Time

clock2Time is what a clock is used to measure. Information about time tells the durations of events, and when they occur, and which events happen before which others, so time has a very significant role in the universe's organization. Nevertheless, despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, there are many unresolved issues.

Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our dim memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. Hitler's rise to power is past for you but future for Aristotle. This third theory is often called “eternalism.”

Here is a list of other issues, in no particular order: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •Why time exists at all; •Why time has an arrow; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Which features of our ordinary sense of the word "time" should be captured by the concept of time in physics; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth-values now; •When time will end; •Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically fundamental; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •Whether there are points of time; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Whether time is objective or, instead, subjective; •How else time is related to mind; •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges; •Whether time is unreal either by being an illusion or by being wholly conventional; •If time is not wholly conventional, then which aspects of time are conventional; and •How to settle the disputes between advocates of McTaggart's A-theory of time and his B-theory of time.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. How Is Time Related to Mind?
  3. What Is Time?
  4. Why Is There Time Instead of No Time?
  5. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
    1. History of the Debate up to Kant
    2. History of the Debate after Kant
  6. What Does Science Require of Time?
  7. Does Time Have a Beginning or End?
  8. Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?
  9. Which Aspects of Time Are Conventional?
  10. Arguments that Time Is Not Real
  11. What Kinds of Time Travel Are Possible?
    1. To the Future?
    2. To the Past?
  12. McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory
  13. What Is the Flow of Time?
  14. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?
    3. Persistence and Four-Dimensionalism
    4. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences
    5. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?
  15. What Gives Time Its Arrow?
    1. Time without an Arrow
    2. What Needs To Be Explained?
    3. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow
    4. Multiple Arrows
    5. Reversing the Arrow
  16. What Is Temporal Logic?
  17. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Else Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  18. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The word "time" has several meanings. It can mean the duration between events, as when we say the trip from home to work took too much time because of all the traffic. It can mean, instead, the temporal location of an event, as when we say he arrived at the time they specified. It also can mean the temporal structure of events, as when we speak of investigting time rather than space. This article uses the word in all these senses.

Philosophers of time would like to resolve as many issues as they can from the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary. Some issues are intimately related to others so that it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because they are on the opposite sides of most of those issues.

All the following ideas will be explained in more detail later; but members of the A-camp often say that McTaggart's A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; past events are always changing as they move farther into the past; the now is objectively real; so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental rather than untensed facts; the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional; and at least some A-predicates are not semantically reducible to B-predicates without loss of meaning. Persons are considered members of the A-camp if they accept a majority of the above claims.

Members of the B-camp reject most of the claims of the A-camp and accept the majority of the following claims. McTaggart's B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; events never undergo real change; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; the fundamental objects are four-dimensional, not three-dimensional; and A-predicates are reducible to B-predicates or at least the truth conditions of sentences using A-predicates can be adequately explained in terms of the truth conditions of sentences using B-predicates.

This article provides an introduction to the philosophical controversy between the A and B camps, as well as an introduction to other issues about time, for example the philosophical issue of the controversy about how to properly understand the relationship between the manifest image of time and the scientific image of time. This is the relationship between time as it is ordinarily and informally understood and time as it is understood within fundamental physical science, namely physics.

The manifest image is a collection of commonsense beliefs, and it is an important part of our implicit model of the world. It is not precisely definable, and experts disagree about whether this or that is part of the image, but it contains the following beliefs about time. The world was not created five minutes ago. Every event has a unique duration which can be assigned a measure such as its lasting so many seconds. Time is one-dimensional. Unlike space, time has a direction. Time is continuous; it is analog and not digital. Given any two events, they have some objective order such as one happening before the other, or their being simultaneous. Time flows like a river, and we directly experience the flow. There is a present that is objective, that everyone shares, and that divides everyone's past from their future. Past events are real in the way that future events are not. Time is independent of the presence or motion of matter. The future is "open" and does not exist. No event could occur both earlier and later than itself.

The earlier items on this list are common to both images, but the later items are not features of the scientific image because they conflict with science or are ignored by science. The terms manifest image and scientific image were coined by Wilfrid Sellars in 1960. As the body of scientific knowledge changes, the scientific image of time can change, but the manifest image doesn't vary significantly from one era or culture to another, even from ancient Hopi Indian culture to contemporary German culture.

Why would someone reject a feature of the manifest image in favor of the scientific image? To take an example that doesn't involve time, the manifest image implies a solid wooden table is not mostly empty space, but the scientific image implies it is. We accept that the table is mostly empty space because (i) the fundamental scientific theory of wooden materials, namely physics, implies the table is mostly empty space, and (ii) this scientific theory can be shown to account for our experiences that led us to our conviction that the table is wholly a solid substance without empty space, and (iii) the scientific theory can account for other facts that the commonsense view cannot. Proponents of the manifest image very often complain that their opponent does not succeed with step (ii). The reason for this is probably not that the step cannot be completed, but physicists don't bother with it because it is considered not to be part of their professional responsibilities. For example, the physicist Arthur Eddington says, "[T]he process by which the external world of physics is transformed into a world of familiar acquaintance in human consciousness is outside the scope of physics."

Is one of the two images better than the other for understanding time? The answer to this question has been and continues to be controversial in the literature on the philosophy of time. A. N. Prior gave one answer when he said that the theory of relativity is not about real time. Other philosophers of time disagree and say that any feature of the manifest image that conflicts with current science is an illusion. Craig Callender views the relationship of the two images differently:

In some very loose and coarse-grained sense, manifest time might be called an illusion without any harm done. However, for many of its aspects, it's a bit like calling our impression of a shape an illusion, and that seems wrong. (Callender 2017, p. 310)

For a summary of the variety of ways that analytic metaphysicians have attempted to improve the scientific image so that it does not fail to respect certain features of the manifest image, see (Callender 2017, p. 29).

2. How Is Time Related to Mind?

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time in human beings, by contrast, is indicated by our various internal, regular cyclic processes such as our heartbeats and repeated breathing, our sleep/wake cycle (circadian rhythm) and other hormonal and chemical and neuronal cycles. It is also indicated by signs of our aging. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called "subjective time" and "phenomenological time," and it is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time. The scientific image of time is the product of science's attempt to understand physical time.

There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of mental awareness or the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is often called "objective time."

When a physicist defines "speed" to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science; but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena. The existence of repetitive, predictable, cyclic processes within our body is a key reason why we believe time exists.

One reason why many people believe time exists is that they notice time by noticing a leaf fall. Change indicates the presence of time. The change here is ordinary change in time, not change in a tree's color from its gray trunk to its green leaves. But if we close our eyes, we still can encounter time just by imagining the leaf falling. What all these encounters with time have in common is that we are having more experiences and accumulating more memories of those experiences. So, our accumulation of memories tends to support our belief in the existence of time. But remembering, or imagining other times, is not a seeing into the past.

With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.

Psychological time's rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. At the end of viewing an engrossing television program, we think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” When we are hungry in the late morning and have to wait until we can leave work and go to lunch, we think, “Why is everything taking so long?” We notice the rate of passage also when we compare the experiences of younger people to older people. When we are younger, we lay down richer memories because everything is new. When we are older, the memories we lay down are much less rich because we have "seen it all before." That is why older people report that a decade goes by so much more quickly than it did when they were younger.

Do things seem to move more slowly when we are terrified? "Yes," most people would say. "No," says neuroscientist David Eagleman, "it's a retrospective trick of memory." The terrifying event does seem to you to move more slowly when you think about it later, but not at the time it is occurring. Because memories of the terrifying event are "laid down so much more densely," or richly, Eagleman says, it seems to you, upon your remembering, that your terrifying event lasted longer than it really did. For these events, remembered psychological time is stretched compared to physical time.

A major problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate this, but so far there is no consensus on either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do.

Although the cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats distinguish a five-second interval and a forty-second interval even with their cerebral cortex removed. So, a rat's means of sensing time is probably distributed throughout many places in its brain. Perhaps the human's time sense is similarly distributed. However, surely the fact that we know that we know about time is specific to our cerebral cortex. A rat does not know that it knows. It has competence without comprehension. A cerebral cortex is required for this comprehension.

Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. For example, is our direct experience only of the momentary present, the instantaneous present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of the "specious present," a present that lasts a short stretch of physical time?

Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, the best estimate of its duration in physical time is eighty milliseconds for human beings, although neuroscientists do not yet know why it is not two milliseconds or one hour. There is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our unified stream of consciousness.

Neuroscientists have come to agree that the brain does take an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. As one piece of suggestive evidence, notice that if you look at yourself in the mirror and glance at your left eyeball, then at your right eyeball, and then back to the left, you can never see your own eyes move. Your brain always constructs a continuous story of non-moving eyes. However, a video camera taking a picture of your face easily records your eyeballs' movements.

We all live in the past—in the sense that our belief about what is happening occurs later than when it really happened according to a clock. This is because our brain takes time to reconstruct a story of what is happening based on the information coming in from our different sense organs. The story-building must wait those milliseconds until the brain acquires all the information from all the sense organs. Because of its long neck, a giraffe's specious present might last considerably longer than the 80 milliseconds for humans. However, it can't take too much longer in physical time for an organism to build its story of what is happening, or else the story is so outdated that the organism risks becoming a predator's lunch. Therefore, evolution has probably fine tuned each kind of organism's number of milliseconds.

In the early days of television broadcasting, engineers worried about the problem of keeping audio and video signals synchronized. Then they accidentally discovered that they had around a tenth-of-a-second of "wiggle room." As long as the signals arrive within this period, viewers' brains automatically resynchronize the signals; outside that tenth-of-a-second period, it suddenly looks like a badly dubbed movie. (Eagleman, 2009)

The light from the bounce of a basketball arrives into our eyes before the sound arrives into our ears, but then the brain builds a story in which the vision and sound of the bounce happen simultaneously. This sort of subjective synchronizing of vision and sound works for the bouncing ball so long as the ball is less than 100 feet away. Any farther and we begin to notice that the sound arrives more slowly.

In some of neuroscientist David Eagleman's experiments, he has shown clearly that a person can be tricked into believing event A occurred before event B, when in fact the two occurred in the reverse order according to clock time. For more on these topics, see (Eagleman, 2011).

The "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. With repeated events lasting the same amount of clock time, presenting a brighter object will make that event seem to last longer. Similarly, for louder sounds.

Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our ability to anticipate the future, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the correct time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine for a while, and are temporarily closed off from communicating with the world above. For a long while, you can keep track of how long you've been inside the mine.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backward off a ledge into a net; and trying different forms of meditation. These avenues definitely affect the ease with which pulses of neurotransmitters can be sent from one neuron to a neighboring neuron and thus affect our psychological time, but so far, none of these avenues has led to success productivity-wise.

Philosophers of time and psychologists are interested in both how a person's temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and what kind of interventions in a healthy person's brain might control that person's temporal experience.

Do we directly experience the present? This is controversial. Those who answer "yes" tend to accept McTaggart's A-theory of time. But notice how different such direct experience would have to be from our other direct experiences. We directly experience green color but can directly experience other colors. We directly experience high-pitched notes but can directly experience low-pitched notes. Can we say we directly experience the present but can directly experience the past or future? Definitely not. So, direct experience of the present either is non-existent, or it is a very strange sort of direct experience. Nevertheless, we probably do have some mental symbol for nowness in our mind that correlates with our having the concept of the present, but it does not follow from this that we directly experience the present any more than our having a concept of love implies that we directly experience love.

To mention one more issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and add “Whose future?”

The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon such as a secondary quality, is explored elsewhere in this article.

According to René Descartes' dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in both space and time because of appropriate functioning of our brain.

For our final issue about time and mind, do we humans have an a priori awareness of time that can be used to give mathematics on a firm foundation? In the early twentieth century, the mathematician and philosopher L.E.J. Brouwer believed so. Many mathematicians and philosophers at that time were suspicious that mathematics was not as certain as they hoped for, and they worried that contradictions might be uncovered within mathematics. Their suspicions were raised by the discovery of Russell’s Paradox and the introduction into set theory of the controversial non-constructive axiom of choice. In response, Brouwer attempted to place mathematics on what he believed to be a firmer epistemological foundation by arguing that mathematical concepts are admissible only if they can be constructed from an ideal mathematician’s vivid, a priori awareness of time, what in Kantian terminology would be called an intuition of inner time. Brouwer supported Kant's claim in the early 1800s that arithmetic is the pure form of temporal intuition. Brouwer tried to show how to construct higher level mathematical concepts (for example, the mathematical line) from lower level temporal intuitions, but unfortunately he had to accept the consequence that his program required both rejecting Aritotle's law of excluded middle in logic and rejecting some important theorems in mathematics such as the theorem that every real number has a decimal expansion and the theorem that there is an actual infinity as opposed to a potential infinity of points between any two points on a line (which is the key idea in the modern, standard solution to Zeno's Paradoxes). Unwilling to accept those inconsistencies with classical mathematics, most other mathematicians and philosophers instead rejected Brouwer's idea of an intimate connection between mathematics and time.

For a video presentation about psychological time, see (Carroll 2012) and (Eagleman 2011). For the role of time in phenomenology, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” According to the phenomenologist Edmund Husserl, "One cannot discover the least thing about objective time through phenomenological analysis" (Husserl, 1991, p. 6).

The remainder of this article is devoted to physical time.

3. What Is Time?

Aristotle is the first person known to have asked this question. What would be an acceptable answer? A metaphysician who asks, "What is a ghost?" does not want a definition of the word. What is wanted is a description of the most important features of ghosts, and knowledge of whether they exist and how they might be reliably detected if they do exist. We want something like this when we ask, "What is time?"

Here are three brief answers to the question.

(1) Physical time is what gets displayed on a clock.

This answer is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having a clock, especially a standard clock. We are lucky we live in a universe with so many different processes that can be used for clocks: pendulums, oscillating electric circuits, rotations of our planet, decay of radioactive carbon 14, candles that burn at a predictable rate, and so forth. Clocks count repetitions of some process that is regular in the sense that each repetition of the process has the same duration, the same amount of time. If it were just as likely for any process to go forward as to go backward, then there could be no clocks. We are lucky we live in a world in which we can define a useful standard clock. Some philosophers of physics go beyond this to make the metaphysical claim that there is nothing more to time than whatever numbers are displayed on our standard clock. The more common metaphysical position is that time is more than those numbers; it is what we intend to measure with those numbers.

(2) Time is what the time variable t is denoting in the best theories of fundamental science.

It is to the time parameter in these theories that scientists examine in order to understand what time is. The two most fundamental theories are the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics. An important feature of these theories is that, all other things being equal, time is symmetric in the sense that the outcomes of experiments should not depend on when the experiment took place.

And another answer to "What is time?"

(3) Time, relative to one clock in one reference frame, is a line-like structure on sets of simultaneous events, at least locally, and it normally has an arrow or direction that points toward the future.

The three answers are informative. However, when philosophers ask the question, they normally do not want such a succinct answer. They want to be told more about the nature of time. They complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only by adding a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.

So, let us continue to explore the nature of time. The exploration presupposes a realist perspective on the scientific theories to be discussed ahead. That is, it interprets them to mean what they say, and it does not take a fictionalist perspective on them by considering their apparently ontological implications as being merely useful fictions. This presupposition in the article is itself philosophically controversial.

The philosopher of time Craig Callender has joked that time is a big invisible thing that will kill you. More seriously, time is invisible and is not a physical object, although it is found in the processes of physical objects. When we use a clock intending to measure time, we do not measure time directly, but only indirectly, because the clock is directly measuring only a specific physical process within itself. Then that measurement is converted to a time or duration. Nevertheless, despite the fact that to measure time with a clock is only to compare one process with another, the clock is measuring time--or so most physicists claim. That is, they claim that underlying the measurements that can be made with clocks, there is something that its time display, its time coordinate t, is referring to. This claim is controversial and is discussed more thoroughly elsewhere in this article.

Whatever time is, it is not universal; it is not the same for each person. Two people with good clocks who move relative to each other will find that their clocks get out of syncyhrony with each other, yet both clocks are showing the correct proper time. This is a surprising implication of the theory of relativity, and it undermines a key ingredient of the manifest image.

Here are seven other important characteristics of time. (1) For any event, time fixes when it occurs. (2) For any event, it fixes that event's duration. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events occur simultaneously with it. (4) For any pair of non-simultaneous events, time fixes which one happens first. (5) It has an arrow pointing from the past toward the future. (6) For any event, there are other events that are infinitesimally before and after it in a sense which makes time locally continuous. (7) Time is one dimensional.

