God and Time
Any theistic view of the world includes some notion of how God is related to the structures of the universe, including space and time. The question of God’s relation to time has generated a great amount of theological and philosophical reflection. The traditional view has been that God is timeless in the sense of being outside time altogether; that is, he exists but does not exist at any point in time and he does not experience temporal succession. What may be the dominant view of philosophers today is that he is temporal but everlasting; that is, God never began to exist and he never will go out of existence. He exists at each moment in time.
Deciding how best to think of God’s relation to time will involve bringing to bear one’s views about other aspects of the divine nature. How a philosopher thinks about God’s knowledge and his interaction with his people within the temporal world shapes how that philosopher will think about God’s relation to time and vice versa. In addition, other metaphysical considerations also play important roles in the discussion. For example, the nature of time and the nature of the origin of the universe each have a bearing on whether God is best thought of as timeless or temporal.
This article traces the main contours of the contemporary debate. Several versions of the view that God is timeless are explained and the major arguments for timelessness are developed and criticized. Divine temporality is also explored and arguments in its favor are presented along with criticisms. In addition, some views that attempt to occupy a middle ground will be considered.
Table of Contents
- God’s Relation to Time — Preliminaries
- Divine Timelessness
- Arguments for Divine Timelessness
- Divine Temporality
- Arguments for Temporality
- Some In-between Views
- References and Further Reading
Theism is the view that there exists a person who is, in significant ways, unlike every other person. This person, whom we will call “God,” is the creator of the entire universe. Atheism is the view that such a person does not exist. Any theistic world-view includes some notion of how God is related to this universe. There must be some account of how God relates to events, things, and people within the universe and of how God is related to what we could call the structure of the universe. That is, how God is related to space and to time. If God is the creator of the universe, the question arises as to whether God created space and time as well. The answers to these questions turn on whether space and time are parts or aspects of the universe or whether they are more fundamental. Not many theologians or philosophers think that space is more fundamental than the universe. They think that God brought space into being. This view implies that God is in some sense spaceless or “outside” space. God’s relation to time, however, is a topic about which there continues to be deep disagreement. From Augustine through Aquinas, the major thinkers argued that God was not in time at all. They thought of God as eternal, in the sense that he is timeless or atemporal. Now, the dominant view among philosophers is that God is temporal. His eternal nature is thought of as being everlasting rather than timeless. He never came into existence and he will never go out of existence but he exists within time.
Proponents of each of these positions attribute eternality to God. As a result, the term, “eternal” has come to be either ambiguous or a general term that covers various positions. In this article, the term, “eternal” will be used to refer to God’s relation to time, whatever it is. The term “temporal” will refer to God as within time and “timeless” will designate God as being outside time.
The majority position today, at least among philosophers, is that God is everlasting but temporal. That is, God never began to exist, and he will never go out of existence. God does, however, experience temporal succession. That is, God experiences some events (for example, the first century) before he experiences other events (for example, the twenty-first century.) If God is temporal, his existence and his thoughts and actions have temporal location. He exists at the present moment (and he has existed at each past moment and he will exist at each future moment.) In August, he was thinking about the heat wave in the mid-west. In the thirteenth century, he listened to and answered Aquinas’ prayers for understanding. His dealings, like those of the rest of us, occur at particular times.
The claim that God is timeless is a denial of the claim that God is temporal. First, God exists, but does not exist at any temporal location. Rather than holding that God is everlastingly eternal, and, therefore, he exists at each time, this position is that God exists but he does not exist at any time at all. God is beyond time altogether. It could be said that although God does not exist at any time God exists at eternity. That is, eternity can be seen as a non-temporal location as any point within time is a temporal location. Second, it is thought that God does not experience temporal succession. God’s relation to each event in a temporal sequence is the same as his relation to any other event. God does not experience the first century before he experiences the twenty-first. Both of these centuries are experienced by God in one “timeless now.” So, while it is true that in the thirteenth century Aquinas prayed for understanding and received it, God’s response to his prayers is not something that also occurred in that century. God, in his timeless state of being, heard Aquinas’ prayers and answered them. He did not first hear them and then answer them. He heard and answered in one timeless moment — in fact, he did so in the same timeless moment that he hears and answers prayers offered in the twenty-first century.
Some philosophers think that God’s relation to time cannot be captured by either of the categories of temporality or timelessness. Rather, God is in some third kind of relation to time. One in-between position is that God is not within our time, but he is within his own time. In this view, God’s inner life is sequential and, therefore, temporal, but his relation to our temporal sequence is “all at once.” In a sense, God has his own time line. He is not located at any point in our time line. On this view, God’s time does not map onto our time at all. His time is completely distinct from ours.
Another view is that God is “omnitemporal.” It is true on this view as well that God is not in our time, but he experiences temporal succession in his being. Our time is constituted by physical time. God’s time (metaphysical time) has no intrinsic metric and is constituted purely by the divine life itself (Padgett 1992, 2001; DeWeese 2002, 2004). If God is omnitemporal, his metaphysical time does map in some way onto our physical time. So there is a literal sense in which God knows now that I am typing this sentence now.
Another view (Craig, 2001a, 2001b) is that God became temporal when time was created. God’s existence without creation is a timeless existence but once temporal reality comes into existence, God himself must change. If he changes, then he is, at least in some sense, temporal. Just as it is not quite accurate to talk about what happens before time comes into existence, we should not describe this view as one in which God used to be timeless, but he became temporal. This language would imply that there was a time when God was timeless and then, later, there is another time when he is temporal. On this view, there was not a time when he was timeless. God’s timelessness without creation is precisely due to the fact that time came into existence with creation.
