Arthur Prior: Logic
Arthur Norman Prior (1914-69) was a logician and philosopher from New Zealand who contributed crucially to the development of ‘non-standard’ logics, especially of the modal variety. His greatest achievement was the invention of modern temporal logic, worked out in close connection with modal logic. However, his work in logic had a much broader scope. He was also the founder of hybrid logic, and he made important contributions to deontic logic, modal logic, the theory of quantification, the nature of propositions and the history of logic. In addition, he discussed questions of ethics, free will, and general theology. Prior’s philosophical works comprise about 200 titles. His earliest articles center on philosophical theology and historical studies of Scottish Reformed Theology. This led on to the publication of his first influential work on ethics: Logic and The Basis of Ethics (1949). With the invention of tense-logic in the early 1950s, his focus shifted to investigations into the syntax of tempo-modal logic leading to his seminal Time and Modality (1957), a volume derived from his John Locke Lectures in Oxford in 1956. Furthermore Prior, together with the Irish mathematician and logician C.A. Meredith (1904-76), made important early contributions to the semantics of possible worlds. Prior’s tense-logic provided a strong conceptual framework for problems pertaining to the philosophy of time. In Time and Modality, Prior discussed the philosophical implications of Ruth Barcan’s famous formulae for tense-logic, and in the 1960s he worked on the notion of the present.
The most persistent problem running through Prior’s work is his study of the questions surrounding human freedom and divine foreknowledge, and more general philosophical problems emerging from this classical theological question. His thorough analysis of this problem, with the conceptual tools of tense-logic, received a crucial impetus from his correspondence with the young Saul Kripke, when the latter suggested the semantic tool of branching time to Prior. Prior’s development of two solutions based on branching time for the problem of future contingency, the Peircean and the Ockham solution, was most thoroughly developed in Past, Present and Future (1967), the most important work published by Prior. Characteristically for Prior’s methodological approach, the development of these two solutions were at the same time a development of two new systems of tense logic, and vice versa. One of Prior’s significant contributions to logic was his work on world propositions and instant propositions. In the course of developing these notions he also made one of the earliest formulations of hybrid logic. In Papers on Time and Tense (1968), he presented this idea in a more detailed manner in the context of his four grades of tense-logical involvement.
Table of Contents
- Life and Work
- Main Trends in Prior's Philosophical Logic
- References and Further Reading
Arthur Prior was born in Masterton, New Zealand on December 4th, 1914. He graduated in philosophy in 1937 and worked for a number of years at Canterbury University, Christchurch, from 1952 as a professor. In 1959 he was appointed professor of philosophy at Manchester University, and in 1965 he became a reader in Oxford and a fellow of Balliol College. Prior died on October 6th, 1969 in Trondheim, Norway, while on a lecture tour in Scandinavia.
Arthur Prior’s mother died a few weeks after his birth. His father was a doctor and a medical officer during the First World War, and Arthur was brought up by his aunts and grandparents. Both of his grandfathers were Methodist ministers. It is obvious that Prior’s upbringing in a Christian family formed an important background for his later works in philosophy and logic.
In 1932 Prior went to Otago University at Dunedin. He set out to study medicine, but after a short time he instead went into philosophy and psychology. In 1934 he attended Findlay’s courses on ethics and logic. Through Findlay, Prior became interested in the history of logic. His M.A. thesis was devoted to this subject.
During his first year as a Philosophy student at Otago University, Prior joined the Presbyterian denomination. He attended courses at the Presbyterian Knox Hall with a view to entering the Presbyterian ministry. This intention was never realised, but he was for many years to come a practising member of the Presbyterian community. In particular, he became a very active member of the Student Christian Movement (SCM). Major theological influences on him were Karl Barth, Emil Brunner, and to some extent Søren Kierkegaard (1940). Prior was also a socialist, and his adherence to socialism is especially prevalent in his early articles to the SCM magazine, Open Windows.
His article, "Can Religion be Discussed?", was published in 1942. At this time, Prior found himself in a crisis of belief. This is evident from a diary entry, dated March 25, 1942 (Prior 2018). What nevertheless motivated Prior to continue his theological studies despite his crisis of faith, was a conviction, that 'now' is possible for us to evaluate: That “useful knowledge would grow out of [Prior’s] collection of theological systems, in good time.” After his crisis of faith, it appears that Prior returned to a somewhat more classical Presbyterian position. As late as in 1958 he published a paper that seems to be endorsing this faith, if only vaguely, The good life and religious faith (1958).