The implication of the special theory of relativity is that the first four of these seven characteristics are all relative in the sense that they can be different in different reference frames. Nevertheless, within a single reference frame, these are all key characteristics of time.

continuous vs discrete

Item (6) in the previous list says time is continuous. Relativity theory implies that part of the correct answer to the question "What is time?" is that, for a given reference frame, time is continuous in the sense of being locally a linear continuum of zero-duration instants. This implies time is smooth with no gaps, and no stops and re-starts; and any interval of time is a physical model of a segment of the real numbers in their normal order. Each instant corresponds to just one real number.

Physicists find it convenient to speak of instants as points of time, but there is a deep philosophical dispute about whether points of time actually exist, just as there is a similar dispute about whether spatial points actually exist. Some wish to replace instants and points with intervals.

Would it help, in answering our question, "What is time?" to have a precise definition of the word "time," the most common noun on the Internet? Shouldn't that definition be found before launching into an answer to what time really is? Well, this is an admirable project. The first step would be to clarify the difference between meaning and reference. The word "now" does not change its meaning every instant, but it does change its reference every instant. Ordinary-language philosophers have carefully studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953:

For a large class of cases—though not for all—in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.

If the word "time" were a member of this large class, then by drawing attention to linguistic use, to ordinary ways of using the word "time," Wittgenstein would expect that we will be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions. Unfortunately, the word "time" probably is not a member of the large class that Wittgenstein is speaking of, and even if it were, most philosophers want to know much more than what "time" means. Philosophers of time are usually not interested in precisely defining the word but rather are interested in what time's important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. For one example, they want to know about the relationship between the manifest image and the scientific image of time. For a second example, when Newton discovered that the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the moon were both caused by gravity, this was not a discovery about the meaning of "gravity," but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want some advance like this for time?

Let’s explore some noteworthy answers that have been given throughout history to the question, “What is time?”

Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is the measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time….” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11). The experts to this day are divided about whether to accept relationism and whether to accept the continuity of time.

René Descartes had a very different answer to, “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy).

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves; they are, to use his terminology, forms of human sensible intuition. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is "the form of inner sense" and “is an a priori condition of all appearance whatsoever” is probably best understood as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only have the ability to experience individual things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space.

Kant claimed to know a priori that space obeys the principles of Euclidean geometry. After the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century and with Einstein's general theory of relativity implying that the geometry of our spacetime is non-Euclidean, the Kantian claim that synthetic truths about space and time are knowable a priori lost many advocates. In the twenty-first century, some synthetic a priori knowledge is still accepted by certain groups of philosophers. However, considerably more philosophers accept that we have a priori beliefs ("You shouldn't swallow it, if it tastes bad") but not a priori knowledge.

In the early twentieth century, the general theory of relativity gave a partial answer to our question, "What is time?" This theory implies gravity is any distortion of spacetime’s geometry. Before Einstein, no one suspected there is such a deep connection between time and gravity. Details of this connection are discussed elsewhere in this article. General relativity also implies time is intimately linked to space, and that time is a distinguished dimension of a more basic entity, spacetime.

In the early 20th century, Alfred North Whitehead said time is essentially the form of becoming, an idea that excited a great many philosophers, but not scientists.

In the 21st century, advocates of the proposed theory of loop quantum gravity (that is intended to remove the contradictions between relativity theory and quantum mechanics) say time, together with space, just is the gravitational field. Unlike string theory which assumes a background of spacetime where all particles are composed of tiny strings, in loop quantum gravity spacetime itself is quantized and composed of tiny loops, so that there are atoms of time.

For a discussion of whether there is more than one kind of time, such as time for gravitational phenomena, that does not stay in synchrony with time for atomic phenomena, see Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?

An answer to the question, "What is time?" should take a stand on the issue of whether time is composed of instants or, instead, intervals. A physics book will define time as a linear continuum of point instants. The philosopher Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), provides an alternative to this treatment of time. He says time is a composition of non-zero periods rather than of instants. For the history of the dispute between advocates of instants and intervals, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

The above answers to "What is time?" do not exhaust all the claims about what time is, as we shall see.

4. Why Is there Time Instead of No Time?

There is no agreed upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, why it contains physical laws instead of no physical laws, and why it exists instead of does not exist, although there have been interesting speculations on all these issues.

One controversial suggestion from proponents of the Multiverse Theory is that the reason why our universe exists with time as it is and with the particular laws it has is that every kind of universe exists. Our single universe exists by means of a random selection process, by a process in which any possible universe inevitably arises as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards inevitably produces any possible ordering of the cards.

These comments about the multiverse raise related issues of philosophical interest. One is what "possible" means in the phrase "possible universe." The laws cannot possibly change so much that in some universe the multiverse theory is false. That logical possibility is physically impossible. Therefore, the multiverse theory does not imply modal realism, the philosophical theory that anything that is logically possible does exist. A second issue raised by the multiverse theory's lack of observational or experimental confirmation or disconfirmation is whether it is a less a theory of physics and more a theory of metaphysics. One should note, however, that even if it were merely a theory of metaphysics, this result would not count as evidence that the theory is incorrect.

5. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)

This has been an open question for many centuries because there are experts on both sides of the issue. Classical substantivalism implies space and time are like an inert container in which matter exists and moves independently of the container. Relationism implies space and time are not like this. If you take away the matter and its motion, you take away space and time.

Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist independently of physical material and its events.

Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.

Relationism is inconsistent with substantivalism; they both cannot be true, although they both could be false. Substantivalism implies there can be “empty time,” time without the existence of physical events. Relationism does not allow empty time. It says time requires change. That is,

Necessarily, if time exists, then change exists.

Time is measured only by observing changes in some property or other such as the changes in location of the hands of a clock. Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. Can we solve the issue by testing? Could we, for instance, turn off all changes and then look to see whether time still exists? No, the issue will have to be approached more indirectly.

To begin, more clarity is needed regarding the word "change.” The meaning of the word “change” is philosophically controversial; it is used here in the sense of an object changing its ordinary properties over time, such as an object changing its location over time. If a house changes its properties over space, by being red on its roof and white on the walls, this is not ordinary change. And it is also not ordinary change when the death of Queen Anne changes by moving farther into the past.

If Ludwig Boltzmann changes his mind from liking Joseph Loschmidt to disliking him, does that count as an ordinary change? No, not if Cartesian dualism is correct, but yes if non-dualist philosophers of mind are correct because in that case Boltzmann's mind cannot change without a change in Boltzmann’s brain.

What does the word “properties” mean when we speak of an object changing its properties over time? For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if, during the time that it exists, it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is not a “real change” or “ordinary change” in the chlorophyll because being grue is not an ordinary property.

Classical substantival theories are also called "absolute theories." Unfortunately, the term "absolute" is used in other ways in philosophy. One sense of "to be absolute" is to be immutable, or changeless. Another sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies that time is not absolute in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines substantivalism.

The manifest image of time regarding the issue of relationism and substantivalism was once relationist, but due to the influence of Newton on the teaching of science in subsequent centuries plus this influence on the average person who is not a scientist, the manifest image is substantivalist.

a. History of the Debate up to Kant

Let's turn now to the history of the debate between the proponents and opponents of relationism.

The first advocate of a relational theory was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). Plato had envisioned time as being substance-like, with time being an eternity that is measured by heavenly motion. Aristotle, on the other hand, envisioned time as not being substance-like but rather as being a property of motion, a measure of motion. The difference is between motion being measured by time (as Aristotle envisioned it) and time being measured by motion (as Plato envisioned it). Plato’s position is a predecessor of Newton’s substantivalism, and Aristotle’s position is a predecessor of Leibniz’s relationism.

The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were drawn more clearly in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for relationism:

Instants, consider'd without the things, are nothing at all; ...they consist only in the successive order of things.

Today, if he re-said this, he would replace the word "things" with "events" or "changing matter" or "changing configurations of matter." Opposing Leibniz, Newton accepted a substantival theory of time. Newton's actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.

In 1670 in his Lectiones Geometricae, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s and Leibniz's linkage between time and change:

...Whether things run or stand still, whether we sleep or wake, time flows in its even tenor.

Barrow said time existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Newton added that time (and space) are not primary substances, but are like primary substances in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant of time at which to create the physical world. From these initial conditions, the scientific laws took over and guided the objects.

Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton's absolute time because it seemed to him to be undetectable. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events or, equivalently, the successive order of things. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. So, he advocated relationism and rejected Newton's substantivalism.

One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory of absolute space and absolute time is that it violates a law of metaphysics that is now called Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that if God had moved the entire world some distance east and its history some minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world. Leibniz objected that there is nothing to distinguish one point from another in absolute space, so there would be no discernible difference in the worlds. Leibniz claimed there is just one world here, not two, and Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty. Leibniz could have added that Newton's substantivalism implies a world shifted by God by some absolute velocity (and a world shifted by being rotated by some angle) would be a new, second world, but this would be indiscernible from the world before the shift, and so would be one world, not two.

Leibniz offered another criticism. Newton's theory violates Leibniz's Law of Sufficient Reason: that there is a reason why anything is the way it is. Leibniz complained that, if God shifted the world but made no other changes, then He could have no reason to do so.

Newton's response to this latter argument was two-fold. First, he said Leibniz is correct that we cannot directly observe absolute space and time, and he is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason, yet the Principle does not require there to be sufficient reasons for humans; God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given place and time and velocity and angle even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons, or God might have hidden His reasons from mortals. Maybe God simply did not want to shift the universe.

Second, regarding Leibniz’s complaint using the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, Newton suggested God is able to discern differences in absolute time or space that mere mortals cannot. Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response to Leibniz was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree that if Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate.

However, Newton found a much better argument. Here is how to detect absolute space indirectly, he said. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Don’t let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, the bucket is spinning, and there is a concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.

How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water's surface in the two situations? It cannot, says Newton. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of the surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the difference in shape.

Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory could not be used to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and so space itself exerts a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force pushing away from the center of the bucket is called "centrifugal force," and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.

Leibniz and his allies had no rebuttal. George Berkeley tried to come to the defense of Leibniz, but unfortunately did not have a wholly consistent argument because he spoke of the "fixed stars." in passage 64 of De Motu in 1721:

 ... It would be enough to bring in, instead of absolute space, relative space as confined to the heavens of the fixed stars, considered as at rest.

For him, evidently the fixed stars are really fixed in absolute space, with only nearby space being relational.

So, for over two centuries, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers, although Newton's argument is more supportive of absolute space than absolute time.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. Consider two identical gloves except that one is right-handed and the other is left-handed. In a world containing only a right-hand glove, said Kant, Leibniz's theory could not account for its handedness because all the internal relationships would be the same as in a world containing only a left-hand glove. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This indirectly suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Christiaan Huygens, and George Berkeley, had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz.

b. History of the Debate after Kant

In 1969, the philosopher Sydney Shoemaker presented a thought experiment in favor of substantivalism. It was an original argument attempting to establish that time's existing without change is at least conceivable, despite Aristotle's declaration that it is not conceivable.

With the following scenario, we all can conceive empty time, says Shoemaker. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. Region 3's change ceases everywhere every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Suppose people in region 3 become convinced by these reports that the universe periodically freezes in their region every three years for just one year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year for a year, and the inhabitants can be convinced that their region behaves this way. Every sixty years—that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years—all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. At the beginning of year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, and they are justified in believing time has marched on for the previous year with no change anywhere in the universe. This year would be a year of empty time. Yes, there is no person available to observe the freezing in year sixty, but we all believe in things that we don't directly observe, don't we? Because this is a merely possible world, there need be no explanation of how the freezing and thawing is implemented, and it is conceivable that the freezing occurs after sixty years even if there is no person available to measure the freezing.

In the 19th century, a vast majority of physicists not only believed in absolute space and time, but also had a favorite candidate for a large substance that is stationary in absolute space, the ether. They believed the ether was needed for an adequate explanation of what waves when there is a light wave. In 1865, James Clerk Maxwell proposed his theory of light. The theory was quickly and universally accepted. So, they believed Maxwell when he said the ether was needed as a medium for the propagation of light and that it did exist even if it had not been directly detected.

The experimental physicist A. A. Michelson set out to detect the ether. His clever interferometer experiment failed to detect the ether, but he believed he should have detected it if it existed. So, he concluded that "the hypothesis of a stationary ether is thus shown to be incorrect" (American Journal of Science,  p. 128, 1881). Most physicists disagreed with Michelson's conclusion because they believed A. J. Fresnel who had said the Earth might drag the ether with it. If so, this would make the ether undetectable by Michelson's experimental apparatus, as long as the apparatus were used on Earth and not in outer space.

However, this rescue of the ether hypothesis, and substantivalism along with it, did not last long. In 1905, Einstein proposed his special theory of relativity that implied there should be no ether. When his theory was experimentally confirmed, beliefs in the ether, substantival space, and substantival time were largely abandoned.

Einstein and the philosopher Hans Reichenbach declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for relationism. Quoted in The New York Times newspaper in december 3, 1919, Einstein said:

Till now it was believed that time and space existed by themselves, even if there was nothing—no Sun, no Earth, no stars—while now we know that time and space are not the vessel for the Universe, but could not exist at all if there were no contents, namely, no Sun, no Earth, and other celestial bodies.

According to relativity theory, Leibniz's notion of shifting the whole universe a specific distance or shifting it in time simply was not a coherent notion, Einstein and Reichenbach believed, as did most other experts.

The common relationist response by Ernst Mach to Newton’s bucket argument was to note Newton’s error in not considering the distant environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that a body’s inertial mass comes from its interaction with all the other bodies in the universe and not with its interaction with space itself. So, if you were to hold Newton's bucket still but spin the background stars, then the water would creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface. Thus, Newton's substantival space is not needed to explain the concave shape. Presumably substantival time is not needed either. By Ockham's Razor, if substantival space and time are not needed for successful explanations, then they should be rejected.

Mach said:

Can we really hold fast to Newton's bucket, rotate the heaven of fixed stars instead, and then prove there are no centrifugal forces? The experiment cannot be done, the idea is quite meaningless because the two cases cannot be distinguished by the senses in that way. I therefore regard the two cases as the same thing and Newton's distinction to be an illusion. (Mechanics, 1883, forward, translated by J. B. Barbour)

Despite these arguments for relationism, substantivalism continued by be defended.

Even Einstein himself changed his mind about the coherence of substantivalism. In his Nobel Prize acceptance speech on December 10, 1922, he said relativity theory does not rule out an underlying substance that is pervasive in space; all that is required is that if such a substance exists, then it must obey the principles of relativity. But the old Newtonian substance was no longer accepted, nor was Newton's absolute void. Ditto for Newton's understanding of time.

Another defense of substantivalism says that what physicists call empty space is an energetic and active field. There is no region of the field where there could be empty time in the relationist sense of Leibniz.

Here is a third defense of substantivalism. Relativity theory implies there is a four-dimensional continuous manifold of point-events having a metric field and matter fields. One proposed definition of “spacetime” is that it is the manifold itself. This theory is often called “manifold substantivalism.” The manifold is the container that contains matter; and it is what continues to exist even after the matter is removed, removed in the sense that the matter field's values reach a minimum.

Another kind of substantivalism says that spacetime is not just the manifold but rather is a combination of the manifold plus a single, essential metrical structure. Yet another position is that the debate between substantivalism and relationism no longer makes sense given the new terminology of the general theory of relativity because the very distinction between spacetime and event in spacetime, or between space and matter, has broken down.

For additional discussion of these issues, see (Dainton 2010, chapter 21).

6. What Does Science Require of Time?

In the early 20th century, the appearance of the theories of relativity, quantum mechanics and the big bang transformed the investigation of time from a primarily speculative and metaphysical investigation into one that occupied scientists in their professional journals.

The scientific theories don't always agree, but when they don't disagree, the scientific community trusts their implications for time. For one example, the big bang theory places demands on the amount of past time there must be. The past needs to have a duration of at least about 13.8 billion years since the big bang began.

Neither the big bang theory nor the theories of relativity demand that time implies change, although they do demand that change implies time.

None of the fundamental laws of physics pick out a present time. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that the value of t0 is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally. There is much philosophical debate about whether this treatment reveals an error in physics because the present moment is so special that the laws should recognize it.

In a spacetime obeying the theory of relativity, there is always a maximum possible speed for objects moving through space, a maximum ratio of distance covered, divided by time elapsed. This was one of Einstein's discoveries. The speed is called "light speed" even if the object is not light. But this speed limit is not the limit for how fast space itself can expand or contract. Very distant regions of space, including the objects within them, are receding from our galaxy faster than light speed. Kip Thorne, speaking more precisely about light speed being a speed limit, emphasized that the speed limit is a local phenomenon when he said, "If you have two objects that are close enough to each other that there is no signfiicatn warping of spacetime between them, then they can't move faster than the speed of light with respect to each other."