Many philosophers of religion think that the Scriptures do not teach definitively any one view concerning God and time (Craig 2001a, 2001b; for a differing view, see Padgett, 1992). The Scriptures do provide some parameters for acceptable theories of God’s relation to time, however. For example, they teach that God never began to exist and he will never go out of existence. They also teach that God interacts with the world. He knows what is going on, he reveals himself to people, he acts in such a way that things happen in time. They also teach that God is the Lord of all creation. Everything is subject to him. Philosophers generally take claims such as these as parameters for their thinking because of their concern either to remain within historical, biblical orthodoxy themselves or, at least, to articulate a position about God and time that is consistent with orthodoxy. Any departure from the broad outlines of orthodoxy, at least for many Christian philosophers of religion, is made as a last resort.
These parameters, as has been noted, allow for a plurality of positions about how God is related to time. Determining which position is most adequate involves trying to fit what we think about other aspects of God’s nature together with our thinking about God’s relation to time. What we want to say about God’s power or knowledge or omnipresence will have some bearing on our understanding of how it is that God is eternal. In addition, we will try to fit our theories together with other issues besides what God himself is like. Some of the most obvious issues include the nature of time, the nature of change and the creation of the universe.
Much of the contemporary discussion of timelessness begins with the article “Eternity” by Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann (Stump and Kretzmann, 1981). Stump and Kretzmann take their cue from Boethius who articulated what became a standard understanding of divine timelessness: “Eternity, then, is the whole, simultaneous and perfect possession of boundless life” (Boethius, 1973). Stump and Kretzmann identify four ingredients that they claim are essential to an eternal (timeless) being. (Although they cast their discussion in terms of an “eternal being,” this article will continue to use the term “timeless”.) First, any being that is timeless has life. Second, the life of a timeless thing is not able to be limited. Third, this life involves a special sort of duration. Anything that has life must have duration but the duration of a timeless being is not a temporal duration. Last, a timeless being possesses its entire life all at once. It is this last element that implies that the timeless being is outside time because a temporal living thing only possesses one moment of its life at a time.
The two aspects of divine timelessness that Stump and Kretzmann emphasize are that a timeless being has life and that this life has a duration, though not a temporal duration. The duration of the life of a timeless being puts the nature of such a being in stark contrast with the nature of abstract objects such as numbers or properties. The picture of God that this view leaves us with is of a being whose life is too full to exist only at one moment at a time.
The challenge for a defender of a timeless conception of God is to explain how such a God is related to temporal events. For example, God is directly conscious of each moment of time. The relation of his timeless cognition and the temporal objects of his cognition cannot be captured by using strictly temporal relations such as simultaneity because temporal simultaneity is a transitive relation. God is timelessly aware of the fall of Rome and, in the same timeless now, he is aware of my spilling my coffee. The fall of Rome is not, however, occurring at the same time that my coffee spills. What is needed is some non-transitive notion of God’s relation to the temporal world. To this end, Stump and Kretzmann introduce the notion of “ET (eternal-temporal)-simultaneity:”
(ET) for every x and every y, x and y are ET-simultaneous if and only if:
- either x is eternal and y is temporal, or vice versa; and
- for some observer, A, in the unique eternal reference frame, x and y are both present — that is, either x is eternally present and y is observed as temporally present, or vice versa; and
- for some observer, B, in one of the infinitely many temporal reference frames, x and y are both present — that is, either x is observed as eternally present and y is temporally present, or vice versa. (Stump and Kretzmann, 1981: pp 230-231.)
If x and y are ET-simultaneous, one is timeless and the other temporal. This fact preserves the non-symmetrical and non-transitive nature of the relation. If ET-simultaneity captures the truth about God’s relation to a temporal world, then we do not have to worry about the fall of Rome occurring at the same time that I spill my coffee.
Unfortunately, there are numerous difficulties with ET-simultaneity. Philosophers have complained about obscurity of the use of “reference frame” terminology (for example, Padgett 1992). There is clearly an analogy with relativity theory at work here. To put an analogy at the core of a technical definition is pedagogically suspect, at the least. It may be that it masks a deeper philosophical problem. Furthermore, Delmas Lewis (1984) has argued that a temporal being can observe something only if that thing is itself temporal and a timeless being can observe only what is timeless. Observation cannot cross the temporal/timeless divide. Therefore, the observation talk, as well as the reference frame talk, must be only analogous or metaphorical.
It has also been argued that the notion of atemporal duration, that Stump and Kretzmann hold to be required by the timeless view, is at bottom incoherent. Paul Fitzgerald (1985) has argued that for there to be duration in the life of God, it must be the case that two or more of God’s thoughts, for example, will have either the same or different amounts of duration. Different thoughts in God’s mind can be individuated by their respective lengths of duration or at least by their locations within the duration. Fitzgerald argues that if a timeless duration does not have these analogues with temporal or spatial duration, it is hard to think of it as a case of bona fide duration. On the other hand, if the duration in God’s life has this sort of duration, it is difficult to see that it is not simply one more case of temporal duration.
Stump and Kretzmann attempt to respond to such objections and have revised their analysis of ET-simultaneity accordingly. In their first response to Fitzgerald (Stump and Kretzmann, 1987), they make much of his analyzing timeless duration in a way that makes it incompatible with the traditional doctrine of divine simplicity. They will not accept any notion of God’s life that requires them to give up on the simplicity of the divine nature. For example, there cannot be any sort of sequence among distinct events or “moments” within the duration of God’s life. There are no distinct events or moments at all within the life of a God who is metaphysically simple. Although the two positions are linked throughout medieval thought, there is a cost to holding that a timeless God must be metaphysically simple as well. Any independent argument against divine simplicity (such as in Wolterstorff, 1991) will count against such a view of timelessness.