In 1943, Arthur Prior married Mary Wilkinson. From 1943 till the end of World War Two, he served in the Royal New Zealand Air Force. In view of Nazism and the World War, Prior had given up his earlier pacifist leanings.
Prior’s first employment at Canterbury University College was in 1946. A vacancy had been made when Karl Popper left. At this time, Prior was still strongly committed to theological studies, and he was working on a book on the history and thought of Scottish (Presbyterian) Theology. Unfortunately, the Priors’ house burned down in March 1949. After the fire, in which some of his drafts perished, he gave up the project on Scottish Theology. His main intellectual interest from then on veered toward philosophy, ethics, and logic.
Prior’s first book, Logic and the Basis of Ethics, was published in 1949 by Oxford University Press. During 1950 and 1951 Prior wrote a manuscript for a book with the working title The Craft of Logic. This book was, however, never published as a whole, but in 1976 P.T. Geach and A.J.P. Kenny edited parts of it, which were published as The Doctrine of Propositions and Terms. In the first chapter of the book, "Propositions and Sentences", Prior argued that according to the ancient as well as the medieval view a proposition may be true at one time and false at another (Prior 1976a, p. 38).
In the beginning of 1953 Clarendon Press accepted The Craft of Logic for publication on the condition that Prior made a number of rather substantial changes. As a result, Prior wrote a completely different book, Formal Logic, which was published in 1955.
Benson Mates’ short article, ‘Diodorean Implication’ (1949) made Prior even more aware of the interesting relation between time and logic. Prior realised that it might be possible to relate Diodorus’ ideas to contemporary works on modality by developing a calculus which included temporal operators analogous to the operators of modal logic.
Around 1953, Prior began to work on the development of a formal calculus of tenses. Mary Prior has described the first occurrence of this idea: “I remember his waking me one night, coming and sitting on my bed, and reading a footnote from John Findlay’s article on Time, and saying he thought one could make a formalised tense logic” (Hasle, 2003). This must have been some time in 1953. The footnote in (Findlay 1941), which Prior studied that night, was the following:
And our conventions with regard to tenses are so well worked out that we have practically the materials in them for a formal calculus. The calculus of tenses should have been included in the modern development of modal logics. It includes such obvious propositions as that
x present = (x present) present;
x future = (x future) present = (x present) future;
also such comparatively recondite propositions as that
(x).(x past) future; i.e. all events, past and future will be past.
Findlay’s considerations on the relation between time and logic in this footnote were not very elaborated, but it apparently gave the final impulse to Prior’s idea of developing a formal calculus which would capture this relation in detail. From 1953 until his death in 1969 the development of tense logic was his main project. With his many articles and books on questions in tense logic he presented a very extensive and thorough corpus, which still forms the basis of tense logic as a discipline.
Prior was invited to give the ‘John Locke Lectures’ in Oxford. In 1956 the Priors went to Oxford for this purpose. This gave him an excellent opportunity to present his new findings regarding time and modality. Among the participants were John Lemmon, Ivo Thomas, and Peter Geach (Kenny 1970 p. 337). The lectures were later published as the book Time and Modality (1957a). It was this work which made Prior internationally known. In Oxford, Prior also made some important and lasting friendships and professional associations, especially with John Lemmon, Ivo Thomas, P.T. Geach, Elizabeth Anscombe, Carew Meredith, David Meredith, and C. Lejewski.
Prior had a strong belief in the value of formal logic. On the other hand, he also emphasised that logic has to do with real life. He wanted a logic that would take full advantage of formal methods, but which would also be sensitive to the reality of human experience.
Prior adopted Łukasiewicz’s so-called Polish notation, in which the conjunction is represented as . He emphasised that this prefix notation “obviates the necessity of using brackets”, so that “no special rules about bracketing and rebracketing need to be included among the rules for proving one formula from another” (1955a, p. 6). Polish notation was rather common during Prior’s lifetime. Apart from its theoretical appeal it had the significant practical advantage that proofs, among other things, could be written directly on a typewriter. Nevertheless, there is no doubt that Prior also was quite convinced about the syntactical superiority of Polish notation, for which he campaigned throughout his career as a logician.