All the fundamental physical laws have symmetry under time-translation. If a theory has time-translation symmetry, then the laws of the theory do not change as time goes by. It follows that the law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law of gravitation that held one thousand centuries ago. Note we are talking about the same laws, not the same events.

All the fundamental physical laws have symmetry under time-reversal (or at least CPT reversal). More informally, the point is that time-reversal symmetry implies that if you make a film of some process, then run the film backward, the film still describes a process allowed by the laws. However, actual reversals are not observed if they involve heat; this is due to the second law of thermodynamics which this article discusses elsewhere.

Science places special requirements on the micro-structure of time. For instance, to express laws using calculus, the physicists need to speak of one instantaneous event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds before another. In ordinary discourse outside of science, we would never need this kind of detail. This need requires time to be a linear continuum. Any linear continuum has the same structure as the real numbers in their natural order. It follows from this that physical theories treat time as being somewhat like another spatial dimension, and it follows that time is one-dimensional and not two-dimensional. Time has this geometric structure even in quantum theory. Quantum theory does not quantize time.

Science (specifically the general theory of relativity) places no special requirements on the topology of time other than that time is one-dimensional. Time's topological structure might be like a straight line, or like a circle. This latter possibility conflicts with the manifest image of time.

An instantaneous event at one place is said to be a "point" event. If we add a reference system, then we can name the point event; usually numbers or sets of numbers are used for names. A reference system is basically just an applied coordinate system. A typical coordinate system used in contemporary physics is a continuous labeling of events with an ordered set of four real numbers. In this way, we can say a specific point event has just one temporal coordinate t1, with t1 being some real number with a unit, such as a second; and we can say that at t1 the event has just one ordered set of spatial location coordinates x1, y1, z1, which is an ordered triple of real numbers, all having units such as meters. A Cartesian coordinate system has mutually perpendicular axes. If space or spacetime curve, then a Cartesian coordinate system will not be applicable, and more exotic coordinate systems must be used.

Choosing a Cartesian coordinate system is a matter of convenience, but only a Euclidean space can have a Cartesian coordinate system. Spaces satisfying Newton's mechanics or special relativity are Euclidean, but spaces requiring the general theory of relativity are usually Euclidean only in their infinitesimal regions.

In all spaces satisfying either Newtonian mechanics, special relativity or general relativity, time is normally assigned real-valued coordinates. This assignment implies time's instants are gap-free and that they are so densely packed that there is no next coordinate to any coordinate. Also, it implies that between any two different temporal coordinates, there is an aleph-one infinite number of other coordinates. No sciences have found a need to model time more densely than this, with, say, the hyperreal numbers or surreal numbers. Nor is there any need to model time with two dimensions instead of one.

There is disagreement about whether time needs to be quantized. Advocates of some speculative theories of quantum gravity require time to be quantized.

With the acceptance of relativity theory, and its implication that there are many valid perspectives or reference frames and so no one frame is the correct frame, scientists have accepted that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes of the reference frame. So, saying you are standing still at 8:00 is not an objective remark if there is no implicit reference frame. You are probably not standing still as measured in a frame fixed to a spinning carousel.

Let's explore this last point in more detail. Isaac Newton did not actually use the concept of a reference frame, but it is helpful to use it to succinctly describe his beliefs. Newton assumed that if event 1 lasts just as long as event 2 in one frame, then it does so in other frames. Newton also assumed that, if you are five feet tall in one reference frame, then you are that tall in other frames. Einstein undermined these two Newtonian assumptions.

EinsteinEinstein's theory of relativity is the scientific theory that has had the biggest impact upon our understanding of time. Einstein said, "Time is relative." This means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. Relative to, in the sense of depending upon. Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving vehicle, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These effects are called space contraction and time dilation, respectively. So, both length and duration are frame dependent and not objectively real characteristics of things unless some reference frame is being assumed at least implicitly.

Using a stationary clock, suppose you correctly measure an event to have lasted t seconds. If the same event is measured correctly to have lasted t' seconds by a clock moving at constant speed v relative to a frame in which you are stationary, then regardless of the moving clock's direction of motion,

t' =  t √ (1-v2/c2)

That is, the time of the moving clock always reads less because its time is dilated or stretched. '' is the square root symbol. Can two different people be correct in saying, "Your clock is running slow compared to mine." Yes, the two observers can be correct provided they use different reference frames, such as ones in which they are stationary.

With space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, Einstein's special theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. Spacetime divides into its space part and its time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. Because there are an infinite number of frames that could be chosen, to claim that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is to make a very ambiguous claim.

Because there is no single correct frame to use for specifying which events are present and which are past, one philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory that says temporal properties of events such as "is happening now" or "happened in the past" are frame-free properties of those events.

Another profound implication of relativity theory is that two accurate clocks do not usually stay synchronized (that is, tick the same) after the clocks are initially synchronized. Each clock has its own proper time. So does any other physical object. Proper time for an object is the physical time that would be shown by a very small clock if it were attached to the object as the object travels around. In the technical terminology of relativity theory, we adopt the "clock hypothesis" that any correct clock gives the elapsed proper time along its own world line. A clock's proper time depends on the clock's history, its history of speed and gravitational influence. We notice this influence when we see that synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they either move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Other forces, such as electromagnetic forces, are irrelevant to this.

Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion in the frame run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. So, a clock in a car parked near your apartment building runs slower than the stationary clock in your upper floor apartment. "Clocks at the top of Mount Everest pull ahead of those at sea level by about 30 microseconds a year" (Gibbs 2002). Effects on time by speed and gravitation are called "time dilation effects." They affect all clocks, even biological ones.

Because every object has its own proper time, which usually does not stay in synchrony with another object's proper time, there are as many proper time lines as there are objects. This idea is sometimes expressed by saying time is not universal.

Because every person has his or her own proper time, two persons undergoing different motions or different gravitational fields will correctly assign different times to the same event and so be time travelers relative to each other. This difference for an event is not just for events the persons themselves are involved in. For example, if I am walking along the road and you drive by me toward the traffic signal ahead, then we will very nearly agree on the time at which the traffic signal changed color, but if we want to know what event on a planet in the Andromeda Galaxy is simultaneous with the traffic signal's color change, we will correctly choose Andromeda events that differ from each other by several weeks. This is yet another example of how relativistic effects usually do not arise in our everyday experience but only in extreme situations involving very high speeds, extremely large masses, high-strength gravitational fields, or, in this example, extreme distances.

This situation with the Andromeda Galaxy is an example of how, for some pairs of events that are extremely distant from each other so that neither event could have had a causal effect upon the other, the theory of relativity does not put any time order structure on the pair; one could happen first, the other could happen first, or they could be simultaneous, and only the imposition of a reference frame on the universe will force a decision on their temporal order. But since this order depends on the reference frame, the time order of the pair is not objective.

According to special relativity, spacetime does not curve and space also does not curve. According to general relativity they do, and the curvature is not relative to the chosen reference frame. Spacetime is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature. This change is propagated at the speed of light, not instantaneously. The curvature of time can be detected by noticing the synchronized clocks become unsynchronized.

In a world obeying special relativity, spacetime is required to have a Minkowskian structure everywhere, and the intended space aspect of spacetime is Euclidean. [See (Maudlin 2012, p. 128) for why the word "intended" is needed.] In a world obeying general relativity, spacetime usually does not have a single, overall frame of reference, but it is always required to have a Minkowskian structure everywhere locally. "Locally" means in infinitesimally sized regions. Deviations from a more general Minkowskian structure are usually due to the presence of matter-energy; think of a Minkowski diagram being twisted in the presence of matter or energy.

One noteworthy philosophical point here is that, according to general relativity, although the presence of gravity arising from a mass (or energy) implies spacetime's having intrinsic curvature, not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of mass or energy. Spacetime containing no mass-energy can still have curvature; therefore, the geometry of spacetime is influenced by, but not always determined by, the behavior of its matter-energy. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz's classical relationism. The point was first discovered by Arthur Eddington in his analysis of the de Sitter solution to Einstein's equations in his relativity theory.

There are many kinds of universes that are models of the equations of general relativity. For example, the theory of relativity does not say whether the universe is finite or infinite in volume, nor what its overall curvature is, nor whether it has a multi-connected or a disconnected topology. Physicists generally agree that our universe is some model of the theory, or very nearly. One other limitation of the theory is that it, given the applicability of quantum theory, too, it fails for features involving distances less than 10-33 centimeters, and for durations less than 10-44 seconds. This is the tiny Planck scale. A major goal of the field of physics is to find a new theory, called a theory of quantum gravity, that provides an understanding of what happens at or below the Planck scale. Many believe time disappears at this small scale.

For more about science and time, see What Else Science Requires of Time; and see Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster).

7. Does Time Have a Beginning or End?

There is great uncertainty among professional cosmologists about whether the past is infinite. The cosmologists' currently accepted theory of past time requires an explosion of all space when the universe had a very small volume. This caused all material in the space to expand, too. Many theories that imply this phenomenon are called Big Bang Theories, the classical version of which says time began from a singularity a finite time ago. The best estimate for that initial time of t = 0 is 13.7 billion years ago. The controversy is whether there were times before tht. The mathematical physicist Stephen Hawking once famously quipped that asking for what happened before the big bang is like asking what is north of the north pole. He later retracted that remark and said it is an open question whether there was time before the big bang. The Big Bounce Theory is the major competition for the classical Big Bang Theory. The Big Bounce Theory says there was no singularity at the beginning at t = 0 but rather the small, expanding volume of the universe 13.7 billion years ago was caused by a preceding, multi-billion year compression that, when the universe got small enough, stopped expanding and began expanding. For a brief discussion of this controversy, see (Ijjas, et. al., 2017).

There has been much speculation over the centuries about the extent of the past and the future, although almost all remarks have contained serious ambiguities. For example, regarding the end of time, is this end (a) the end of humanity, or (b) the end of life, or (c) the end of the world that was created by God, but not counting God, or (d) the end of all natural and supernatural change? Intimately related to these questions are two others: Is it being assumed that time exists without change, and just what is meant by the term "change"? With these cautions in mind, here is a brief summary of speculations throughout the centuries about whether time has a beginning or end.

Regarding the beginning of time, the Greek atomist Lucretius in about 50 B.C.E. said in his poem De Rerum Natura:

For surely the atoms did not hold council, assigning order to each, flexing their keen minds with questions of place and motion and who goes where.

But shuffled and jumbled in many ways, in the course of endless time they are buffeted, driven along chancing upon all motions, combinations.

At last they fall into such an arrangement as would create this universe.

The implication is that time has always existed, but that an organized universe began a finite time ago with a random fluctuation.

Plato and Aristotle, both of whom were opponents of the atomists, agreed that the past is infinite (eternal). Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because everything in the world has a prior, efficient cause. In the fifth century, Augustine disagreed with Aristotle and said the past is finite because time came into existence by an act of God.

Martin Luther estimated the universe to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated that it began in 4,004 B.C.E. In the early seventeenth century, the Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began in 4,004 B.C.E. on Friday, October 28.

In about 1700, Isaac Newton claimed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that. His position was accepted for many centuries in the West.

Advances in geology eventually refuted the low estimates that the universe was created in about 4,000 B.C.E., or even that the Earth was created then.

A much better estimate of the age of the universe as a whole comes not from geology but from the big bang theory and the Big Bounce Theory which agree that our universe was once very small, hot and dense, and it has been expanding and cooling ever since. The classical big bang theories assume time began approximately 13.7 to 13.8 billion years ago when there was a beginning to the expansion, but do not mention where the material came from that underwent the expansion nor what caused it to expand.

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular remark, “God caused the big bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the big bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for a scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

Princeton University physicist Alan Guth, one of the originators of inflation theory which is a popular refinement of the big bang theory, said, the universe came into existence with a big bang a finite time ago, but “The laws of physics can exist even if the universe doesn’t....” In explaining the origin of the universe, he speculates that the universe itself came into existence by a quantum fluctuation of absolute nothingness. This nothingness is the philosopher's nothing, not the physicist's vacuum; it is the absence of all time, as well as all fields, matter, and space. If that is correct, and if the universe obeys laws, then there would be fundamental laws of physics prior to the existence of anything else. “Prior” here means logically prior, not prior in time. However, no one has any good idea of what those most fundamental laws are.

Let's focus now on the futre of time. Will it end? Time ends for any object that falls into a black hole. For us and other objects not inside a black hole, the future is probably infinite, but there uncertainty among the experts in cosmology.

Here is a summary of some serious suggestions by twenty-first century cosmologists about our universe's future or, if the multiverse theory is correct, our particular universe's future.

  • Big Chill (eternal expansion of space at an ever expanding rate).
  • Big Crunch (eventually the current expansion stops, and the universe contracts to a compressed state much like when the big bang began).
  • Big Bounce (eternal pattern of expansion and contraction of space, that is, a series of Big Bangs followed by Big Crunches).
  • Big Rip (every system of particles is ripped apart, as the expansion rate of new dark energy rapidly approaches infinity in a finite time, leaving a sea of elementary particles for an infinite time).
  • Big Snap (the fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much).
  • Death Bubbles (some regions of space will turn into lethal bubbles that expand at the speed of light, destroying everything else).

For more details about the big bang and fixing the limits on future time and past time, see What Else Science Requires of Time.

8. Does Time Emerge from Something More Fundamental?

Is physical time a basic feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features?

Emergence is about new components or properties appearing from (in the technical sense of being at least supervenient upon) more basic components or properties that do not have the emergent features. For example, heat emerges from molecular motion, but no molecule is hot. The classical relationists such as Leibniz argued that time emerges from events, and if there were no events, then there would be no time. This metaphysical position is called relationism. The substantivalists such as Newton said time is basic and not emergent, and this position was the majority position among scientists until the confirmation of the theory of relativity. Relativity theory suggested to most researchers in the first half of the 20th century that spacetime emerges from events, and that time is a particular feature or dimension of spacetime.

Many physicists working in the field of quantum gravity suspect that resolving the contradiction between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing spacetime and thus time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate at or below the level of the Planck length and the Planck time. However, there is no empirical evidence yet to back up this suspicion, nor any agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is. The relation of this substrate to the spacetime itself cannot be analogous to the relation of a brick to a brick wall because the brick's having a definite size would violate special relativity's requirement that any "brick" of time has a size that may change with whichever reference frame is chosen. Thus the emphasis on "covariant" entities, namely entities that are reference-frame independent. For example, advocates of the theory of loop quantum gravity say that everything in the universe emerges from a single type of entity: covariant quantum fields. "Everything" here includes time as well as light, energy, space, protons and cabbages. For these advocates, time emerges with continuity and an arrow only at scales significantly greater than the Planck scale.

Some physicists at the turn of the twenty-first century claimed space is fundamental, but time is not. Other physicists speculated that time is fundamental but space is not. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint. String theory is his favored theory for reconciling the conflicts between quantum mechanics and the general theory of relativity.

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept.... But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

The English physicist Julian Barbour said,

I now believe that time does not exist at all, and that motion itself is pure illusion (Barbour 1999, p. 4). The here and now arises not from a past, but from the totality of things... (p. 313).

He then offered an exotic explanation (which won't be described here) of how nature creates the false impression that time exists. He argued that, although there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, nevertheless there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments (p. 37). Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one observer's reference frame) of all the objects in space. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental, but time is not, and neither is spacetime. In this way, time is removed from the foundations of physics and emerges as some measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations.

The physicist Carlo Rovelli said: "At the fundamental level, the world is a collection of events not ordered in time" (Rovelli 2018, p. 155).

The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic, nor for whether the concept of time is basic to concept formation. For a description of six different, detailed speculations on what the ultimate constituents of spacetime are, see (Merali, 2013).

9. Which Aspects of Time Are Conventional?

Time has both conventional and non-conventional aspects. There are many non-conventional aspects of time that are mentioned throughout this article. Here is one. If event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3. No exceptions. This transitivity is a general feature of time, not a convention.

The second is conventional in that our society could have chosen to make the second be longer or shorter than it now is. It is a convention that there are sixty-seconds in a minute rather than sixty-six, that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of twenty-three, and that no week fails to contain a Tuesday.

The issue here is conventional vs. factual. Although the term "convention" is somewhat vague, conventions are up to us to freely adopt and are not objective features of the external world that we are forced to accept if we seek the truth. Conventions are invented or are artificial as opposed to being natural or mandatory or factual. It is a fact that the color of normal, healthy leaves is green; it is not up to us to declare that leaves shall be green. It is up to us to declare that leaves shall be referred to with the simple word "leaves" as opposed to a ten-million-letter word. Conventions need not be arbitrary; they can be useful or have other pragmatic virtues. Nevertheless, if a feature is conventional, then there must in some sense be reasonable alternative conventions that could have been adopted. Also, conventions can be explicit or implicit. For one last caution, conventions can turn into facts. The assumption that matter is composed of atoms was a useful convention in late 19th century physics; but, after Einstein's explanation of Brownian motion in terms of atoms, the convention became a fact.