In a later response, Stump and Kretzmann put forward a new version of ET-simultaneity (called ET’):
(ET’): For every x and every y, x and y are ET-simultaneous if and only if:
- either x is eternal and y is temporal or vice versa (assume x is eternal and y temporal);
- with respect to some A in the unique eternal reference frame, x and y are both present — that is: (a) x is in the eternal present with respect to A, (b) y is in the temporal present, and (c) both x and y are situated with respect to A in such a way that A can enter into direct and immediate causal relations with each of them and (if capable of awareness) can be directly aware of each of them; and
- with respect to some B in one of the infinitely many temporal reference frames, x and y are both present — that is: (a) x is in the eternal present, (b) y is at the same time as B, and (c) both x and y are situated with respect to B in such a way that B can enter into direct and immediate causal relations with each of them and (if capable of awareness) can be directly aware of each of them. (Stump and Kretzmann, 1992)
This version of the principle eliminates the observation difficulties but continues to use the notion of reference frames to describe the timeless and the temporal states. Alan Padgett (1992) has argued that Stump and Kretzmann cannot be defending anything more than a loose analogy with relativity theory here. He points out that they admit that the use of relativity theory is a heuristic device and nothing more. Yet their analysis of the relation between a timeless being and events in time requires more than a loose analogy. As far as the Special Theory of Relativity is concerned, there is an absolute temporal simultaneity or an absolute temporal ordering between any two events within each other’s light cones. The problems with holding that simultaneity is absolute only arise when two events each of which is outside the other’s light cone are considered. If two events are outside each other’s light cones in this way, they cannot causally interact. This feature of Special Relativity makes the analogy of the relations between a timeless being and a temporal event on the one hand and the relations between events in different reference frames quite weak.
Brian Leftow has defended timeless duration in the life of God in another way. He holds that there are distinct moments within God’s life. These moments stand in the successive relations of earlier and later to one another, although they are not temporally earlier or later than one another. Leftow calls this view Quasi-Temporal Eternality (QTE) (Leftow 1991). A QTE being is timeless in that it lives all of its life at once. No moment of its life passes away and there is no moment at which some other moment has not yet been lived. Because the life of a QTE being has sequential moments, its duration is significantly like the duration or extension of the life of a temporal being. Because it experiences all of these moments “at once,” or in the same timeless now, it is a timeless being.
One advantage Leftow thinks his view affords is that it can meet Fitzgerald’s challenges while holding to the doctrine of divine simplicity. There can be the sort of duration that allows discrete moments to be individuated by location in the life of a metaphysically simple, timeless God. Leftow argues that there is a significant difference between a being that has spatial or material parts and a being that has a duration consisting of different moments or positions or points. If the duration of God’s life was made up of discrete parts, God could not be a metaphysically simple being. Points are not parts, however. A finite line segment is not made up of some finite number of points such that the addition or subtraction of a (finite) number of points will change its length. If the points or moments or positions in the duration of the life of God are not to count as parts of that life, they must be of zero finite length.
Fitzgerald had criticized Stump and Kretzmann’s notion of timeless duration by insisting that any duration must be made up of distinct positions. This charge will not affect Leftow’s position. Leftow allows that in the life of a timeless God (and a metaphysically simple God) there are distinct points. He insists that these points are not parts in the life of God. Therefore God is not a being whose life contains distinct parts. He is metaphysically simple. His life does contain points that are ordered sequentially, however. So the QTE God with its sequential points allows God to have the sort of duration that Fitzgerald wanted, yet be timeless. In this way, the QTE concept of timeless duration is more satisfactory than the one put forward by Stump and Kretzmann.
Timeless duration, in Leftow’s understanding, shares features with temporal duration. In a recent essay, he defends the idea that such features can be shared without rendering God temporal (Leftow 2002). He distinguishes between those properties that make something temporal and those that are typically temporal. A typically temporal property (TTP) is a property that is typical of temporal events and which helps make them temporal. Having some TTP is not sufficient to make an event a temporal event, however. What will make an event temporal is having the right TTPs. Leftow notes that nearly everyone who argues that God is timeless also holds that God’s life has at least some TTPs. Similarly, no one who holds that God is temporal thinks that God has every TTP. For example, being wholly future relative to some temporal event is a TTP; but God, even if he is temporal, does not have that property. God has no beginning. As a result his life is not wholly future to any temporal event.
God’s life, like any life, is an event, but it is one in which time does not pass and in which no change takes place. This description captures what is meant by a timeless duration. While having a duration and being an event are each cases of TTPs, Leftow has well-argued that they are not the sort of TTP that only temporal beings can have. God’s life, then, can be a timeless duration.
Which other TTPs does God have if he is timeless? God’s life also has a present, Leftow argues. Having a present is a TTP, but God’s present is a non-temporal present. God’s “now” is not a temporal now. “Now” is the answer to the question asked of some event, “When does it occur?” The term, “now,” according to Leftow, picks out when the speaker tokens it. Not all whens are times, however. Eternity, in the sense of being a timeless location, can also be a when (see also Leftow 1991). “At eternity” can be the answer to the question, “When does God act?”
Leftow’s analysis of these typically temporal properties shows that some of the objections to timeless duration and a timeless God’s relation to a temporal world are not decisive. A timeless God can be present, though not temporally present, to the world. He can have a life which is an event having duration, though not temporal duration. So the critics of Stump and Kretzmann are correct in so far as they argue that these properties are the sort of things that make their bearers temporal. It may be that though things that have these properties are typically temporal, they are not necessarily so.
Katherin Rogers (1994, 2000) has argued that both Leftow and Stump and Kretzmann have not succeeded in articulating a compelling, or even coherent, notion of divine timeless duration. She challenges their claims that the views of timelessness found in Boethius and other medieval thinkers include duration. These texts, she argues, are at best ambiguous. Given their background in Plotinus and Augustine, Rogers argues that it is better not to read these philosophers as attributing duration to the life of God. Augustine and Anselm especially express the notion of timelessness by the use of the notion of the present.