Prior not only preferred to use Polish notion for his works within symbolic logic, in fact he highly valued various parts of Polish logic, and he corresponded with several Polish logicians. In 1961 he even went to Poland to give lecture (see 1962) and to take part in the 1961 ‘International Colloquium on Methodology of Science’, Warsaw. In particular, Prior found Łukasiewicz's three-valued logic very interesting (1920, 1930), and he carried out some careful studies of this logic (see Prior 1952).
Prior was very interested in the history of logic not only as a subject in its own right, but he also saw the works of ancient and medieval logicians as a significant contribution to the contemporary development of logic. From 1952 to 1955 he had seven articles published on the history of logic. Four of these were concerned with Medieval logic and one with Diodorean logic. His interest in the history of logic is also evident in Formal Logic. Prior was particularly interested in Aristotle, Diodorus, and the Scholastics, but his interest also extended to more recent logicians such as Boole and Peirce, the latter of which he called “the greatest of all symbolic logicians” (1957b).
After the publication of Time and Modality, Prior received a number of important and interesting letters from various logicians. One of the logicians who wrote was Saul Kripke (Ploug and Øhrstrøm 2012). In two letters to Prior in September and October 1958, Kripke put forth the idea of branching time. During the following years Prior further developed this idea.
In 1959 Arthur Prior took up a professorship at the University of Manchester. At that time, he left the Presbyterian Church without joining any other denomination. One of his main reasons (compare Hasle 2012) is most likely the tension Prior saw between the ideas of predestination and free will, although the recent discovery of Prior’s diary from his crisis of faith, gives us other reasons in addition (available in Prior 2018). Although Prior, throughout his career, continued to treasure his theological library, and to study problems related to theology (see Kenny 1970 p. 326), we find in his dairy an explicit vision for such a commitment, one that doesn’t presuppose a commitment to personal beliefs.
In the early winter of 1962, Prior was visiting professor at the University of Chicago. During this stay he made some thorough studies of parts of Charles Sanders Peirce’s logic.
From September 1965 to January 1966 Prior was a visiting Flint professor at the University of California. During his stay in California, Prior made some important professional associations, especially with Dana Scott, Donald Davidson, David Lewis, and Richard Montague. In this period Past, Present, and Future (1967)—often regard as Prior’s most important book—was drafted. Apparently, Prior’s California lectures contributed significantly to the flourishing of logic there at that time, and especially it seems to have sparked a great interest in tense logic in the USA.
The Priors stayed in Manchester for seven years. In 1966 Anthony Kenny recommended Prior for a fellowship at Balliol College. Prior was offered this position. He accepted, and the family moved to Oxford, where Prior worked until his death in 1969.
During the 1960s, Prior made some very important contributions to the understanding of the concept of time. He demonstrated that temporal logic can in fact be a very powerful tool in philosophical analysis—also in relation to many of the questions to which his earlier studies in theology and ethics had given rise. He kept his interest in theology and ethics throughout his life, and through his studies in time he managed to reignite the discussions of the relationship between God’s foreknowledge and humanity’s freedom.
Prior’s work on philosophical logic includes an analytical and modern component as well as an historical component. Nevertheless, there is no sharp distinction between Prior’s analytical and historical concerns on one hand and his work as a formal logician on the other.
The following sections concentrate on these main trends in Prior’s philosophical logic: (a) The Logic of Ethics; (b) The Syntax of Tempo-Modal Logic; (c) Human Freedom and Divine Foreknowledge; (d) Temporal Logic and Theories of Truth; (e) The Logic of Existence; and (f) Four Grades of Tense-Logical Involvement.
Prior’s first major contribution to philosophy was his work on the logic of ethics. The work culminated with the publication of Logic and the Basis of Ethics (1949), which rather quickly gained him recognition as a philosopher. The book displays Prior’s in-depth knowledge of Scottish philosophy, which forms the background of the discussion on the autonomy of ethics. In 1942, Prior had discussed this topic in “Faith, Unbelief and Evil” (available in Prior 2018), where the context is the question of whether God is a necessary foundation for morality. In Logic and the Basis of Ethics, Prior takes up the same argument, and argues that one cannot logically maintain that any foundation is better than another, with regard to ethics. G.E. Moore had criticised the deduction of ‘ought’ from ‘is’ (that is, the so-called naturalistic fallacy). He agreed with G.E. Moore, but Prior maintained that it would be a larger error to deny the autonomy of ethics (1949, p. 107).