It is also a useful convention that, in order to keep future noons from occuring during the night, clocks are re-set by one hour as one moves across a time-zone on the Earth's surface, and that leap days and leap seconds are used. The minor adjustments with leap seconds are required because the Earth's rotations and revolutions are not exactly regular. For political reasons, time zones do not always have longitudes for boundaries. For similar reasons, some geographical regions use daylight savings time instead of standard time.

Consider the ordinary way a clock is used to measure how long an event lasts. We adopt the following metric; or method: Take the time at which the event ends, and subtract the time it starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, take the absolute value of the difference of the two numbers and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous"? Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be

|log(y/x)|

instead of the ordinary

|y - x|.

The trouble with this log metric is that, for any three events x, y, and z, if t(x) < t(y) < t(z), then it is normal to demand that the duration from x to y plus the duration from y to z be equal to the duration from x to z. However, the log metric does not have this property.

Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? Could the second hand just as well go counterclockwise to lower numbers instead of clockwise? Yes. In fact, when Westerners talk about past centuries, they agree to use both A.D. and B.C.E. A clock measuring B.C.E. periods would count toward lower numbers along the time line. The laws of physics involving time t are unchanged regardless of whether the t is measured in B.C.E. years or A.D. years. The clock on today's wall always counts up, but that is merely because it is agreed we are in the A.D. era, so one has very little need for a clock that counts in minutes of B.C.E. time. Choice of the origin of the time coordinate is conventional; it might be a Muhammed event or a Jesus event or a Temple event or the big bang event.

It is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is even capable of having a standard clock that measures both electromagnetic events and gravitational events and that "electromagnetic time" stays in synchrony with "gravitational time."

It is a fact and not a convention that our universe contains a wide variety of phenomena that are sufficiently regular in their ticking to serve as clocks for special purposes. They are sufficiently regular because they tick in adequate synchrony with the standard clock. The word "adequate" here means successful for the purposes we have for using a clock, for example for measuring lifetimes of mountain ranges or for measuring the duration of a photon interacting with another photon.

Simultaneity of two distant events is conventional because of the relativity of simultaneity to reference frame. Physicists generally consider statements that are factual and so not conventional to be invariant under change of reference frame. According to the special theory of relativity, two events which are simultaneous in one reference will be sequential in a different reference frame moving with respect to the first frame. It is only by convention that we fix on one frame and, for it, declare which pairs of events are simultaneous. To make this point another way, given two events A and B that occur so far enough from each other that neither could have had a causal effect on the other, then the duration between them is conventional in the sense that physicists can always choose a reference frame in which A and B are simultaneous, making the duration between them be zero. Durations are not frame-independent.

Relativity theory and quantum theory imply time is continuous. So, physicists regularly use the concept of a point of continuous time. They might say some event happened the square root of three seconds after another event. Physicists usually uncritically accept a point of time as being real, but philosophers of physics disagree with each other about whether the points of time are real or, instead, merely useful. Is this continuity of time a fact or just a convention that should be eliminated in a better approximation to the nature of time?

Our society's standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all other clocks must act equally strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. For an example of strangeness, suppose our standard clock used the periodic rotations of the Earth relative to the background stars. In that case, if a comet struck Earth and affected the rotational speed of the Earth (as judged by, say, a pendulum clock), then we would be forced to say the rotation speed of the Earth did not really change but rather the other periodic clock-like phenomena such as swinging pendulums and quartz crystal oscillations all changed in unison because of the comet strike. That would be a strange conclusion to draw, and in fact for just this reason, physicists have rejected the standard clock based on Earth rotations and chosen a newer standard clock that is based on atomic phenomena that are unaffected by comet strikes. A closely related philosophical question about choice of standard clock is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we are making a more correct choice. For more on this point, see this article's Supplement.

It would be very helpful in doing physics if there were a convention to adopt that allows for a single reference frame in which any two events are forced either to be simultaneous or to be such that one of them happens before the other. In general relativity, simultaneity frequently does not make sense globally even though it always does make sense in any infinitesimally small region; these are regions where the special theory of relativity is true. Nevertheless, if the convention is adopted of using a very special coordinate system, then sense can be made of fixing the time of any event globally. This special coordinate system needs to be very curvilinear as opposed to rectilinear and to be "patched" (in analogy to a quilt made of patches of cloth). In the reference system, curved spacetime can be exhaustively partitioned into non-intersecting but “bumpy” (or curvy) three-dimensional sheets of simultaneous events, where each sheet is locally perpendicular to time-like geodesics. (Geodesics in spacetime are the free-fall world lines.) The bumps are due to curvature associated with the presence of matter and energy. Using one of these special coordinate systems, all the events in each, single sheet throughout the universe happen simultaneously. This sort of reference system is usually adopted by cosmologists.

Among the possible patchwork of frames one might adopt, some are much better choices than others. In particular, it is a useful convention to fix the spatial origin at a place where the light (which has now turned to heat) generated by the big bang arrives to Earth with about the same intensity and temperature from all directions. As (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9) describes it:

In fact, it isn't quite true that the cosmic background heat radiation is completely uniform across the sky. It is very slightly hotter (i.e., more intense) in the direction of the constellation of Leo than at right angles to it.... Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 per cent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.

Similar hypothetical clocks could be located everywhere in the universe, in each case in a reference frame where the cosmic background heat radiation looks uniform. Notice I say "hypothetical"; we can imagine the clocks out there, and legions of sentient beings dutifully inspecting them. This set of imaginary observers will agree on a common time scale and a common set of dates for major events in the universe, even though they are moving relative to each other as a result of the general expansion of the universe.... So cosmic time as measured by this special set of observers constitutes a type of universal time....

So, time is both cosmic and not cosmic. Although time is not cosmic (that is, universal) because which pairs of events throughout the cosmos are simultaneous is different in different frames, time also is cosmic in another sense, the sense in which there exists a special set of reference frames in which there would be universal agreement for stationary observers in those frames about the dates of major events of cosmic history. It is a convention that cosmologists agree to use the cosmic time of these special reference frames, but it is a fact and not a convention that the universe is so organized that there is such a useful cosmic time available to be adopted by the cosmologists.

There is an ongoing philosophical dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality, if any, in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. The philosopher Hans Reichenbach said that, in order to define distant simultaneity in a single reference frame in special relativity, we must in principle send a light signal to and from the distant event, and in doing this we must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions.

The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Reichenbach is mistaken about this. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

10. Arguments that Time Is Not Real

The question, "What is Time?", can be answered by taking the route of explaining it or explaining it away. Consider the latter route.

We can see a clock, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real? You might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.

Is time merely a concept that makes the mathematical equations easier to solve? Is there more to time than this?

What are the signs that the word "time" refers to a real or existing entity? The brief answer is that the reference helps to
explain phenomena, understand it, and perhaps predict it, plus there do not exist alternative, better ways of doing this.

The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, "The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions" ("Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology," 1950). He meant these two questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answer one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken these questions seriously.

Nobody doubts that the concept of time has immense practical value, but there are serious reasons to believe time itself is not real. The major reasons are that time is unreal because (i) it is emergent, or (ii) it is subjective, or (iii) it is merely conventional, or (iv) it is denoted by an inconsistent concept, or (v) its scientific image deviates too much from its manifest image. All these reasons are explored below in order below.

i. Because Time is Emergent

The previous section of this article introduced many reasons to believe time is emergent, and some philosophers of time argue that an emergent time is therefore not a real time.

ii. Because Time is Subjective

It has been claimed that time is not real because it is merely subjective or anthropecentric. Psychological time is clearly subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective? Well, first what does "subjective" mean? This is a notoriously controversial term in philosophy, but here it means that a phenomenon is subjective if it is a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind. A secondary quality such as "being red" is a subjective quality; being capable of reflecting light of a certain wavelength is not subjective. The point can be made by asking whether time comes just from us or instead is wholly out there in the external world independent of us. Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? If so, time is not objective, and so is not objectively real.

Aristotle envisioned time to be a counting of motions (Physics, IV.ch11.219b2), but he also asked the question of whether the existence of time requires the existence of mind. He does not answer his own question because he says it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjective view of time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality.

iii. Because Time is Merely Conventional

One might argue that time is not real because the concept of time is just a mathematical artifact in our fundamental theories of mathematical physics. It is merely playing an auxiliary mathematical role.

Or one might argue as follows. Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear.

Money and gold both exist, but money's existence depends upon social relations and conventions that gold's existence does not depend upon. Is time's existence more like money than gold in that regard?

Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway?”

Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence. (Callender 2010, p. 63)

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we have invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, he said, time is otherwise wholly conventional, not objective.

iv. Because Time is Inconsistent

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real.

Plato's classical interpretation of Zeno's paradoxes is that they demonstrate the unreality of any motion or any other change. Assuming the existence of time requires the existence of change, then Zeno's paradoxes also overturn Greek commonsense that time exists.

The early 20th century British philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event is a future event, a present event and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is inconsistent.

The early 20th century absolute-idealist philosopher F.H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.

If any of the above arguments are successful, then the concept of time is essentially inconsistent, and time itself is not real.

v. Because Scientific Time is Too Unlike Ordinary Time

If you believe that for time to exist it needs to have certain features of the manifest image of time, but you believe that science implies time does not have those features, you may be tempted to conclude that science has really discovered that time does not exist. The logician Kurt Gödel believed so. In the mid 20th century, he argued for the unreality of time as described by contemporary physical science because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. People can, "travel into any region of the past, present, and future and back again" (Gödel, 1959, pp. 560-1). It should not even be possible for time to be circular like this, Gödel believed, so, if we suppose time is the time described by relativity theory, then time is not real.

Proponents of the objective reality of time offer responses to the above arguments.

(i) Suppose time does emerge from events, or spacetime, or the quantum gravitational field, or Barbour’s moments. Does this imply time is not real? Most scientists and philosophers of time will answer "no" for the following reasons. Scientists once were surprised to learn from Ludwig Boltzmann that heat emerges from the motion of molecules, and that a molecule itself has no heat, and then from Einstein that molecules definitely exist. Would it not have been a mistake to conclude from this that heat is unreal? That fires aren't hot? And when it became clear that baseballs are basically a collection of atoms, and so baseballs can be said to emerge from atoms, would it not have been a mistake to say baseballs no longer exist? The concept of time is already known to be so extremely useful at the larger scales, the scales of quarks and molecules and mountains and galaxies that it must be said to be real at these scales.

(ii) Regarding time being merely subjective, notice that a clock will tick in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice the ability of the concept of time to help make such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events. W. V. O. Quine might add the point that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time. [The grand inference also tells us what are the natural kinds, what are nature's laws and geometry, and what time is.]

(iii) One should be cautious about claiming something is merely a mathematical artifact and is not real. Throughout the nineteenth century this was said about atoms, but Einstein won a Nobel Prize for showing in 1905 that atoms are real because his calculations of their speed and moment was able to explain Brownian motion, a phenomenon which was until then unexplained.

There are two primary reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: First, there are so many one-way processes in nature. For example, mixing cold milk into hot, black coffee produces lukewarm, brown coffee, but agitations of lukewarm, brown coffee have never turned it back into hot black coffee with cool milk. The amalgamation of this process along with all the other one-way processes is time’s arrow, and no human choice affects its existence. Time's arrow is a key feature of time itself.

Second, our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. That is, their periods keep the same constant ratio to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the "fixed" stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal. The relationships do not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws.

(iv) Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time will say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaints can be handled by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno's paradoxes were solved by requiring time to be a linear continuum like a segment of the real number line. This solution did change Zeno’s concept, but the change was very fruitful and not ad hoc.

(v) Regarding the unacceptable treatment of the manifest image of time by science, there is no agreement about which particular features of our manifest image of time cannot be rejected, although not all can be or else we would be rejecting time itself. But science has not required us to reject our intuition that some events happen in time before other events, and our intuition that some events last for a time. Gödel's complaint about relativity theory's allowing for circular time has been treated by the majority of physicists and philosophers of time by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular, and he needs to revise his intuitions about what is essential to the concept. The paradoxes involved in circular time will be discussed later in this article.

Most experts agree that time does exist at scales above the Planck scale, that the concept is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional or a mathematical artifact, that any inconsistency in time's description is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real regardless of whether it is emergent.

11. What Kinds of Time Travel Are Possible?

Would you like to travel to the future and read about the history of your great grandchildren? You can do it. Nothing in principle is stopping you except some financial difficulties and a better-engineered spaceship that can survive occasional collisions with objects in space. Would you like to travel, instead, to the past? You may have regrets and would like to set things straight. Perhaps you would like to travel back and kill Adolf Hitler when he was still an infant.

Travel in time has been discussed in Hindu, Chinese and Japanese literature since ancient times, but its serious examination in physics and the philosophy of physics began only after the logician Kurt Gödel discussed it with Einstein in the 1940s. The term "time travel" has become a technical term. It means physical time travel, not psychological time travel. You are not a time traveler in this sense if you merely dream of living in the past, and it does not mean that you time travel for five minutes simply by being alive for five minutes. Nor do you travel in time by crossing a time zone, or by having your body frozen.

In 1976, the Princeton University metaphysician David Lewis offered this technical definition of time travel:

In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

Time travel occurs when correct clocks get out of synchronization. If you are the traveler, your personal time is what Einstein's theory calls your "proper time," and it is shown on your small personal clock that travels with you (and that is not frozen if your body is ever frozen). The person not taking the journey is said to be using "external time." This usually is the time shown on the standard clock in the coordinate system in which the standard clock is stationary. Personal time and external time are different ways of ordering events and measuring time intervals between them.

Lewis' definition is widely accepted, but has been criticized in the philosophical literature. The definition has no implications about whether, if you travel forward in external time to the year 2376 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then as opposed to having traveled continuously during the intervening years.

To illustrate discontinuous backward time travel of a traveler who dies before she is born, choose a reference frame in which the moments t1, t2, t3, t4, t5, occur in that order along equal intervals of continuous, external time, as measured, say, by the community's standard clock.

time traveler

Imagine that our time traveler is born at t4, which we will call her personal time T1. Let's synchronize her clock with the standard clock and let t4 = T1. Later she steps into a time machine at t5, which we will call her personal time T2, and she is transported instantaneously and discontinuously to (the world as it was at) time t1, which we call her personal time T3. Then she dies at external time t2, which is her personal time T4. Her personal time's moments are ordered as T1, T2 = T3, T4.

If Lewis' definition of time travel is acceptable, then any requirement that rules out sudden appearance in external time, as in the previous example, and demands spatiotemporal continuity will have to be supported by an additional argument. The argument that the general theory of relativity requires this continuity is such an argument. Relativity theory does not rule out travel to the past, but it does rule out a sudden appearance back in the past. Relativity theory also allows you to travel forward to the year 2376, far outliving your great grandchildren, but you must travel continually forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage, although these Earth observers would notice that you turn the pages in your monthly calendar very slowly and infrequently.

Does relativity theory's not ruling out travel to the past imply travel to the past is physically possible? Philosophers of physics disagree on the answer to this question. One way to definitively prove that travel to the past is possible is to prove that it actually occurred. But lacking that, philosophers look both to the implications of our civilization's basic physical theories and to the metaphysical principles they accept.

Even if a certain kind of time travel is logically possible, it does not follow that it is physically possible. If it is physically possible, this does not imply that it does occur, nor even that it is technologically possible. "Logically possible" means not being logically inconsistent. It is not the same thing as the epistemic notion of being conceivable but is implied by it. "Physically possible" requires being consistent with confirmed physical theory, and the two leading theories are the general theory of relativity and quantum field theory. These two theories have never failed any experimental tests, so most experts trust their implications for time travel. "Technologically possible" means physically possible and also realizable in principle with current technology. Metaphysically possible means, well, logically consistent with metaphysical principles. Maybe it means logically possible when we take essence into account, but maybe the concept of essence is too obscure to clarify. Unfortunately, there are hardly any generally accepted metaphysical principles. Here is one candidate for a metaphysical principle: For any true scientific law, it is metaphysically possible that it is false. "Biologically possible" means consistent with the laws of biology.

a. To the Future?

Would you believe a man who told you he arrived here today having just spoken with Isaac Newton in 1700 yesterday? Suppose he produces an affidavit that his lie detector test shows he is not lying about traveling to the future. You'd immediately think of a more mundane explanation for his comments than that he traveled forward in time.

Nevertheless, future time travel occurs very frequently, and it has been observed and measured by scientists. Travel to the past is much more controversial. Relativity theory implies there are two kinds of future time travel—asynchronization caused by the two clocks moving at different speeds and asychronization caused by two clocks encountering different gravitational forces.