Even if the medieval thinkers did think of timelessness as involving duration, the more difficult question is whether we ought to think about it in this way. Rogers points out that both Stump and Kretzmann and Leftow, in defending the notion of divine timelessness against common objections do not make use of their distinctive notions of timeless duration at all. Furthermore, the explanations given of the coherence of timeless duration are not compelling.
Stump and Kretzmann use the analogy of two parallel lines (Stump and Kretzmann 1987: 219). The higher one is completely illuminated (all at once) while the lower has illuminated a point at a time moving with uniform speed. The light on each line represents the indivisible present. The entirety of the timeless line is one indivisible present while each point on the temporal line is a present (one at a time). In this way the life of God is stretched out, so to speak, alongside temporal reality.
This analogy breaks down at crucial points. Rogers argues that the line representing timelessness (call this line, “E”) either is made of distinct points or it is not. It if is not, then timelessness has no duration. If it is, then these points must correspond in some way to the points on the temporal line (called “T”). The geometric aspect of the analogy is strained considerably when it is seen that some point on T (call it T1) is going to be much closer to a point on E (E1) then the point T235 will be. Yet all of God’s life must stand in the same relation to each point in time, if God is to be truly timeless. Rogers points out that such an analogy is never found in the medieval writers. Their favorite geometric analogy is the circle and the point at the center. The circle represents all of time and the dot, timelessness. Timelessness stands in the same relation to each point along the temporal array. The point itself has no extension or parts.
If God is a QTE being, then his timeless life does have earlier and later points. These are not experienced by God sequentially, however. They are experienced all at once in the one timeless now. Rogers argues that Leftow has two options. Either he must argue for a principled distinction between there being moments in God’s life and his experiencing these moments (such that the moments can exist sequentially but be experienced all at once) or he must grant that earlier and later moments of God’s life can also be simultaneous. Neither alternative increases the plausibility or the clarity of the claim that God’s life has timeless duration.
Rogers offers a non-geometric analogy, found in Augustine (1993), that captures the relation between a timeless God and temporal reality. God’s relation to the world is similar to human memory of the past. Just as in one present mental exercise, a human being can call to mind a whole series of events that are themselves sequential, God in his timeless state can know the whole sequence of temporal events non-sequentially.
Rogers’s position, then, is that God’s timeless life does not involve duration. She does not think that denying duration to God’s life reduces it to some kind of frozen or static existence. These terms are temporal in nature. They each imply a motionless state through a period of time. She writes, “With the exception of lacking extension, God is nothing like a geometric point” (Rogers, 1994, p 14). His life does, however, lack extension.
Although there are many arguments for the claim that God is timeless, this essay will look at three of the most important. These are arguments concerning God’s knowledge of future free actions, the fullness of God’s life, and God’s creation of the universe. In addition, we will look at some responses to these arguments.
The most prominent argument for divine timelessness is that this position offers a solution to the problem of God’s foreknowledge of free actions. The challenge of reconciling human freedom and divine omniscience is best seen if we presume that God is temporal. If God is omniscient and infallible, he knows every truth, and he is never mistaken. If human beings are free in a libertarian sense, then some actions a person performs are up to her in the sense that she can initiate or refrain from initiating the action. The problem arises if it is supposed that someone will (in the future) choose freely some particular action. Suppose Jeanie will decide tomorrow to make a cup of tea at 4:00 pm. If this is a free act on her part, it must be within her power to make the cup of tea or to refrain from making it. If God is in time and knows everything, then hundreds of years ago, he already knew that Jeanie would make the cup of tea. When tomorrow comes, can Jeanie refrain from making the cup of tea? As Nelson Pike has argued, (Pike 1965) she can do so only if it is within her power to change what it was that God believed from the beginning of time. So, although God has always believed that she would make the tea, she must have the power to change what it was that God believed. She has to be able to make it the case that God always believed that she would not make the cup of tea. Many philosophers have argued that no one has this kind of power over the past, so human freedom is not compatible with divine foreknowledge.
If God is timeless, however, it seems that this problem does not arise. God does not believe things at points in time and Jeanie does not, therefore, have to have power over God’s past beliefs. She does need power over his timeless beliefs. This power is not seen to be problematic because God’s timeless knowledge of an event is thought to be strongly analogous to our present knowledge of an event. It is the occurring of the event that determines the content of our knowledge of the event. So too, it is the occurring of the event that determines the content of God’s knowledge. If Jeanie makes a cup of tea, God knows it timelessly. If she refrains, he knows that she refrains. God’s knowledge is not past but it is timeless.
One might argue that even if God is temporal, the content of his foreknowledge is determined by the occurring of the event in the same way. This claim, of course, is true. There are two items which allow for difficulty here. First, it is only in the case of a temporal God foreknowing Jeanie’s making tea that she needs to have counterfactual power over the past, Second, if God knew a hundred years ago that she was going to make tea, there is a sense in which she can “get in between” God’s knowledge and the event. In other words, the fact that God knows what he knows is fixed before she initiated the event. If it is a free choice on her part, she can still refrain from making the tea. Her decision to make tea or not stands temporally between the content of God’s beliefs and the occurring of the event.
The position that God is timeless is often cited as the best solution to the problem of reconciling God’s knowledge of the future and human freedom. If God is timeless, after all, he does not foreknow anything. Boethius, Anselm, Aquinas and many others have appealed to God’s atemporality to solve this problem.