Being a logician, Prior wanted to demonstrate that logic can be used in the study of ethics as well as in the study of nature. Prior pointed out that the logic of ethics is not a special kind of logic, nor a special branch of logic, but an application of it. (1949, p. ix) He maintained that categorical obligations must lie on particular persons at particular moments.
For Prior as for many others working with ethics, the notion of duty is rather basic. In the 1950s, G.E. Moore’s definition of ‘duty’ in Principia Ethica was very influential. In this work, Moore repeatedly affirms that our duty is that action which, of all the alternatives open to us, will have the best total consequences. In his paper, ‘The Consequences of Actions’ (2003, p. 65-72), which was originally presented at the Joint Session of the Mind Association and the Aristotelian Society at Aberystwyth in 1956, Prior argued that this definition is very problematic. In many cases it is not very clear what should be accepted as a consequence of a given act or behaviour. For this reason, it may turn out to be very difficult to find out with any certainty what our duty is, given Moore’s definition of ‘duty’.
However, Prior’s criticism of Moore’s definition goes much deeper than to an analysis of the idea of a consequence. In fact, Prior argued that there is a logical impossibility in there being such a thing as a duty in Moore’s sense. Supposing that determinism is not true, Prior considered “a number of alternative actions which we could perform on a given occasion”, and he argued that none of these actions can be said to have any “total consequences”, since “the total future state of the world depends on how these others choose as well as on how the given person chooses....” (2003, p. 65). This simply means that there is no such totality. For this reason, Prior rejects Moore’s idea of duty as being incoherent.
According to Prior, the only way out of this problem that is open for the utilitarian, involves another definition of ‘duty’. Following this alternative definition, duty is to do what will probably have the best total consequences of all the actions open to us. This solution is however somewhat problematic, conceptually speaking.
Prior’s criticism of utilitarian theory should also be seen in the light of the fact that he wanted ethics to be treated theoretically in another way, that is, in terms of deontic logic involving operators corresponding to obligation and permissibility.
The term ‘deontic logic’ had been suggested by Henrik von Wright (1951). In his Formal Logic (1955a), Prior defended von Wright’s view that the logic of obligation can be handled very much like the logic of necessity. He was, however, aware of the fact that many philosophers would resist this, and strongly insist that moral philosophy has very little to do with logical deduction. In the paper, “The Logic of Obligation and The Obligation of the Logician” (available in Prior 2018), Prior argued that although ethics cannot be deduced or derived from logic, ethical argumentation has to live up to certain formal standards, which are worth studying for their own sake.
Corresponding to the usual Aristotelian logical square for syllogisms, Prior constructed the following diagram explaining the mutual relations between some basic notions in deontic reasoning:
In his deontic logic, Prior used the operator for ‘it is permissible that (such-and-such an act be done)’. From this operator we may construct the operator ~~ corresponding to ‘it is obligatory that ’. A deontic logic can be constructed by adding the following two axioms to propositional logic:
∨ ≡ ∨
together with the rule
Prior demonstrated that in this axiomatic system it is possible to derive the following rule:
├ ~~ ⊃
├ ~ ∨
├ ~ ∨
├ ≡ ~ ∨
├ ≡ ~ ∨
[from 2 and def.]
[from 3 and propositional logic]
[from 4 and AD2]
[from 1 and propositional logic]
[from 6 and RD1]
[from 1 and 7]
RD2 means that if expresses a logical law, then it is a law that is permissible. Prior renders this more freely as ‘what I cannot but do, I am permitted to do’. This also amounts to ‘what I cannot but omit, I am permitted to omit’ and consequently also to the Kantian principle ‘what I ought, I can’. A number of other interesting theorems can be proved in Prior’s system, for instance:
(If doing what we ought commits us to doing something else, then we ought to do this something else.)
(Doing what is not permitted commits us to doing anything whatever.)
The latter example corresponds to one of the paradoxes of strict implication.
In an appendix in his Time and Modality (1957a), Prior discussed a different approach to deontic logic based on an idea from Alan Ross Anderson. According to this idea, a deontic logic can be established from modal logic by the addition of a propositional constant corresponding to the reading ‘the world will be worse off’, ‘punishment ought to follow’ or something of that sort. Given a modal propositional logic with a possibility operator, , and the propositional constant , we may define ‘permissible’ in the following way:
In accordance with this definition should be seen as an abbreviation of ~ ⊃ , where is a necessity operator defined as ~~. In short, this means that is permissible if it is possible that is the case without ‘the bad thing’ () being the case. Similarly, is forbidden if necessarily follows from it.