Regarding time travel due to high speed, any motion produces time travel to the future, relative to the clocks of those who do not move. That makes every bicycle be a time machine. The higher the speed, the more noticeable the time travel. By going at extremely high speed in the right manner, you can visit the Earth in 2276 C.E. (as measured by the standard clock fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that, say, merely ten years have elapsed. Both clocks can be giving correct readings of the time, according to relativity theory. Travelers to the future can participate in that future, not just view it. They can influence the future and affect it. Notice, though, that you have to go "in the right manner." The faster you go the sooner you get to the part of the future you desire but the more easily the dust and other particles in space will slice through your spaceship's shielding.

One philosophical controversy is whether they can change it. This is impossible, according to David Lewis (Lewis 1976, 150). If it changed, then it was not the future. No action changes the future, regardless of whether time travel is involved.

If you were to travel to 2276 and then reverse your velocity, this reversal alone would not be sufficient to travel back to the time when you began your journey even if you were to travel back to the place where you began.

As measured by an Earth-based clock, it takes 100,000 years for light to travel across the Milky Way Galaxy, but if you took the same trip in a spaceship traveling at very near the speed of light, the trip might last only ten years of your proper time. In principle, it is physically possible that you have enough proper time to travel anywhere before you die.

A second kind of future time travel is due not to speed but to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field on two clocks. This gravitational time dilation is most noticeable near a black hole. If you were to leave Earth and orbit near a black hole, your friends back on Earth would see you live in slow motion. When you returned, your clock would show that less time had expired on your clock than on their clock. For a similar reason, ground floor clocks tick more slowly than penthouse clocks, because the ground floor clock is in a higher gravitational field.

For one last philosophical point about travel to the future, if you are going to accept travel to the future, then you need an adequate response to the claim that you cannot travel to the future because there is no future to travel to.

b. To the Past?

Travel into your own past is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special theory of relativity, but Einstein's general theory of relativity definitely allows it. Whether it occurs is contingent upon the distribution of matter-energy in the universe. So far, travel to the past has never been detected.

Despite this, there is considerable controversy among philosophers and scientists as to whether travel to the past is possible. Some researchers claim that, because the general theory of relativity does allow backward time travel, the theory should be revised or supplemented to prevent this. Other physicists respond that we should bite the bullet and accept these surprising consequences. Some experts believe that an as yet unknown physical law will be discovered that rules out past time travel.

It has been claimed that failure to distinguish personal time from external time prompted these pessimistic remarks from J. J. C. Smart in "Is Time Travel Possible?" in The Journal of Philosophy in 1963:

Suppose it is agreed that I did not exist a hundred years ago. It is a contradiction to suppose that I can make a machine that will take me to a hundred years ago. Quite clearly no time machine can make it be that I both did and did not exist a hundred years ago.

Smart's critics accuse him of the fallacy of begging the question. They wonder why he should demand that it be agreed that "I did not exist a hundred years ago."

For an illustration of one kind of time travel to the past, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with the one space dimension going left and right on the page. Each point on the page represents a possible two-dimensional event. The time dimension points up and down the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now bend the page into a horizontal cylinder, parallel to the space axis so that the future meets the past. In the universe illustrated by this graph, any stationary object that persists long enough arrives into its past and become its earlier self. Its time line or world line is a loop, a closed circuit, or, more technically, a closed time-like curve. This cylindrical universe allows an event to occur both earlier and later than itself. Quite a violation of our manifest image. If the multiverse theory is correct, there are such cylindrical universes.

If past time travel does occur, the traveler is never able to erase facts or change the past. This reasoning assumes there is only one past and that whatever was the case will always have been the case, which is usually a reasonable assumption. But it was challenged in the 11th century by Peter Damian who said God could change the past.

Assuming Damian is mistaken, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather by shooting him before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed.

If you can shoot and kill people before you step into a time machine, then presumably you can shoot and kill people after you step out. So, is there a paradox because you both can and cannot shoot and kill your grandfather?

Assuming you cannot shoot your grandfather (because you didn't), philosophers argue about whether this restraint on your actions toward your grandfather shows that in this situation you do not really have free will in the libertarian sense of that term. To resolve this puzzle, the metaphysician David Lewis said you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. But, says Lewis, there is no sense in which you can and can't. So, the meaning of the word "can" is sensitive to context. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagreed, and argued that we always need to make our “can” statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t.

If you step into a time machine that projects you into the past, some philosophers argue, then you cannot stay in one place because, if you do, you will keep bumping into yourself. This problem is often called the "double-occupancy problem."

It would be logically inconsistent to use a time machine to travel back to a time before the first time machine was invented, but if a time machine has always existed, or isn't needed for the time travel, such as in Gödel's rotating universe, then a person could follow along a closed time-like world line (what we earlier called "circular time") in that universe to visit any event in their past. The travel is always within one's own forward light cone, but the warp in spacetime "tilts" the cone. Gödel discovered these universes, which are models of solutions to Einstein's equations of general relativity, in 1949. Einstein was upset upon hearing that his own equations had such solutions, but he became convinced by Gödel's arguments. There are solutions to the equations of relativity that allow closed time-like world lines in some regions of spacetime but not in other regions.

In 1988 in an influential physics journal, Kip Thorne and colleagues described a new way to build a time machine:

…if the laws of physics permit traversable wormholes, then they probably also permit such a wormhole to be transformed into a "time machine" with which causality might be violatable." (Morris, 1988), p. 1446.

Although Thorne believes that, unlike black holes which do exist, traversable worm holes (that is, worm holes that do not collapse their throats) probably do not exist naturally for reasons involving quantum physics and the nature of matter but not relativity, nevertheless it is a very interesting philosophical project to decide whether wormhole time travel (assuming it exists) produces paradoxes of identity. Is it physically possible for a person who time travels through a worm hole to visit their earlier self, say by being in the same room with their earlier self? Worse yet, can persons become their earlier selves?

To solve the paradoxes of personal identity due to time travel's inconsistency with commonly held assumptions about personal identity, many philosophers recommend rejecting the endurance theory which implies a person exists wholly at a single instant. They accept perdurance in which a person exists as a four-dimensional entity extending in time from birth to death. If a person visits their infant self, then they have at least two spatially distinct person stages existing at the same time. In this situation, two moments of personal time correspond to a single moment of external time.

Our concept of personal identity comes under even greater stress if, instead of merely visiting our earlier self, we become our earlier self, in which case our personal time is a loop. Loops in time are technically called "closed timelike curves of spacetime." The most interesting loops are "causal loops." Causal loops lead to backward causation in which an effect can occur before its cause. Causal loops occur when there is a continuous sequence of events e1, e2, e3, ... in which each member is a cause of its successor and in which for some n, en causes e1. The philosopher Milič Čapek has cautioned that with a causal loop "we would be clearly on the brink of magic." Other philosophers of time are more willing to accept the possibility of causal loops, strange though they would be. These loops would have a "fountain of youth" which allowed you to become biologically younger. Note that there is philosophical controversy about whether there must be a causal loop whenever there is backward causation.

What do we mean by "cause" in the previous discussion? There is a vast philosophical literature on disagreements about this key word in the philosophical lexicon, but as a first approximation think of a cause as a necessary part of a sufficient condition.

For a clear and detailed review of the philosophical literature on backward time travel and the resulting paradoxes of causality and of personal identity, see (Wasserman, 2018, ch. 5) and (Fisher, 2015).

Feynman U.S. postage stamp
US Postal Museum

Feynman diagrams picture a short sequence of elementary interactions among particles. Inspired by an idea from John Wheeler, Richard Feynman suggested that a way to interpret the theory of quantum electrodynamics about interactions dominated by electromagnetic or weak forces is that an antimatter particle is really a matter particle traveling backward in time. For example, the positively charged positron is really a negatively charged electron moving backward in time. This phenomenon is pictured in the two diagrams on the left of the above postage stamp, where the positron e+ is moving downward or backward in time.

Because Freeman Dyson proved that the Feynman diagrams are equivalent to Schwinger's equations, which do not have backward time, the majority of physicists in the early 21st century see no need to accept backward time travel due to Feynman's successful representations of quantum electrodynamics. See (Muller 2016, p. 246) for comment on this. Nevertheless, some well respected physicists, for example Neil Turok, do accept Feynman-style backward time travel. At the heart of this dispute about whether to believe antimatter is regular matter traveling backward in time, physicists are very cautious because they realize that the more extraordinary the claim, the more extraordinarily good the evidence should be before accepting the claim.

Here are a variety of brief philosophical arguments against travel to the past:

  1. If travel to the past were possible, you could go back in time and kill your grandfather, but then you wouldn’t be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That’s a logical contradiction. So, travel to the past is impossible.
  2. Like the future, the past is also not real, so time travel to the past is not real either.
  3. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has ever encountered any time travelers.
  4. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
  5. If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out free will. Yet we do have free will to, say, step or not step into a time machine, so travel to the past is impossible.
  6. If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is impossible.
  7. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  8. If travel to the past were possible, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always fail in their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
  9. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. You in the 22nd century buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. You enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
  10. Travel to the past allows you to return to have intercourse with one of your parents, causing your birth. You would have the same finger prints as one of your parents, which is biologically impossible.
  11. If past time travel is possible, then it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which eventually reunites with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the return or impending arrival of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, not metaphysically possible, not physically possible, not technologically possible, not biologically possible, and not probable given today's empirical evidence.

Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. One response to the Grandfather Paradox of item 1 says you would kill your grandfather but then be in an alternative universe to the actual one where you did not kill him. This response is not liked by most advocates; they believe traveling to an alternative universe is not time travel in our universe. They prefer saying you simply cannot kill your grandfather no matter how hard you try.

A response to the Enrico Fermi Paradox, item 3, is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to time travelers.

Argument 9, the paradox of free information, has gotten considerable attention in the philosophical literature. In 1976, David Lewis said this:

But where did the information come from in the first place? Why did the whole affair happen? There is simply no answer. The parts of the loop are explicable, the whole of it is not. Strange! But not impossible, and not too different from inexplicabilities we are already inured to. Almost everyone agrees that God, or the Big Bang, or the entire infinite past of the Universe, or the decay of a tritium atom, is uncaused and inexplicable. Then if these are possible, why not also the inexplicable causal loops that arise in time travel?

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

12. McTaggart's A-Theory and B-Theory

In 1908, the English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The resulting ordering is the same, but the methods by which the ordering is created are different.

Assume longer-lasting events are composed of their point events. Let a and b be two point events that occur in the past (our past), but a occurs before b. Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart's B-series will be ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart's A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or, equivalently, has more pastness than b. Here is a picture of the ordering, with c being a third point event that happens later than both a andb.


Time-McTaggart1

There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a.

Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events go to the right of past events. The information that c is a present event is not used to create the B-series. The B-series places event c to the right of b just from the information that b happens before c.

McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical, but he also believed the A-properties (such as being past) are essential to our concept of time and the B-properties are not sufficient by themselves. So, for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent. This reasoning is called "McTaggart's Paradox."

McTaggart is not an especially clear writer, so his remarks can be interpreted in different ways, and the reader needs to work hard to make sense of them. Too briefly, we can reconstruct McTaggart's Paradox for a specific event, say,

Socrates first spoke to Plato.

This speaking is in the past, at least it is in our past, so the speaking is past in our present. Nevertheless, back in the past, there is a time when the event is present. From all this, McTaggart concludes both that the event is past and that the event is present, from which he declares that the A-series is contradictory. If so, and if the A-series is essential to time, then time itself must be unreal.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of

  • A-series and B-series
  • A-theorist and B-theorist
  • A-facts and B-facts
  • A-terms and B-terms
  • A-properties and B-properties
  • A-predicates and B-predicates
  • A-statements and B-statements
  • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples. B-series terms are relational terms; a B-term refers to a property that relates a pair of events. Some of these properties are: “is earlier than,” “happens twenty-three minutes after,” and “was simultaneous with.” An A-theory term refers to a single event, not a pair of events. Some of these properties are: "in the near future," "happened twenty-three minutes ago," and "is present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements are eternal, they have fixed truth-values over time. For the B-theorist, the statement "The snowfall occured an hour before this act of utterance" will, if true, stay true forever, proved the indexical phrase "the snowfall" is replaced by one indicating the time and place of the snowing. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes in facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, "It began snowing an hour ago," what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs an hour after" is a B-term.

When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfalling, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. When your attitude changes, the snowfalling itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. A-theorists prefer to focus on the second-order change of what they consider to be intrinsic properties of an event, such as its being past. They point out that the snowfalling event will change tomorrow by being even more past. And this second-order change occurs regardless of whether your attitude toward the event changes.

Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each camp member believes their camp's terminology can best explain the terminology of the other camp. Also, it is often the case that the A-theorist believes becoming is more fundamental than being, and the B-theorist believes the opposite. By "becoming," we mean a change in the A-series position of an event, such as its degree of pastness.

Many B-theorists argue that there are no irreducible one-place A-qualities because they can all be reduced to two-place B-relations. The A-theorist in turn promotes A-properties over B-properties.

Is the A-theory or the B-theory the correct theory of reality? The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) Time is fundamentally constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and McTaggart change and McTaggartian change.

The B-theory conflicts with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, (1) the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental. (2) Fundamental temporal properties are relational, not monadic; McTaggartian change of events is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically fundamental.

What do B-theorists mean by calling temporal properties "relational"? They mean that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is relational because it is a relation between the event and us, the subject. When analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Queen Anne's death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past rather than Aristotle's past. So, the labels, "past," "present," and "future" are all about us. There is no objective distinction among past, present and future, say the proponents of the B-theory.

The point about A-properties being relational when properly analyzed is also made this way. The A-theory terminology about space uses the terms "here," "there," "far," and "near." These terms are essentially about the speaker; and the B-theory defender will argue,

Is a map drawn incorrectly because it leaves out an arrow pointing to 'here' and another arrow pointing to 'there'? If not, then the B-theory's spacetime diagram is also not an incorrect treatment of time even if our manifest image of time does require the event of Queen Anne's death to change by receding farther into the past.

The B-theorist also argues that the A-theory violates the special theory of relativity because an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is relative and not an intrinsic, monadic property of the event. Being present is relative to reference frame.

A-theorists are aware of these criticisms, and there are many counterarguments. Some influential A-theorists are A. N. Prior, E. J. Lowe, and Quentin Smith. Some influential B-theorists are Bertrand Russell, W. V. O. Quine, and D. H. Mellor.

Because the A-theory is so closely related to the manifest image and the B-theory is so closely related to the scientific image, disputes between the A-camp and B-camp are closely related to attempts to reconcile the manifest image with the scientific image.

The philosophical literature on the controversy between the two theories is vast. During a famous confrontation with the philosopher Henri Bergson in 1922, Einstein defended his own scientific treatment of time and said the time of the philosophers is an illusion. As he put it, "Il n'y a donc pas un temps des philosophes." This is an overstatement by Einstein. He really meant to attack A-theory philosophers, not also B-theory philosophers. He himself counts as being a B-theory philosopher-scientist.

Martin Heidegger said he wrote Being and Time in 1927 as a response to the conflict between the A-theory and the B-theory, the conflict between the time of Bergson and the time of Einstein.

13. What Is the Flow of Time?

Time seems to flow, many people say. They might explain this remark by saying the present keeps vanishing. Or they might offer a simile and say present events seem to flow into the past and out of existence, just like a boat that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther from us. In the converse sense, we flow into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us. This is the sense that the philosopher George Santayana offered when he said, “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.”

There are various entangled issues regarding flow. (i) Does time itself flow? (ii) If so, do we directly experience the flow? (iii) If time does not flow, why do so many of us believe it does? (iv) Does time really seem to flow? Regarding the latter issue, a small number of philosophers doubt, not just that time flows, but that time seems to us to flow, and they claim we are mistaken in describing how things seem to us to be. The vast majority, though, will agree that time seems to flow, but there is significant philosophical disagreement among these philosophers about issues (i), (ii), and (iii). These issues are directly related to whether McTaggart's A-theory or B-theory is the more fundamental theory.

There are two primary philosophical theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is either a myth or else is merely subjective. Very often, theory A is called the dynamic theory, and theory B is called the static theory and the myth of passage theory.

Theory B implies that the flow is the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of that charge often proceeds like this. Time exists, things change, and so we say time “elapses,” but time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing. The present does not objectively flow or move into the past because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience.

One point J. J. C. Smart offered in favor of the B-theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, he claimed. One second divided by one second is the unit-less number one. That is not a coherent rate.

In another sense of “rate” and of “flow,” there definitely can be different rates for time. According to the special theory of relativity, if I move at a high speed away from you, then you will correctly judge that my clock, which was once synchronized with your clock, ticks at a slower rate than your clock. Physicists sometimes speak of this situation as one in which time flows differently for different observers or different clocks or different frames. However, this is not the sense of flow being promoted by dynamic theories of time.

Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. Continuous time is flowing time. Again, this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers have in mind when debating the objectivity of time's flow.

Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing when all they mean is that time elapses, that is, exists. Isaac Newton spoke this way. Newton would have believed that both time and time's flow are the duration of being of God. He believed both time and time's flow are God's continuing to exist.

Physicists also carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction. Eddington often conflated time's flow and time's arrow. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.

There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the proponents of the static theories, that causes us to believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. B-theorists say perhaps the belief is due to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences.

According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective. It is a feature of our mind-independent reality, and is an intrinsic property of time. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a more fundamental feature of time than his B-series.

There are several kinds of dynamic theory. One implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart's second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist, the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times. Proponents of the A-theory and of the B-theory agree that an event, say World War I, is changing its relationships to us, for example because some of us today are learning more about the war; but the two theories disagree about whether World War I is undergoing an intrinsic change, not just a change in relation to us.

Opponents of the dynamic theory complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. They complain that saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change of her death from being present to being past. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”

A second dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of tensed facts, the actualization of new states of affairs. Reality grows by the addition of more facts. There need be no commitment to events changing intrinsically.

A third dynamic theory says that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as "temporal becoming."

A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth-values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false today, which is sunny. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth-value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics of this dynamic theory suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth-value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth-value, it cannot change its truth-value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth-value, namely the associated "complete sentence" or "eternal sentence," namely, the sentence with its temporal indexical replaced by the date expression that refers to a specific time, and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2000, and the speaker is in San Francisco, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately associated with the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2000 in San Francisco, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, so-called "complete sentences" have truth-values, and these truth-values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time, according to the critic of the dynamic theory.

A fifth dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a flowing present which "spotlights" or makes vivid a new present slice of the block at every new moment. The slice is of all present events that are simultaneous in the block. This theory is usually called the moving spotlight view.

John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112).

14. What Are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the ontological question of the reality of the past, present and future. There are three leading theories, and there is controversy over the exact wording of each, and whether the true theory is metaphysically necessary or just contingently true. The three do not differ in their observational consequences as do competing scientific theories. For a criticism of Quine's treatment of indexicals, see (Slater 2012, p. 72).

(1) According to the ontological theory called presentism, necessarily only present physical objects exist. Stated another way: necessarily, if something is physically real, then it exists now. The presentist maintains that, unlike the present, both the past and the future are not real, so the true statement, "Dinosaurs once existed," must be grounded in some present facts. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, and A. N. Prior are presentists. In 1969, Prior said of the present and the real:

They are one and the same concept, and the present simply is the real considered in relation to two particular species of unreality, namely the past and the future.

(2) Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley defend the growing-past theory. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see Hilary Putnam (1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue. The growing-past theory is also called "now-and-then-ism, the "becoming theory" and "possibilism."

(3) Advocates of eternalism say there are no objective ontological differences among the past, present and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The difference is not objectively real; it is subjective, depending upon which person's experience is being implicitly referred to—yours or Julius Caesar's. Eternalism conflicts with the manifest image because it is common sense to say "Dinosaurs did exist," but not to say, as eternalists do, "Dinosaurs are real." Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and David Lewis have endorsed eternalism. Eternalism is sometimes called the tapestry view of time.

Almost all eternalists adopt the block-universe theory, along with the theory of four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic entities in the universe are four-dimensional events rather than three-dimensional objects, with the fourth dimension being time. The block theory represents reality as a four-dimensional block of events in spacetime in which any two events in the block are ordered by one of these relations: one event being before the other, being after the other, or being simultaneous with the other. For a graphic presentation of the block, see a four-dimensional Minkowski diagram with twists due to the presence of matter-energy. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along those dimensions.

The block theory has been accused of spatializing time, which arguably it has to some extent, but the time dimension of spacetime is special and not a spatial dimension. Unlike the spatial dimensions, the time dimension has a direction; and, says D. H. Mellor, causality runs along the time dimension but not along the spatial dimensions.

A time-slice of the block is a set of simultaneous events in the block. Mathematicians would call the slice a hyperplane; each one is three-dimensional. Think of selecting a slice as analogous to taking a photograph in order to "stop time" with a scene of what is happening at a single instant. According to the block theory, the person whom you are is fundamentally four-dimensional and not three-dimensional, even though it is often convenient to think of you only as three-dimensional. If you are an adult, then you are composed of all your infancy time-slices, plus all your childhood time-slices, plus all your teenage time-slices, plus all your adult time-slices. Time-slices are commonly called "temporal parts."

The block is real, an eternalist would say, and it contains your future death, but might or might not contain a sea battle tomorrow, depending on today's choices. Experts in cosmology are undecided about whether the block is infinite in space and infinite in past time, depending on whether the block begins with the big bang. Regarding future time, most likely the block extends infinitely into the future.

For the eternalist, the block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future; but any chosen reference frame placed upon the block will have its own definite past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. The majority of physicists accept the block theory.

Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say the block is growing with the present being its leading edge and with the future not existing. The present moment is the latest moment within the block. The present is a three-dimensional time-slice that divides the past from the nothingness of the future. Some philosophers express that point by saying the present is the edge of all "becoming." The advocates of the growing-block and of eternalism say that what makes the sentence "Dinosaurs once existed" true is that there is a past region of the block in which dnosaurs do exist.

All three ontologies [namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism] imply that, at the present moment, we only ever experience a part of the present and that we do not have direct access to the past. Their advocates all agree that nothing exists now that is not present. They all need to show somehow that there is an important difference between never existing (Santa Claus) and not still existing (Abraham Lincoln). Members of all three camps will understand an ordinary speaker who says, “There will be a storm tomorrow so it’s good that we fixed the roof last week,” but they will provide different treatments of this remark at a metaphysical level.

Most eternalists accept the B-theory of time. Presentists and advocates of the growing-past tend to accept the A-theory of time.

One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated in 1865? In technical-ease, we are asking what are the "truthmakers" of the true sentences and the "falsemakers" of the false sentences. Many presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers in the past but are nevertheless true because their truthmakers are in the present. They say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way things are, perhaps traces of the past in pages of present books. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist and the growing-past theorist believe this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist and the growing-block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real but far away from us along a spatial dimension. Why not treat these distant realities in the same manner, they ask?

A related issue for the presentist is how to account for causation, for April showers bringing May flowers. Can there be causation without both the cause and the effect being real at different times? More fundamentally, presentism will require an unsual theory of what "change" means because the commonly accepted understanding is that for something to change it would have to have different properties at different times.

Presentism and the growing-past theory need to account for the Special Theory of Relativity's treatment of the present. Relativity implies there is no common global present, but only different presents for each of us. Relativity theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in one reference frame, while allowing b to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame, even though a and c are not simultaneous in either frame. Nevertheless, if a is real, then shouldn’t c be real? But neither presentism nor the growing-past theory can allow c to be real. This argument against presentism and the growing-past theory presupposes the transitivity of co-existence.

Despite this criticism, (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. The implication of this is that, for event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero spacetime interval from a, and many of Stein's opponents, including his fellow presentists, do not like this implication. A survey of defenses of presentism and the growing-past theories can be found in (Markosian 2003). For other defenses of presentism and the growing-past against criticisms that appeal to the theory of relativity, see (Savitt 2008).

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past usually will unite in opposition to eternalism on four grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists (as opposed to non-classical versions that say the block splits into multiple blocks for each quantum possibility at each instant), there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; but we know this determinsm is incorrect because it denies libertarian free will. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness. (iv) Future events do not exist and so do not stand in relationships of before and after. (v) Future-tensed statements that are contingent do not have truthmakers and so are neither true nor false.

Defenders of eternalism and the block-universe offer responses to these criticisms. Regarding (i), the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there, so why should the vividness of now imply the unreality of the future? Regarding (ii) and the open future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious, says the eternalist. In 1981, J. J. C. Smart, a proponent of the block-universe, asked us to

conceive of a soldier in the twenty-first century...cold, miserable and suffering from dysentery, and being told that some twentieth-century philosophers and non-philosophers had held that the future was unreal. He might have some choice things to say.

Advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future. Advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of this argument are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.

Opponents of the block-universe counter that the block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults. In 1925, Hans Reichenbach criticized the block theory's treatment of the present:

In the condition of the world, a cross-section called the present is distinguish; the 'now' has objective significance. Even when no human being is alive any longer, there is a 'now'....

Opponents of the block-universe charge that it must be mistaken because it also implies determinism. Presumably, this is because the block never changes.

Here is a common defense of the block-universe theory against this charge:

The block universe is not necessarily a deterministic one. ...Strictly speaking, to say that the occurrence of a relatively later event is determined vis à vis a set of relatively earlier events, is only to say that there is a functional connection or physical law linking the properties of the later event to those of the earlier events. ...Now in the block universe we may have partial or even total indeterminacy—there may be no functional connection between earlier and later events. (McCall 1966, p. 271)

One defense of the block theory against Bergson's charge that it inappropriately spatializes time is that when we graph the color of eggs sold against the dollar amount of the sales, no one complains that we are inappropriately spatializing color.

If you look at the North Star, we say you see it as it was, not as it is, because it takes so many years for the light to reach your eyes. The North Star might have burned out several years ago. If so, then you are seeing something that does not exist. That is puzzling. Eternalism provides a way out of the puzzle: you are seeing an existing time-slice of the 4D block that is the North Star.

For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for some criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002). For a survey of the various ways presentists might account for true claims about the past, see (Miller 2013, pp. 354-356).

b. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?

There is considerable controversy among philosophers of time about whether the present is objectively real. There is no doubt that the notion of the now or the present is deeply embedded within many of our phrases, not just those in the present tense. For example, when someone yells, "Duck!", to you, you know not to respond with, "When?"

Let's explore the universality of the present, and then its objectivity.

If you speak on the phone with someone two hundred miles away, the conversation is normal because you seem to share a common now. But that normalcy is only apparent because phone's electromagnetic signal travels the two hundred miles so quickly. During a conversation with someone much farther away on the moon, you would notice a strange 1.3 second time lag and thus a loss of a common now.

Suppose you were to look at your correct clock on Earth and notice it is midnight. What time would it be on the Moon, according to your clock? Well, midnight, of course. But a more difficult question to answer is "What event on the Moon is simultaneous with your midnight on Earth?" You can't look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes any signal that long to reach from the Moon to the Earth. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the strike through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid struck the Moon at midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you'll have an even longer wait. So, the moral is that whatever collection of events is in your present is something you have to compute; you cannot just perceive the collection.

Your present need not be someone else's present. Einstein's theory of relativity implies that the present is not reference-frame-free. For example, if someone judges time using a clock fixed to their spaceship that is flying by you at a significant fraction of the speed of light, then when your clock shows it is now midnight, the collection of events that you eventually compute, and so can correctly say occurs now, must be different than the collection of events that the space traveler will be able to say occurs at midnight. You and your nearby space traveler will not notice much of a difference for an event nearby or even on another continent, but you will notice the difference for an event on the moon and even more so for events across the galaxy. The difference in nows between you and the space traveler grows greater the farther the event is away from you, and it grows greater the faster the spaceship's speed. The implication is that there are a great many different nows and nobody's now is the only correct one.

Luckily, people nearby each other on Earth and moving at speeds insignificant compared to the speed of light almost always agree about what events occur now.

Let's turn now from the issue of whether the now is universal to whether it is objectively real. There is no doubt that everyone has real beliefs about the present including the belief that the present is somehow real, but the philosophical issue is whether the present is objectively real, despite our having those beliefs. The A-theorist says the division of events into past, present, and future is an objective feature of reality and not merely a feature of our experience. The B-theorist disagrees.

In any discussion about whether the now is objective, we need to remember that the term "objective" has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame. But there is objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent or anthropocentric. Our discussion here focuses on the latter sense.

That we all agree on the now for nearby events is a feature of the manifest image that gets applied to events that are not nearby. But in the scientific image, there is no unique present for all of us. This claim about the scientific image—that there is no objective now—is controversial, even among prominent physicists; Lee Smolin and George Ellis argued that we must have a common present even if this notion is not used in current physical theory. For more discussion of this point see (Rovelli, 2018, p. 219).

All philosophers say we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no living, conscious beings. This claim has met stiff resistance. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)

One argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so much more vivid to everyone. If science does not explain this vividness, say the objectivists, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective? A third argument for objective reality of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

Let's re-examine these arguments. Regarding vividness, we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with an experience of past nows and future nows. Instead, when we speak of the "vividness" of our present experience of a tree in front of us, we are really comparing our present experience of the tree with our dim memories of past trees and expectations of future trees. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed, says the critic, by measuring those events [when they happen] and not merely by measuring expectations of those events. Also,

A second criticism of the vividness argument points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now, a specious present, in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer assures us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

Assuming our experience of the present is vivid and that it is real, it does not follow that we are directly perceiving presentness, as the A-theorist often says. The problem of the direct experience of the present was discussed above in the section on mind and time.

Another argument against the objectivity of the now comes from its absence in scientific laws and in science's representation of reality via spacetime diagrams. To be overly brief, if scientists do not need it, then it is not real. The counterargument is that it is the mistake of scientism to suppose that if something is not in our current theories, then it must not be real.

Einstein was unhappy that his theory of relativity had no use for an objective present, but Rudolf Carnap responded that our belief in the present is a matter for psychology, not physics or philosophy.

McTaggart's A-series necessarily designates some instant as the present, although this designation changes over time. The B-series does not indicate a present moment. According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The now is objectively real. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light and sound. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present.

This disagreement about the now is an ongoing feature of debate in the philosophy of time, and there are many subtle moves made by advocates on each side of the issue.

There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this, says Kretzmann, God must always be changing because God's knowledge keeps changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable. Thomas Aquinas, on the other hand, argued that God is unchanging and so is not in time.

c. Persistence and Four-Dimensionalism

Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. As the philosopher Nelson Goodman said in the 1950s, "An object is a monotonous process."

The familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said therefore to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of perdurance disagree and say objects perdure at times, and they believe the ontologically basic entities perdure rather than endure. For an object such as a rock, the philosopher Nelson Goodman says, "An object is a monotonous process." The process is considered to be four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional, so all events or processes are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a forty-year-old man is a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.

Here is a fairly well-accepted technical definition of endurance and perdurance from David Lewis in 1986:

Something perdures iff it persists by having different temporal parts, or stages, at different times, though no one part of it is wholly present at more than one time; whereas it endures iff it persists by being wholly present at more than one time.

Given a sequence of temporal parts, how do we know whether they compose a single perduring object? One answer, given by Hans Reichenbach, Ted Sider and others, is that they compose a single object if the sequence falls under a causal law so that temporal parts of the perduring object cause other temporal parts of the object. Philosophers of time with a distaste for the concept of causality, oppose this answer.

One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-segments of the mathematical line within the segment from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. She also says that as the present moves along, the four-dimensionalist is committed to saying present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that an infinity of parts is not too many parts and by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present. Similarly, dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently. By removing talk of "popping in and out," the source of intuitive implausibility is removed.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken because people often step into the same river twice. Who is really making the mistake?

The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken. We do not step into two different rivers, do we? They are identical rivers, that is, the same river. Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. So, the advocate of endurance has trouble escaping the Heraclitus Paradox. So does the mereological essentialist.

A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus Paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-dimensional river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-D game. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. However, most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.

For arguments for and against perdurance and endurance, see (Wasserman, 2018).

d. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences

The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.

The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that the next day the admiral does order a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. The eternalist says that, if this is so, then the above quoted sentence was true yesterday at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a timeless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is simply true or false, even if we do not know which.

Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's A-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth-values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth-value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth-values is called the "doctrine of the open future" and also the "Aristotelian position" because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of his On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth-values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth-values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world as the libertarians believe, but if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions were to change, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see the discussion of it in Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without both premises in this argument having truth-values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth-values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so the Aristotelian position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal or complete sentences whose truth-values are not relative to the situation and time of utterance because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by expressions for specific times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth-values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.

Philosophers are still divided on all these issues.

e. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. The Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages have no tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs; we distinguish "Her death has happened" from "Her death will happen." However, English expresses time in other ways: with the adverbial phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” with the adjective phrases "new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since."

Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: tenses are objective and tenses are subjective. The two answers have given rise to two compenting camps of philosophers, the tensers and the detensers, respectively.

The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach. This philosophical theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that, when we learn the truth-values of certain tensed sentences, we obtain knowledge which tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time—that it is now noon. Tenses are almost the same as what is represented by positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the theory is commonly called the A-theory of tense, and its advocates are called "tensers."