While the proposal that God is timeless seems to offer a good strategy, at least one significant problem remains. This problem is that of prophecy. Suppose God tells Moses, among other things, that Jeanie will make a cup of tea tomorrow. Now we have a different situation entirely. While God’s knowledge that Jeanie will make a cup of tea is not temporally located, Moses’ knowledge that Jeanie will make tea is temporally located. Furthermore, since the information came from God, Moses cannot be mistaken about the future event (Widerker 1991, Wierenga, 1991).
The prophet problem is a problem, some will argue, only if God actually tells Moses what Jeanie will do. God, it seems, does not tell much to Moses or any other prophet. After all, why should God tell Moses? Moses certainly does not care about Jeanie’s cup of tea. Since prophecy of this sort is pretty rare, we can be confident that God’s knowledge does not rule out our freedom. Some have argued, however, that if it is even possible for God to tell Moses (or anyone else for that matter) what Jeanie will do, then we have a version of the same compatibility problem we would have if we held that God is in time and foreknows her tea making. We could call this version, the “possible prophet” problem. If the possible prophet problem is serious enough to show that God’s timeless knowledge of future acts (future, that is, from our present vantage point) is incompatible with those acts being free, then holding God to be timeless does not solve the problem of foreknowledge.
In thinking about God’s nature, we notice that whatever God is, he is to the greatest degree possible. He knows everything that it is possible to know. He can do anything that it is possible to do. He is maximally merciful. This “maximal property idea” can be applied as well to the nature of God’s life. God is a living being. He is not an abstract object like a number. He is not inanimate like a magnetic force. He is alive. If whatever is true of him is true of him to the greatest degree possible, then his life is the fullest life possible. Whatever God’s life is like, he surely has it to the fullest degree.
Some philosophers have argued that this fact about God’s life requires that he be timeless. No being that experiences its life sequentially can have the fullest life possible. Temporal beings experience their lives one moment at a time. The past is gone and the future is not yet. The past part of a person’s life is gone forever. He can remember it, but he cannot experience it directly. The future part of his life is not yet here. He can anticipate it and worry about it, but he cannot yet experience it. He only experiences a brief slice of his life at any one time. The life of a temporal thing, then, is spread out and diffuse.
It is the transient nature of our experience that gives rise to much of the wistfulness and regret we may feel about our lives. This feeling of regret lends credibility to the idea that a sequential life is a life that is less than maximally full. Older people sometimes wish for earlier days, while younger people long to mature. We grieve for the people we love who are now gone. We grieve also for the events and times that no longer persist.
When we think about the life of God, it is strange to think of God longing for the past or for the future. The idea that God might long for some earlier time or regret the passing of some age seems like an attribution of weakness or inadequacy to God. God in his self-sufficiency cannot in any way be inadequate. If it is the experience of the passage of time that grounds these longings, there is good reason not to attribute any experience of time to God. Therefore, it is better to think of God as timeless. He experiences all of his life at once in the timeless present. Nothing of his life is past and nothing of it is future. Boethius’ famous definition of eternity captures this idea: “Eternity, then, is the whole, simultaneous and perfect possession of boundless life” (Boethius, 1973). Boethius contrasts this timeless mode of being with a temporal mode: “Whatever lives in time proceeds in the present and from the past into the future, and there is nothing established in time which can embrace the whole space of its life equally, but tomorrow surely it does not yet grasp, while yesterday it has already lost” (Boethius, 1973).
However, those who think that God is in some way temporal do not want to attribute weakness or inadequacy to God. Nor do they hold that God’s life is less than maximally full. They will deny, rather, that God cannot experience a maximally full life if he is temporal. These philosophers will point out that many of our regrets about the passage of time are closely tied to our finitude. It is our finitude that grounds our own inadequacy, not our temporality. We regret the loss of the past both because our lives are short and because our memories are dim and inaccurate. God’s life, temporal though it may be, is not finite and his memory is perfectly vivid. He does not lose anything with the passage of time. Nor does his life draw closer to its end. If our regrets about the passage of time are more a function of our finitude than of our temporality, much of the force of these considerations is removed.
One important issue that this argument concerning the fullness of God’s life ought to put to rest is the idea that those who hold God to be timeless hold that God is something inert like a number or a property. Whether or not they are correct, the proponent of timelessness holds that it is the fullness of God’s life (rather than its impoverishment) that determines his relation to time.
Another argument for God’s timelessness begins with the idea that time itself is contingent. If time is contingent and God is not, then it is at least possible that God exist without time. This conclusion is still far from the claim that God is, in fact, timeless but perhaps we can say more. If time is contingent, then it depends upon God for its existence. Either God brought time into existence or he holds it in existence everlastingly. (The claim that time is contingent, though, is not uncontroversial. Arguments for the necessity of time will be considered below.)
If God created time as part of his creation of the universe, then it is important whether or not the universe had a beginning at all. Although it might seem strange to think that God could create the universe even if the universe had no beginning, it would not be strange to philosophers such as Thomas Aquinas. Working within the Aristotelean framework, he considered an everlasting universe to be a very real possibility. He argued (in his third way) that even a universe with an infinite past would need to depend upon God for its existence. In his view, even if time had no beginning, it was contingent. God sustains the universe, and time itself, in existence at each moment that it exists.
The majority position today is that the universe did have a beginning. What most people mean by this claim is that the physical universe began. It is an open question for many whether time had a beginning or whether the past is infinite. If the past is infinite, then it is metaphysical time and not physical time that is everlasting. Arguments such as the Kalam Cosmological Argument aim to show that it is not possible that the past is infinite (Craig and Smith, 1993; Craig 2001b). Suppose time came into existence with the universe so that the universe has only a finite past. This means that physical time was created by God. It may be the case that metaphysical time is infinite or that God created “pure duration” (metaphysical time) also. In the latter case, God had to be timeless. God created both physical and metaphysical time and God existed entirely without time. God, then, had to be timeless. Unless God became temporal at some point, God remains timeless.
