Winters (2011), the value of the “paper” architecture (sketch designs, drawings, and other media representations of unbuilt and perhaps unbuildable work) routinely produced in schools is that it throws into sharp relief the capacity of architecture as a visual art to be infused with a “critical attitude” combining the Apollonian and the Dionysian conceptions of aesthetics. The first entails the disinterested contemplation of the creative object as form, and the second active participation in and self-formation through an aesthetic experience, so that:
The designed environment unfolds before us requiring our occupational presence to make it whole. It is in this sense that a work of architecture displays itself as a canvas upon which to project the systematic undertakings that are constitutive of a life, but unlike the blank canvas, this canvas has marked out across its surface patterns that present themselves as suitable accommodation for our endeavors. (67)
Like the Vitruvian triad or the phenomenologist’s favored concept of “poiesis,” many of these descriptions impose—rather than merely recognize—a particular ontological and epistemological order on design acts and, more or less, stress their reasonableness, reliability, and universal applicability. Conversely, it could be argued that the epithet “design” encompasses a number of different cognitive, imaginative, and creative acts; these have histories and institutional settings that cannot be reduced to one common denominator.
Aesthetics is not only grounds for connecting philosophy to architecture in a multi-disciplinary field. It is also commonly the chief vehicle for composing and teaching histories of architecture, for teaching design and assessing design outcomes, and often, for positioning a student’s ambitions at “the cutting edge” of design. Alertness to historical, social, and political contexts impacting our understanding of “design” begs greater openness towards the domain of “aesthetico-ethical” exercises that the activity and related metaphors and methodologies routinely entail. These include perceptions and discriminations of various kinds which make the built environment something to be considered, reflected, and acted upon—in the design studio but also more broadly and everyday, across society. Discriminations, such as between the form and function of a building, or between the “utilitas” or “venustas” of architecture are means whereby a wholeness of character, psychological closure or renewal of community is sought among other aspirations or, conversely, whereby our passions and desires for a wholeness of the self, closure, and community are subverted. Such discriminations are exercised by individuals occupying a number of subject positions, degrees of knowledge, and authority. They are acted upon in multiple and overlapping social and political arenas.
It is clear that the field of philosophy of architecture has much work cut out for it. However, given the admittedly only partial account of its concerns as outlined here, it is likely that the significance of what is in some ways merely a nascent subfield within both philosophy and architecture, will grow.
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William M. Taylor
University of Western Australia
Michael P. Levine
University of Western Australia