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Our saying the event "happened" rather than "is happening" indicates that we said this after the event happened rather than before or during the event. This theory is the B-theory of tense. The detenser W. V. O. Quine expressed the point this way:

Our ordinary language shows a tiresome bias in its treatment of time. Relations of date are exalted grammatically.... This bias is of itself an inelegance, or breach of theoretical simplicity. Moreover, the form that it takes—that of requiring that every verb form show a tense—is peculiarly productive of needless complications, since it demands lipservice to time even when time is farthest from our thoughts. Hence in fashioning canonical notations it is usual to drop tense distinctions. (Word and Object §36)

The philosophical disagreement about tenses is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, presentness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location? The A-camp says it does; the B-camp disagrees.

Let's explore the controversy a bit more. On the tenseless theory of time, whether the infamous death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer by Indians occurred here depends on the speaker’s spatial relation to the death event. Is the speaker at the battle site in Montana? Similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective. The detenser says it depends on the speaking subject's temporal relation to the event. That is, is the speaker hearing this in 1876 at the time the death event occurs or instead hearing this in the 21st century? That's why it makes no sense to say simply Custer's death occurs now (monadically, that is, without expressing a relation to the speaker) without assuming an understanding of the subject's temporal relation to the event.

This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their "truthmakers."

For purposes of simplifying the discussion, let us uncritically accept the correspondence theory of truth, that true sentences are true because they correspond to the facts. The A-theory and the B-theory disagree about what kind of facts are the truthmakers of sentences that have tenses. Consider, to take a well known examples, the tensed sentence, “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the "tensed" fact that the death is past, that is has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the above sentence. Notice that the B-answer’s fact does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, any appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language at the fundamental level, as is all other use of the terminology of the A-series (except in trival instances when it is self-referential such as "The A-series is constructed using A-facts").

If you, yourself had uttered “Queen Anne of Great Britain died,” then your utterance would be true. If Julius Caesar had uttered it, then his utterance would have been false. So, the truth-value of the tensed sentence is context-dependent, says the detenser.

This B-theory analysis is challenged by the tenser's A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but the A-theorist points out that a sentence can be true even if never uttered or read or inscribed.

There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis of it, such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight,” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress. John Perry famously explored this argument in his article, "The Problem of the Essential Indexical."

Prior, in (Prior 1959), supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” The B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness, he says, because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event is in the past, that is, it has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So, Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is unsuccessful.

D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart, both proponents of the B-theory, agree that tensed talk is important, even essential, for understanding how we think and speak; but Mellor and Smart claim that tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality. These two philosophers, and other philosophers who "do not take tense seriously," advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed, declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones.

The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically. Alfred Tarski has provided these analyses.

Mellor's and Smart's point is that truth conditions can adequately express the meaning of tensed sentences, so there is no need for tensed facts and tensed properties. The untranslatability of some tensed sentences merely shows a fault with ordinary language's ability to characterize objective, tenseless reality.

Let's make the same point in other words. According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs (in the tenseless sense of "occurs") at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in this explanation of the truth conditions.

Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist's chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Being thankful for the pastness of the painful event provides a simpler explanation, actually a simplistic explanation, but not a better explanation.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.

To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but proponents of the new B-theory claim their analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should "not take tense seriously" in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not needed.

Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. Quentin Smith says, the "new tenseless theory of time is faced with insurmountable problems, and that it ought to be abandoned in favor of the tensed theory."

The advocate of the A-theory E. J. Lowe opposed the B-theory because it is too much of a challenge to the manifest image:

I consider it to be a distinct merit of the tensed view of time that it delivers this verdict, for it surely coincides with the verdict of common sense. (Lowe, 1998, p. 104)

Lowe argued that no event can have a tenseless predicate, and no truth can be made true by B-theory truth conditions because all statements of truth conditions are tensed.

The philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

15. What Gives Time Its Arrow?

The universe has a direction in two senses. It points from the past to the present to the future. This occurs because past events produce present events, and it occurs regardless of the details of any processes, such as whether hot objects dissipate their heat into adjacent cooler objects or vice versa. In a second sense, there is a directionality due to the normal direction that all the universe's apparently one-way processes go. For example, hot tea spontaneously dissipates some of its heat into ice cubes that float in the tea; as a practical matter this one-way melting process never goes in reverse. Similarly, unbroken eggs turn into omelets, and the reverse process is never seen. Light radiates away from the candle flame, and doesn't converge into it. The amalgamation of these normal, apparently-one-way processes throughout the universe is the second kind of directionality of time, and it is commonly called the "arrow of time," a term coined by Arthur Eddington in 1928. This directionality is universal in the sense that if any two people were transported together to any new place in the universe, they would agree on which day was yesterday and which day is today.

Philosophers disagree over the relationship between these two kinds of directionalityꟷwhether the two are identical or are merely correlated or are completely independent or are causally connected. And philosophers disagree over whether it is proper to say, "Time has an arrow."

Craig Callender says, "the direction of time is not a feature of time itself but only of the local asymmetries in material processes," (Callender, 2017, p. 21). Another philosopher of time, Paul Horwich, says, "the current empirical evidence indicates that time itself is intrinscially symmetric" (Horwich 1987, p. 38). In other words, time itself has no arrow. The physicists Arthur Eddington and John von Neumann would disagree with this. They say time has an intrinsic arrow that points toward equilibrium.

This article frequently assumes the mainstream view of Eddington and von Neumann that time does have an arrow. From this perspective, the problem of the arrow of time is the problem of reconciling the existence of the cosmic arrow of time with the fact that nearly all the fundamental or basic laws of science in the micro-world do not reveal the arrow.  They don't "know" the future from the past. Time is apparently asymmetric, yet nearly all the basic laws are time symmetric in the sense that if the laws allow a process to go forward in time, then its going backward in time does not violate the laws, even if one of the two directions is overwhelmingly more probable than the other.

The problem of the arrow of time is also called the reversibility paradox and the time symmetry paradox. Ever since it was first described clearly by William Thomson (aka Lord Kelvin) in 1874, there has been considerable disagreement among the experts about how to solve it.

Here are six unpopular treatments that have been suggested as a way out of the paradox: (1) God wanted the world to have an arrow despite the time symmetry of His basic laws. (2) We live in a multiverse in which everything that can happen does happen in some universe or other, so there must be a universe in which time has an arrow, and our universe happens to be that universe. (3) The arrow is a brute fact with no explanation. (4) The arrow has a correct explanation, but the cognitive power of homo sapiens is too limited to ever figure it out. (5) The arrow is a product of the human mind, and it is not an objective feature of the external world. (6) The arrow is due to the direction of causation.

The main complaint with answer (5) is that traces of phenomena are always after and never before those phenomena. Footprints of a stroll along the beach are always after and never before the stroll. Our measuring instruments give readings after the measuring, never before. Thinking does not make this so. Answer (6) is the most popular of the six in the philosophical literature. It is discussed later in this article.

Physicists prefer a seventh treatment of the problem of the arrow of time: The arrow of time is the overall change from lower to higher entropy of the universe. The arrow points toward equilibrium.

The second law of thermodynamics says that in a closed system entropy very probably increases, or, if the system is already at equilibrium, the entropy stays the same. A closed system is one isolated from the environment outside the system. The universe as a whole is an example of a closed system. A thermos bottle is approximately a closed system. Before stating the second law more accurately, the term "entropy" needs some explanation. The entropy of a closed system of particles is informally described as a being a measure of a system's disorder and as being a measure of the sytem's randomness. These descriptions can be helpful but also misleading. More accurately, entropy is a measure of how many ways the smallest particles of the system can be arranged so that the system looks the same at the large scale, in terms of macroscopic properties such as temperature, pressure, color, and whether the system is a cow or a room. There are many more microstructural ways for a system to be at high entropy than low entropy.

For example, there is a relatively small number of ways to distribute the air molecules in a normal-size room so that they all are collected in a cubic meter in a corner of the room (assuming the room has no container keeping the air there); but there are a great many more ways to distribute those same molecules fairly evenly throughout the room so that the air pressure is the same everywhere. Air pressure is a large-scale property; a molecule does not have an air pressure. The positions and velocities of the molecules are small-scale properties. Therefore, if the room has all its air molecules in a corner, and there is continual fluctuation in the positions and velocities of the particles, then the system will evolve quickly from this low entropy state to the high entropy state in which the air pressure is uniform throughout the room.

Entropy is not a property of a single particle, but only of a group of particles. Unfortunately, physicists cannot well-define the size of the group by saying how many particles are needed. Two is insufficient. 1023 is clearly sufficient; this is about Avogadro’s number of particles.

The second law is an instance of the general principle that systems out of equilibrium tend toward equilibrium. The state of maximum entropy is called equilibrium. Equilibrium is any system's "goal" state. It is the state in which the system's energy is as uniformly distributed as possible. Everything that can has run down, burned out, decomposed, or rusted. Its heat is maximally dissipated so that the cool objects have warmed up; the hot objects have cooled down. At equilibrium, maximum uniformity is reached, so entropy is maximized, and the system's local arrow of time, its local temporal asymmetry, disappears because there are no important changes happening within the system. At equilibrium, microscopic properties are still changing, but the values of the macroscopic properties of the system are not changing. Electrons still circle the atom's nucleus; molecules still vibrate in crystals; but heat is not flowing; and air pressure is not changing.

Useful work is created by harnessing entropy increase, but entropy is not the same thing as energy. In a closed system, entropy increases while energy remains constant. Or, to say this a bit more accurately, in a closed system, the total entropy usually increases, but the total energy always remains constant, or remains constant on average. Or, because E=mc<sup2, what remains constant is the matter-energy.

The discussion of the second law has been in terms of classical states of a system, in which a state is defined by the positions and velocities of its basic particles. At a more sophisticated level, one should talk about quantum statistical-mechanical states in terms of wave functions, but that discussion will not be pursued in this article.

The second law is sometimes said to be a time asymmetric fundamental law, but it is neither. It is not fundamental because the second law is a statistical outcome of applying the fundamental micro-laws of classical or quantum statistical mechanics.

The second law is not time asymmetric for the following reason, which is difficult to state succintly. Crudely, the second law says that in closed systems entropy probably increases. A little more accurately, the second law says that, in closed systems, the entropy probably increases or stays the same, and only very, very, very, rarely will decrease.

The probability of entropy increasing is high and becomes higher the more particles there are within the system. Paul and Tatyana Ehrenfest first promoted this solution to the problem of the arrow in 1907.

It is physically possible for entropy to decrease in a closed system, but this is very improbable. The probability allows a system, even one in which heat is exchanged, to evolve to lower entropy. For example, it allows the unmaking of an omelet, or for the milk to spontaneously separate from black coffee, but to see this, you would have to wait until approximately the Poincaré Recurrence Time, which is an extremely long time, much longer than the age of our universe. That completes the explanation of why the second law of thermodynamics is neither fundamental nor temporally asymmetric.

Let's return now to the problem of the arrow. In the 19th century, Ludwig Boltzmann claimed he had discovered that the increase of entropy is due to there being so many more microscopically-indistinguishable ways for energy to be spread out than for it to be more concentrated, so, as particles in a system move around and interact and fluctuate, the collisions never quite balance out exactly. Over time, the colliding particles will be more likely to adopt configurations in which the energy is more spread out and less available to do useful work. In time, the system shifts toward more probable configurations or states. This tendency of any isolated system to evolve in time toward the more probable is described quantitatively in terms of entropy by Boltzmann’s version of the Second Law of Thermodynamics.

Boltzmann claimed to have derived the Second Law of Thermodynamics from Newton's laws of mechanics. Josef Loschmidt complained in 1876 about the paradoxicality of deducing the practically irreversible Second Law of Thermodynamics from the reversible laws of Newtonian mechanics. This complaint about deriving irreversibility from reversibility is difficult to answer, and the problem is now called Loschmidt's Paradox. It is the thermodynamic version of the problem of the direction of time.

The most favored response to the paradox is that Boltzmann's derivation contains an unnoticed, hidden premise. He did not notice that, given what he explicitly said in his derivation of future high entropy, the same derivation could be applied from the present to the past, and it would imply that entropy was higher in the past. That is odd because we happen to know entropy was not higher in the past. It was lower. Boltzmann's derivation works to explain the second law only because he used, but failed to notice that he used, a hidden premise which is a boundary condition implying that entropy was lower in the past. This lower entropy in turn is due to entropy being even lower in the even more distant past, and so on back.

The Past Hypothesis is the assumption, which Boltzmann did not make explicit, that in the past the state of the system's entropy was lower. The implication is that the universe's entropy was minimal at the big bang. Theologians are fond of making this point by saying that at the big bang the universe was finely tuned.

The above treatment of entropy has been challenged in the philosophical literature. For example, Huw Price (Price 1996, p. 48) says, "...we have no right to assume that entropy increases rather than decreases.... What is objective is that there is an entropy gradient over time, not that the universe 'moves' on this gradient in one direction rather than another."

Although nearly every micro-law is time symmetric, that is, time reversible invariant, there are a few exceptions. The law of kaon decay, for example, is truly irreversible. However, all the truly irreversible processes and their laws seem to be irrelevant to the overall asymmetry of the cosmic arrow of time.

Actually, in time symmetric laws, what is symmetric is not quite time alone, but rather TCP: time plus charge plus parity. The TCP Theorem says that for all phenomena obeying the laws of science, if time, charge, and parity were all reversed, then the new phenomena would also satisfy the laws. (T): Reversing time implies interchanging the past and the future or reversing the velocities of all particles or replacing t by -t in the laws. (C): Reversing charge implies replacing particles with their antiparticles and vice versa. (P): Reversing parity implies reflecting all particles through any single two-dimensional plane. Except for the present comment, this article overlooks the details of the TCP Theorem when it mentions time symmetry.

a. Time without an Arrow

There is a philosophical problem about Eddington's claim that entropy causes the arrow of time. If physical changes are all that is required for time to exist, and if the arrow is the overall directionality of macroscopic physical processes, and if the existing macroscopic physical changes were to be all random in the sense that any process is no more likely to go one way rather than the reverse, then there could be time without an arrow. There is no arrow of time in a chaotic universe. There are also no clocks.

"If the universe reaches equilibrium, the arrow disappears, but time doesn't, because there is still change" say those philosophers who believe change, but not an arrow, is essential to the existence of time.

It is not controversial that there is a correlation between time's arrow and the direction of entropy change. What is controversial is whether there is an identity or even a causal connection between the two. One alternative suggestion is that there is an intrinsic asymmetry in the geometry of spacetime that produces time's arrow, and the arrow is merely highly correlated with entropy change.

The philosopoher Tim Maudlin comments:

[T]he temporal structure of the world, independently of its material contents, has an intrinsic directionality. The later states of the world arise from, are produced from, the earlier states. This is independent of, e.g., the direction in which entropy increases. Even if the world were at thermal equilibrium, with constant entropy, still the later states would be produced from the earlier states in accord with the fundamental laws of physics.

b. What Needs to be Explained?

There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us the answers to this constellation of issues: (1) whether the asymmetry in time is built into the fundamental structure of spacetime; (2) whether there are two arrows, one having to do with how physical processes evolve, and one having to do with the temporal structure of the world independently of its other physical processes; (3) why the arrow points one way rather than the reverse way; (4) why the micro-physical laws of science do not readily reveal the arrow; (5) how the arrow is connected with entropy; (6) why the arrow goes in the same direction in all galaxies; (7) why it is so probable that the entropy of an isolated system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (8) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (9) what are the mathematical characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (10) what the relationships are among the various arrows of time; (11) how entropy is connected with quantum entanglement; (12) why the Past Hypothesis is true.

c. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow

Since the first quarter of the 20th century, there have been two principal explanations of the arrow of time in the philosophical literature: (i) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical; (ii) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of our universe.

Leibniz proposed explanation (i). It is called the causal theory of time's order. Informally, we understand very clearly that causation has a direction. April showers cause May flowers, but the May flowers don't cause the April showers. But the philosophical problem is whether the concept of causation is clear enough to explain time's direction.

Believing causal precedence is the same relation as temporal precedence, and so can be used to explain the relation of temporal precedence, the philosopher Hans Reichenbach developed Leibniz's theory in more detail in 1928. He defined "happens before" by saying that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B, but B could not have caused A. Critics of Reichenbach have complained that the usefulness of this causal theory depends on clarifying the two notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order; and the critics doubt that this can be done because the notions of causality and possibility are more obscure than the concept of time's arrow. Also, the causal theory should explain why, if we grant that there is causal asymmetry, the asymmetry is in one direction rather than in the inverse direction. Bertrand Russell complained that time order is more fundamental than causal order; he noted that scientific laws are expressed as differential equations without using the word "cause," and said the notion of cause is "a relic of a bygone age."