The position that God is temporal sometimes strikes the general reader as a position that limits the nature of God. Philosophers who defend divine temporality are committed to a similar methodology to that held by those who are defenders of timelessness. They aim to work within the parameters of historical, biblical orthodoxy and to hold to the maximal property idea that whatever God is, he is to the greatest possible degree. Thus, proponents of divine temporality will hold that God is omniscient and omnipotent. God’s temporality is not seen as a limit to his power or his knowledge or his being. Those who hold to a temporal God often work on generating solutions to the challenge of divine foreknowledge and human freedom. They work within the notion that God knows whatever can be known and is thus omniscient. Even those philosophers who argue that God cannot know future free actions defend divine omniscience. They either think that there are no truths about future free actions or that none of those truths can be known, even by God (Hasker, 1989 and Pinnock et al., 1994). God is omniscient because he knows everything that can be known. Divine temporality is not a departure from orthodox concepts of God.
In fact, it is often the commitment to biblical orthodoxy itself that generates the arguments that God is best thought of as temporal. After all, the Pslamist affirms that God is ‘from everlasting to everlasting.’ (Psalm 90:2) It looks like what is affirmed is God’s everlasting temporality. Two of these arguments will be discussed: the argument that divine action in the world requires temporality and the argument that God’s knowledge of tensed facts requires that he be temporal.
God acts in the world. He created the universe and he sustains it in existence. God’s sustaining the universe in its existence at each moment is what keeps the universe existing from moment to moment. If, at any instant, it were not sustained, it would cease to exist. If God sustains the universe by performing different actions at different moments of time, then he changes from moment to moment. If God changes, then he is temporal.
God’s interventions in the world are often interactions with human beings. He redeems his people, answers their prayer, and forgives their sin. He also comes to their aid and comforts and strengthens them. Can a proponent of divine timelessness make sense of God interacting in these ways? It all depends, of course, on what the necessary conditions for interaction turn out to be. If it is not possible to answer a request (a prayer) unless the action is performed after the request, then the fact that God answers prayer will guarantee that he is temporal. Some thinkers have thought that an answer can be initiated only after a request. Others have argued that, although answers to requests normally come after the request, it is not necessary that they do so. In order to count as an answer, the action must occur because of the request. Not any because of relation will do, however. An answer is not normally thought of as being caused by the request, yet a cause-effect relation is a kind of because of relation. Answers are contingent whereas effects of causes are in some sense necessary. The because of relation that is relevant to answering a request has to do with intention or purpose.
In some cases, it seems that it is not necessary for the request to come before the answer. If a father knows that his daughter will come home and ask for a peanut butter sandwich, he can make the sandwich ahead of time. There is some sense in which he is responding to her request, even if he has not yet been asked. If the relation between a request and an answer is not necessarily a temporal one, then a timeless God can answer prayer. He hears all our prayers in his one timeless conscious act and in that same conscious act, he wills the answers to our various requests.
Perhaps the effects of God’s actions are located successively in time but his acting is not. In one eternal act he wills the speaking to Moses at one time and the parting of the sea at another. So Moses hears God speaking from the bush at one time and much later Moses sees God part the sea. But in God’s life and consciousness, these actions are not sequential. He wills timelessly both the speaking and the parting. The sequence of the effects of God’s timeless will does not imply that God’s acts themselves are temporal.
Although God’s knowledge of the future is thought by many to be a strong support for divine timelessness, many philosophers think that God’s knowledge of the present strongly supports his temporality. If God knows everything, he must know what day it is today. If God is timeless, so the argument goes, he cannot know what day it is today. Therefore, he must be temporal. (This argument is put forward in various ways by Craig, 2001a, 2001b; DeWeese, 2004; Hasker, 2002; Kretzmann, 1966; Padgett, 1992, 2001 and Wolterstorff, 1975.)
To get at the claim that a timeless God cannot know what day it is, we can start with the facts that a timeless God cannot change and that God knows everything it is possible to know. But if God knows that today is December 13, 2006, tomorrow he will know something else. He will know that yesterday it was December 13, 2006 and that today is December 14, 2006. So God must know different things at different times. If the contents of God’s knowledge changes, he changes. If he changes, he is temporal and not timeless.
The quick answer to this concern is to deny that God knows something different at different times. First, it is obvious that someone who holds that God is timeless does not think that God knows things at times at all. God’s knowings are not temporally located even if what he knows is temporally located. It is not true, it will be insisted, that God knows something today. He knows things about today but he knows these things timelessly.
God knows that today is December 13 in that he knows that the day I refer to when I use the word “today” in writing this introduction is December 13. When we raise the question again tomorrow (“Can a timeless God know what day it is today?”), God knows that this second use of “today” refers to December 14. Temporal indexical terms such as “today,” “tomorrow,” and “now” refer to different temporal locations with different uses. In this way they are similar to terms such as “here,” “you,” and “me.” The point is that the meaning of any sentence involving an indexical term depends upon the context of its use. Since indexical terms may refer to different items with different uses, we can make such sentences more clear by replacing the indexical term with a term whose reference is fixed.
The sentence, “I am now typing this sentence” can be clarified by replacing the indexical terms with other terms that make the indexicals explicit. For example, “I type this sentence at 11:58 AM (EST) on December 13, 2006.” Even better is “Ganssle types this sentence at 11:58 AM (EST) on December 13, 2006.” These sentences, it can be claimed, express the same proposition. In the same way, “I am now writing here” can be clarified as “Ganssle writes on December 13, 2006 at11:58 AM (EST) in Panera Bread in Hamden, CT.” God, of course, knows all of the propositions expressed by these non-indexical sentences. Furthermore, the content of his knowledge does not need to change day to day. The proposition expressed by a non-indexical sentence is true timelessly (or everlastingly) if it is true at all. The proposition expressed by the sentence, “Ganssle types this sentence at 11:58 AM (EST) on December 13, 2006” will be true tomorrow and the next day and so on. God can know these things and be changeless. He can, therefore, be timeless.