The causal theory of time is often used to argue that travel to the past is impossible because the direction of time is the direction of causation, and that direction is always from past causes to future effects. An important counter to this from David Lewis is that the direction of time can be defined as the typical direction of causation instead of as the direction of causation.

In addition to Leibniz and Reichenbach, versions of the causal theory have been defended by the philosophers Robb, Grünbaum, Winnie, van Fraassen, Mellor and Tooley.

A majority of 21st century physicists and philosophers reject the causal theory of time and favor explanation (ii) that involves entropy, but there is serious disagreement. And even if entropy is accepted as the explanation of the arrow, there is controversy about why the Past Hypothesis is true.

Does Alan Guth's theory of cosmic inflation adequately explain time's asymmetry? No, says Guth; inflation shows how time asymmetry can be preserved and amplified in the early universe, but not how it began in the first place.

Can the Past Hypothesis be justified or explained in more depth? Here are some competing responses to that question. (1) The initially low entropy is simply a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for it. The physicist Richard Feynman suggested this response. (2) Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose have said we need to keep looking for some basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initially low entropy. (3) A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis appeals to God's having designed the big bang to start with low entropy. (4) A fourth perspective appeals to the many-worlds interpretation of quantum theory in order to argue that since there have to be so many universes with different initial entropies, there certainly has to be one universe that is like our particular universe with its particular, initially low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy at the beginning of the big bang. (5) An arrow of time could evolve naturally in a world with time reversible invariant laws (CPT invariant laws) and with no special initial conditions such as the Past Hypothesis provided one waits long enough and provided other assumptions hold about the universe such as it having had, and still has, an expanding infinite volume, says Alan Guth. The implication for the past is, he says, that time's arrow once went backward in our very far past. See (Guth 2014).

To make one final point about entropy increase, in the early 21st century, M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd suggested an original explanation for entropy increase: “What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other.” His point is that the increasing entropy in any process is really increasing quantum entanglement among the particles in that process. This does not explain, though, why the particles had less entanglement in the past.

d. Multiple Arrows

Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:

  1. Causes precede their effects. (causal arrow)
  2. It is easier to know about the past than to know about the future; the future is more uncertain than the past. (knowledge arrow)
  3. We remember last week, not next week. (memory arrow)
  4. There is evidence of the past but not of the future. (arrow of evidence)
  5. Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
  6. Possibilities decrease as time goes on.
  7. Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it. (electromagnetic arrow)
  8. Our universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
  9. We see black holes but never white holes.
  10. B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
  11. Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
  12. We age but never get biologically younger.
  13. As time goes on, our universe splits into new parallel universes.

Many physicists suspect all these arrows are just aspects of one underlying arrow. In other words, the arrows are linked. The thermodynamic arrow, the arrow of entropy increase, is the leading candidate for a unified explanation of all the arrows, along with the Past Hypothesis:

Only where there is heat is there a distinction between past and future. Thoughts, for instance, unfold from the past to the future, not vice versa—and, in fact, thinking produces heat in our heads. (Rovelli 2018, p. 25)

The belief that the thermodynamic arrow is the fundamental arrow the position of Albert Einstein, John Wheeler, Richard Feynman, and Stephen Hawking, but physicists are still debating the point. See chapter 15 in (Muller, 2016) for a non-technical discussion of why entropy change cannot be the cause of time's arrow, and see chapter 16 for a discussion of the competing arrows of time.

e. Reversing the Arrow

There has been disagreement over whether, if the universe’s expansion were to stop and the universe began to contract, the arrow of time would reverse as the contraction began. The generally accepted answer in the 21st century is that the arrow would not reverse.

But could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists agree that the answer is yes, and they say it would have gone the other way if the conditions of our universe at our big bang event had been very different. There could be conditions that make bells un-ring and dead people become living persons who live on until their birth. In 1877, Boltzmann was the first physicist to seriously consider this possibility. He worried that there might be regions in our universe where time runs backward compared to our region.

In 1902 in Appearance and Reality, the British idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley said that when time runs backward compared to our current world, "Death would come before birth, the blow would follow the wound, and all must seem irrational." The Australian philosopher J. J. C. Smart disagreed about the irrationality. He said all would seem as it is now because memory would become precognition, so an inhabitant of a time-reversed region would feel the blow and then the wound, just as in our region.

G. J. Whitrow in The Natural Philosophy of Time, defended Bradley and argued that memory would not become precognition; his justification was that memory, by definition, is of whatever happens first, so, "all must seem irrational."

As the philosopher Norman Swartz has said,

Part of the story we tell, of the process of seeing, involves the emission of photons from objects [e.g., computer screens] and the subsequent impinging of these photons on our retinas. But this process is obviously directed in time. In a world where time ran oppositely to ours, we could not see objects at all: objects would be photon-sinks, not photon emitters.

Writing about the reversal of time in the Journal of Philosophy in 1962, Hilary Putnam remarked, "It is difficult to talk about such extremely weird situations without deviating from ordinary idiomatic usage of English. But this difficulty should not be mistaken for a proof that these situations could not arise."

16. What Is Temporal Logic?

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time and temporal information by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time and temporal information.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Adam's arrival at the train station happens before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station does not happen before Adam's.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-place or two-argument relation Bxy be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation of the above informal argument produces:

Bab
-------
~Bba

The symbol '~' is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '¬' for negation. Unfortunately, this simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we can add some semantic principles about the happens-before relation, namely, the premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we can add this additional premise to the argument:

∀x∀y[Bxy ~Byx]

The symbol '∀x' is the universal quantifier on x. Some logicians prefer to use '(x)' for the universal quantifier. The symbol '→' is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol '⊃' instead.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Adam arrives at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrives there before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrives before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:

Bab
Bbc
------
Bac

To make this argument be valid we can add the premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) Bxz]

The symbol '&' represents the conjunction operation. Some logicians prefer to use either the symbol '·' or '∧' for conjunction. The transitivity of B is a principle we may want to add into our temporal logic.

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions:

  • ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself.
  • ∀x∀y{[t(x) ≠ t(y)] → [Bxy v Byx]}. Any two non-simultaneous events are related somehow by the B relation. That is, there are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. 't(x)' is the time coordinate for event x.
  • ∀x∀y(Bxy → ~Byx). In a pair of events, one cannot happen both before and after the other.
  • ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future.
  • ∀x∀y(x ≠ y → ∃z(Bxz & Bzy)). B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any pair of non-simultaneous point events. This prevents quantized time.

To incorporate the ideas of the theory of relativity, we might want to make the happens-before relation be three-valued instead of two-valued by having it relate two events plus a reference frame.

When we formalized these principles of reasoning about the happens-before relation by translating them into predicate logic, we said we were creating temporal logic. However, strictly speaking a temporal logic is just a formal theory of temporal sentences expressed in a logic. Calling it a logic, as is commonly done, is a bit of an exaggeration; it is analogous to calling the formalization of Peano's axioms of arithmetic the development of number logic. Our axioms about B are not axioms of predicate logic, but only of a theory that uses predicate logic and that presumes the logic is interpreted on a domain of instantaneous events, and that presumes B is not open to re-interpretation as are the other predicate letters of predicate logic, but is always to be interpreted as "happens-before."

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments formalized in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. A. N. Prior was the pioneer in the late 1950s. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. Prior created this new logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W. V. O. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommends that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false. This would rule out indexical terms such as "him" and "now" whose reference (but not meaning) can shift from one context to another.

Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic by re-interpreting its propositional operators. Or we can say he added four new propositional operators. Here they are with examples of their intended interpretations using an arbitrary present-tensed proposition p.

Pp “It has at some time been the case that p"
Fp “It will at some time be the case that p”
Hp “It has always been the case that p”
Gp “It will always be the case that p”

'Pp' might be interpreted also as "at some past time it was the case that,” or “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that," all these being equivalent English phrases for the purposes of applying tense logic to English. None of the tense operators are truth-functional.

One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, if p represents the present-tensed proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp represents "It has at some time been the case that Custer dies in Montana" which is equivalent in English to simply "Custer died in Montana." So, we call 'P' the past-tense operator. 'P' represents a phrase that attaches to a sentence in order to produce another.

Metaphysicians who are presentists are especially interested in this tense logic because, if Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then this logic, with an appropriate semantics, may show how to eliminate any ontological commitment to the past (and future) while preserving the truth of past tense propositions that appear in biology books such as "There were dinosaurs" and "There was a time when the Earth did not exist."

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq).

The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)

says

Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the following equivalence. For all propositions p and q,

(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not necessary that not-p.

A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic. It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth or falsehood of a tensed proposition could be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, the proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true-at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

Prior himself did not take a stand on which formal logic and formal semantics was correct for dealing with temporal expressions.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, for example, "The event of Queen Anne's dying has the property of being in the past"; but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, "It has at some time in the past been the case that Queen Anne is dying," and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. Instead of translating the “x is resting” predicate as Px, where P is a one-argument predicate, it could be translated into temporal predicate logic as the two-argument predicate Rxt, and this would be interpreted as saying x is resting at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate R by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms to more carefully specify what can be assumed about the nature of time.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let the individual constant 's' denote Socrates, and let Rst be interpreted as “Socrates is resting at t.” The false sentence that Socrates has always been resting would be expressed in this first-order temporal logic as

∀t(Ltn → Rst)

Here 'L' is the two-argument predicate for numerically less than that mathematicians usually write as '<'. And we see the usefulness of having the symbol 'n'.

If tense logic is developed using a Kripke semantics of possible worlds, then it is common to alter the accessibility relation between any two possible worlds by relativizing it to a time. The point is to show that some old possibilities are no longer possible. For example, a world in which Hillary Clinton becomes the first female U.S. president in 2016 was possible relative to the actual world of 2015, but not relative to the actual world of 2017. There are other complexities. Within a single world, if we are talking about a domain of people containing, say, Socrates, then we want the domain to vary with time since we want Socrates to exist at some times but not at others. Another complexity is that in any world, what event is simultaneous with what other event should be relativized to a reference frame.

Some temporal logics have a semantics that allows sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth-values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having just one of the truth-values True, or False, or Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

For an introduction to temporal logics and their formal semantics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

17. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:

  1. What Are Instants and Durations?
  2. What Is an Event?
  3. What Is a Reference Frame?
  4. What Is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What Is Spacetime?
  6. What Is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What Are Time's Metric and Spacetime's Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time Is Part of Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How Is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What Is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What Is Time Dilation?
  16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox (the Twin Paradox)?
  19. What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What Is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?
  24. What Is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What Is a Field?

b. What Else Science Requires of Time

What Else Science Requires of Time

c. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate systems, and Lorentz Transformations

Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)

18. References and Further Reading

  • Barbour, Julian. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York, 1999.
    • A popular presentation of Barbour's theory which implies that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. He then offers an exotic explanation of why time seems to exist.
  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
  • Callender, Craig. What Makes Time Special? Oxford University Press, 2017.
    • Section 1.1.4 makes the case that manifest time is universal across cultures. The entire book makes a case for how humans have the manifest image of time they do even though the B-theory is fundamental and eternalism is correct. Not written at an introductory level.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
  • Carroll, Sean. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia 2012.
    • A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues. Emphasizes the arrow of time.
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s claim to have discovered in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice. This claim has radical implications for the philosophical issue of free will.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers many of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Eagleman David. "Brain Time," What's Next? Dispatches on the Future of Science. Max Brockman, Ed., Penguin Random House. 2009.
    • A neuroscientist discusses the plasticity of time perception or temporal distortion.
  • Eagleman David. "David Eagleman on CHOICE," Oct. 4, 2011. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=MkANniH8XZE.
    • Commentary on research on subjective time.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
    • Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
  • Gibbs, W. Wayt. "Ultimate Clocks," Scientific American 2002.
    • Pushing the art of building more and more accurate clocks.
  • Gödel, Kurt. "A Remark about the Relationship between Relativity Theory and Idealistic Philosophy," in P. A. Schilpp, ed., Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, Harper & Row, New York. 1959.
    • Discussion of solutions to Einstein's equations that allow closed causal chains, that is, traveling to your past.
  • Grant, Andrew. "Time's Arrow," Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
    • Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
  • Greene, Brian. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York. 2011.
    • Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Guth, Alan. "Infinite Phase Space and the Two-Headed Arrow of Time," FQXi conference 2014 in Vieques, Puerto Rico. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=AmamlnbDX9I. 2014.
    • Guth argues that an arrow of time could evolve naturally even though it had no special initial conditions on entropy, provided the universe has an infinite available phase space in which the universe could spread out into. If so, it's maximum possible entropy is infinite, and any other state in which the universe begins will have relatively low entropy.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 14d of the present article) for truth-value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this special space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action. Horwich argues that time itself has no arrow.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousnss of Internal Time. Translated by J. B. Brough. Originally published 1893-1917. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
    • The father of phenomenology discusses internal time consciousness.
  • Ijjas, Anna and Paul J. Steinhardt and Abraham Loeb, "Pop Goes the Universe," Scientific American, pp. 32-39, February 2017.
    • Challenges the theories of the multiverse, inflation, and the classical Big Bang Theory, and promotes the Big Bounce Theory as equally plausible to the Big Bang Theory.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Kirk, G.S. & Raven, J.E. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1957.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York, 2012.
    • Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss' position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss' hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
  • Lewis, David K. "The Paradoxes of Time Travel." American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52, 1986.
    • A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Lowe, E. J., The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity and Time, Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • This Australian metaphysician defends the A-theory's tensed view of time in chapter 4, based on an ontology of substances rather than events.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • Maudlin, Tim. Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time, Princeton University Press, 2012.
    • An advanced introduction to the conceptual foundations of spacetime theory.
  • McCall, Storrs. "II. Temporal Flux," American Philosophical Quarterly, October 1966.
    • An analysis of the block universe, the flow of time, and the difference between past and future.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is past, is present, and is future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (Le Poidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Merali, Zeeya. "Theoretical Physics: The Origins of Space and Time," Nature, 28 August 2013, vol. 500, pp. 516-519.
    • Describes each of the six leading theories that compete for providing an explanation of the basic substratum from which space and time emerge.
  • Miller, Kristie. "Presentism, Eternalism, and the Growing Block," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., pp. 345-364, 2013.
    • Compares the pros and cons of competing ontologies of time.
  • Morris, Michael S., Kip S. Thorne and Ulvi Yurtsever, "Wormholes, Time Machines, and the Weak Energy Condition," Physical Review Letters, vol. 61, no. 13, 26 September 1988.
    • The first description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Muller, Richard A. NOW: The Physics of Time. W. W. Norton & Company, New York, 2016.
    • An informal presentation of the nature of time by an experimental physicist at U.C. Berkeley. Chapter 15 argues that the correlation between the arrow of time and the increase of entropy is not a causal connection. Chapter 16 discusses the competing arrows of time. Muller favors space expansion as the cause of time's arrow, with entropy not being involved. And he recommends a big bang theory in which both space and time expand, not simply space.
  • Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
  • Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot all be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that time in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses, in the sense of verb conjugations, but of course it expresses all sorts of concepts about time in other ways.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Price, Huw. Time's Arrow and Archimedes' Point Oxford University Press. (1996).
    • Price argues that entropy and the Second Law of Thermodynamics have been misunderstood.
  • Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York, 2017.
    • An informal presentation of time in the theory of loop quantum gravity.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. The Order of Time. Riverhead Books, New York, 2018.
    • An informal discussion of the nature of time by an Italian theoretical physicist. The book was originally published in Italian in 2017.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
    • Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
  • Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Savitt, Steven F. "Being and Becoming in Modern Physics." In E. N. Zala (ed.). The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • In surveying being and becoming, it suggests how the presentist and grow-past ontologies might respond to criticisms that appeal to relativity theory.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sider, Ted. Four-Dimensionalism: An Ontology of Persistence. Oxford Unviersity Press, New York, 2001.
    • Defends the ontological primacy of four-dimensional events over three-dimensional objects. He freely adopts causation as a means of explaining how a sequence of temporal parts composes a single perduring object. This feature of the causal theory of time originated with Hans Reichenbach.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
  • Slater, Hartley. "Logic is Not Mathematical," Polish Journal of Philosophy, Spring 2012, pp. 69-86.
    • Discusses, among other things, why modern symbolic logic fails to give a proper treatment of indexicality.
  • Smith, Quentin. "Problems with the New Tenseless Theories of Time," pp. 38-56 in Oaklander, L. Nathan and Smith, Quentin (eds.), The New Theory of Time, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1994.
    • Challenges the new B-theory of time promoted by Mellor and Smith.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
    • Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Wasserman, Ryan. Paradoxes of Time Travel, Oxford University Press, 2018.
    • A detailed review of much of the philosophical literature about time travel. The book contains many simple, helpful diagrams.
  • Whitrow, G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.