There are many philosophers who reject this quick answer on the grounds that God can know all of the non-indexical propositions and still not know what is happening now. This kind of objection raises the second approach to the question of a timeless God’s knowledge of the present. This approach is not through change but through omniscience. I can know that you type a sentence at some date (call the date, t1) without knowing whether or not you are typing the sentence now. I might fail to know that t1 is now. A timeless God can know all propositions expressed by sentences of the form “event e occurs at tn.” Sentences of the form, “event e occurs now,” so the objection goes, express different propositions. In order for God to be omniscient, he must know all propositions. If some sentences are essentially indexical (if they do not express the same propositions as sentences of the form “event e occurs at tn“), he cannot know them. If a timeless God cannot know this kind of proposition, he is not omniscient.
There have been two basic kinds of responses to this line of argument. The first is to deny that there are propositions that are irreducibly indexical in this way. In knowing every proposition of the form “event e occurs at tn,” God knows every proposition about events. This response is, in effect, a defense of the quick answer given above. While this position has its adherents, it involves a commitment to the B-theory of time. The B-theory of time (also known as the tenseless theory or the stasis theory) entails the claim that the most fundamental features of time are the relations of “before,” “after,” and “simultaneous with.” Talk of tenses (past, present and future) can be reduced to talk about these relations. The temporal now is not an objective feature of reality but is a feature of our experience of reality. If the B-theory of time is true, this objection to divine timelessness is undermined.
Those who think that there are propositions about events that cannot be reduced to propositions of the form “event e occurs at tn,” hold the A-theory of time (or tensed or process theory.) The A-theory claims that there is an objective temporal now. This now is not a feature only of our subjective experience of reality but it is a piece of the furniture of the universe. Another way to explain this is that even if there were no temporal minds, the property of occurring now would be exemplified by some events and not others. There would be facts about what is happening now. The fundamental temporal properties are the tensed properties. So events objectively are past, present or future. They are not past, present or future only in virtue of their relation to other events. (The distinction between the A-theory and the B-theory of time was first articulated by J. M. E. McTaggart; see McTaggart, 1993.)
There are different versions of the A-theory and different versions of the B-theory. It is not for this essay to canvass all of these versions or to weigh the evidence for or against any of them. (For more information, see Le Poidevin and MacBeath, 1993; Oaklander and Smith, 1994; and the section “Are there Essentially Tensed Facts?” of the article on Time in this encyclopedia.) Suffice it to say that the A-theory is held more commonly than the B-theory. If the claim that all propositions about events can be reduced to propositions of the form “event e occurs at tn” entails a controversial theory of time, it will not be as successful a defense as many would like. This consideration, to be sure, does not mean that it might not be the correct response, but the burden of defending it is greater accordingly.
Another sort of response to the claim that divine omniscience requires that God is temporal is to embrace the conclusion of the argument and to hold that God is not propositionally omniscient even if he is factually omniscient. In other words, God knows every fact but there are some propositions that can be known only by minds that are located indexically. God is not lacking any fact. His access to each fact, though, is not indexical (Wierenga, 1989, 2002). He knows the same fact I know when I think “I am writing here today.” The proposition through which he knows this fact, however, is different than the proposition through which I know it. God knows the fact through the non-indexical proposition “Ganssle writes in Panera on December 13, 2006.” Embracing this solution is not without its costs. First of all we have to adjust how we describe God’s omniscience. We cannot describe it in terms of God’s knowing every proposition. It is not true, on this view, that God knows every proposition. God knows every fact.
One way to object to this view is to deny that propositions expressed by indexical and non- indexical sentences refer to or assert the same fact. To take this road is to hold that some facts are essentially indexical rather than just that some sentences or propositions are. This objection does not seem too plausible because of stories like the following. Suppose you assert to me (truly) “You are in the kitchen,” and I assert to you (also truly), “I am in the kitchen.” These sentences are not identical and, according to the view we are considering, they express different propositions. What makes both of these assertions true is one and the same fact; the fact consisting in a particular person (Ganssle) being in a particular place (the kitchen). My knowledge of this fact is mediated through a proposition that is expressed by sentences using the indexical “I” and your knowledge is mediated through propositions expressed by sentences using “you.” If there is one fact that makes these different indexical sentences true, it seems that there can be one fact that makes the following two indexical sentences true: “Ganssle is now typing” and “Ganssle types on December 13, 2006.” If these sentences are made true by the same fact, God can know all facts even if he does not know some facts in the same we know them. Our knowledge of facts is conditioned by our indexical location. That is, we know them the way we do in virtue of our personal, spatial and temporal coordinates.
A third response is possible. This response can be combined with the second and that is to deny that God’s knowledge is mediated by propositions at all. William Alston has argued that God knows what he knows without having any beliefs. God’s knowledge is constituted instead by direct awareness of the facts involved. This view entails that God’s omniscience is not to be cashed out in terms of propositions. Furthermore, if God’s knowledge of a fact consists in the presence of that fact to God’s consciousness, it may be that this presence does not affect God intrinsically. If this is the case, God can be aware of different facts in their different temporal locations without himself changing. Whether a strategy such as this one will succeed is an open question (Alston 1989; Ganssle 1993, 1995, 2002c).
Many philosophers who argue for divine temporality structure their arguments as follows: If God is timeless, the B-theory of time must be true. But the B-theory of time is false. Therefore, God is not timeless. Philosophers who defend divine timelessness, then, take one of two tacks. Either they embrace the first premise and hold to the B-theory of time (Helm 1988, 2001; Rogers 2000) or they argue against the second premise. God can be timeless even if the A-theory of time is true. In this case, they try to show that a timeless God can know tensed facts without changing himself. Some advocates of timelessness will try to reconcile their view with the A-theory whether or not it is the theory of time they hold. Since the A-theory is the more widely held, showing God’s timelessness to be compatible with it helps strengthen the overall case for timelessness.
Alan Padgett and Gary DeWeese (Padgett 1992, 2001; DeWeese 2002, 2004) have each argued that God is not in physical time although he is everlastingly temporal. God’s time is metaphysical time. Padgett and DeWeese, as is to be expected, emphasize different things in the details. For example, Padgett allows for the coherence of a timeless God while DeWeese would endorse the view that any timeless entity is causally inert. No person, then, can be timeless. Only abstract objects such as numbers and properties can exist outside time. Nevertheless, their positions are similar enough to treat them together. The claim that God is “relatively timeless” or “omnitemporal” allows its proponents to endorse some of the criticisms of divine timelessness and, at the same time, affirm some of the arguments for timelessness. Each affirms the argument that God can be timeless only if the B-theory of time is true and that the B-theory is false. They also can hold that God’s life cannot be contained in the measured moments of physical time. They each also affirm that God created time (physical time) as he created the physical universe.
It is with these latter claims that they make the distinction between physical and metaphysical time. Physical time is metric time. In other words, it is time that has an intrinsic metric due to regularities in the physical universe. Events such as the earth revolving around the sun are regular enough to mark off units of time. Metaphysical time involves no metric or measured temporal intervals. God, in himself, is immune from temporal measure. These temporal items depend upon the physical measure of time. This measure is a function of the regular processes that follow physical laws. Since God is not subject to the laws of nature, he is not subject to measured time. He does experience a temporal now, somewhat as we do, but his intrinsic experience is not measured by regular, law-like intervals. He experiences temporal succession, but this succession is that of the progression of his own consciousness and actions rather than that of any external constraints. Now that God has created a universe that unfolds according to regular laws, there is a metric within created time. So while God’s now coincides with the now of physical time, the measured intervals do not belong to his divine life.
These positions combine some of the strengths both of the temporalist with strengths of the timelessness position. The challenge might consist in finding a stable middle ground between timelessness and temporality. When metaphysical time is described as being without metric and without law-like intervals, and perhaps even that God does not change before physical time is created, it becomes more difficult to see the difference between this position and timelessness. The main difference is that on this view, God remains temporal and capable of change even when no change happens in the divine life (for example, before creation). On the other hand, when the co-location of God’s experience of his now and the now of physical time is emphasized, the distinction between the two becomes more difficult to see. William Lane Craig, who holds a similar position, identifies God’s time with the absolute time that was posited by Newton (Craig 2001a, 2001b, 2002). With this notion in place, one can see that physical time is that to which the Special Theory of Relativity applies. Craig and others insist that if relativity theory is interpreted along neo-Lorentzian lines rather than along the lines recommended by Einstein, there is room for a privileged reference frame and, therefore, a cosmic time (Craig 2002). But this cosmic or “absolute” time may still apply only to this universe and not to God.
William Lane Craig’s own position includes another variation. He holds that God is temporal in that he is within metaphysical time. This feature of God’s life is due to the creation of time. Once God created the universe, he became temporal. Prior to creation, God was timeless. Of course, it is not right to say “prior to creation” in any literal sense. The way Craig describes his view is that God without creation is timeless; God with creation is temporal.
If God has shifted his eternal position in this way, then some of the arguments against timelessness or against temporality will have to be rejected. For example, God in his timeless state is omniscient. He is not lacking any knowledge at all. God must know, in his timeless state, that I am typing now. If God (without creation) can know that I am typing now, then it seems that a timeless God with creation can know that I am typing now. Therefore, God’s timelessness is not incompatible with the A-theory of time (Hasker 2003). Craig’s response is that until the universe is created, there is no time and so all tensed propositions are false. What God, in his timeless state without creation knows is the tenseless proposition “Ganssle types on December 14, 2006.” Once the universe is created, time is real and these tenseless sentences do not capture all the facts there are. In order to be omniscient once time exists, God must also know that I type now.
The challenge with this response is that it appears to endorse some of the strategies to make the B-theory work. Remember the A-theory of time is the view that the most fundamental things about time are the locations of past, present and future. The B-theory holds that the most fundamental aspects of time are the relations before, after, and simultaneous with. On Craig’s view, it is hard to argue that the A-locations are more fundamental than the B-relations when there can be facts of the B-sort that have no A-locations. Without creation, it is a fact that I type this sentence on December 14, 2006. Once time is created, there are further facts such as whether I type it now, or have already done so. The fact that I type it on December 14 seems to be more fundamental than the facts that come into existence when time is created.
Craig’s position raises another interesting question. Is it possible for a timeless being to become temporal or for a temporal being to become timeless? The philosophers whose views have been discussed will disagree about the answer to this question. Stump and Kretzmann, for example, would not think such a change possible. Their view of divine timelessness is deeply connected with divine simplicity which, in turn, is seen to be part of God’s essential nature. DeWeese also would not allow for this sort of change since no timeless being can be a person or stand in any causal relations on his view. Craig thinks that it is possible.
Questions about God’s relation to time involve many of the most perplexing topics in metaphysics. These include the nature of the fundamental structures of the universe as well as the nature of God’s own life. It is not surprising that the questions are still open even after over two millennia of careful inquiry. While philosophers often come to conclusions that are reasonably settled in their mind, they are wise to hold such conclusions with an open hand.
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Gregory E. Ganssle
U. S. A.