Using these definitions, (AD2) can be immediately derived in most modal systems. Prior demonstrates that ⊃ is equivalent to ~. Since it cannot be accepted that all possible acts are permissible, Alan Ross Anderson suggested the assumption of . In fact, he proposed the axiom
which simply states that is contingent. Prior showed that the second part of the axiom is deductively equivalent in most modal systems to AD1, that is, ⊃ . He also demonstrated that in most modal systems it is possible to derive the Kantian principle ⊃ as well as the principle ⊃ ⊃ . Furthermore, he discussed the question of validity in various systems of more complicated theorems such as ⊃ and as well as the paradoxical ~ ⊃ ⊃ .
Prior wanted to study the logical machinery involved in the theoretical derivation of obligation. He claimed that this study involves
(b) relevant general moral rules.
Prior stated his fundamental creed regarding deontic logic by claiming that “our true present obligation could be automatically inferred from (a) and (b) if complete knowledge of these were ever attainable” (1949, p. 42).
Prior wanted to present ethical argumentation as an axiomatic system. But in doing so he understood that something extra-logical has to be taken for granted. In his unpublished draft “Logical Criticisms of the Theory Identifying Duty with Self-interest” (available in Prior 2018), which he apparently wrote from a lecture on ethics in 1947, he quoted C.S. Lewis, in The Abolition of Man: “If nothing is self-evident, nothing can be proved. Similarly, if nothing is obligatory for its own sake, nothing is obligatory at all” (1943, p. 21; Prior’s emphasis). Similarly, Prior accepted the idea of an extra-logical and axiomatic foundation for ethics (deontic logic), and he rejected the idea of reducing ethics to something else.
It is evident that Prior’s long-term ambition was to incorporate the logic of ethics into a broader context of time and modality. Unfortunately, he was never able to pursue this goal in detail, but he certainly managed to establish the broader context of time and modality into which the logic of obligation has to fit.
Prior revived the medieval attempt at formulating a temporal logic for natural language. In a short but thought-provoking sketch of the history of logic with a special view to tense-logic, Prior argued that the central tenets of medieval logic with respect to time and tense can be summarised in the following way:
(ii) what is true at one time is in many cases false at another time, and vice versa. (1957a, p. 104)
Prior observed that ancient and medieval logicians took these assumptions for granted, but that they were eventually denied (or simply ignored) after the Renaissance. In fact, the waning of tense logic began with a gradual loss of interest in temporal structures, that is, it was item (i) which was first abandoned by the different schools of logic, and (ii) came to be rejected only afterwards.
Prior can be said to have realised the possibility of (re)formulating a logic based on these old assumptions. Major sources for him were Łukasiewicz’ discussion of future contingents (1920), which was inspired by Aristotle’s De Interpretatione, and the Diodorean Master Argument, which he came to study via a paper by Benson Mates on Diodorean Implication (1949).
Prior believed that the problems of future contingents can be analysed and much better understood by the use of a temporal logic which includes the operator, —“in time units it will be the case that ”. In his earliest attempt (1953) to deal with these problems, he used Łukasiewicz's three-valued logic, in which the third value, ½, was supposed to represent 'indeterminate'. He suggested that contingent statements such as the Aristotelian ‘There is a sea-fight tomorrow’ are contingent statements of the form, , are all indeterminate.
However, Prior realised that there is a serious problem with this approach. In fact, the usual truth-functional technique breaks down for these theories. For instance, if and ~ are both 'indeterminate' (½), it is very hard to explain how statements like the conjunction ~ and the disjunction ~ could come out as anything else than 'indeterminate', when treated according to Łukasiewicz's three-valued logic (Prior 1967, p. 135). He therefore decided to stick to a bivalent tense logic.
Prior’s early work on the logic of time also led to the paper Diodoran Modalities (1955c) (later spelling: ‘Diodorean’). In fact, his very first proper study in tense logic was an analysis of an ancient argument in favour of determinism, the Master Argument of Diodorus (1955b). This argument was constructed by Diodorus Cronus (ca. 340-280 B.C.), who was a philosopher of the Megarian school, and who achieved wide fame as a logician and a formulator of philosophical paradoxes (Sedley 1977). Unfortunately, only the premises and the conclusion of the Master Argument are known. We know almost nothing about the way in which Diodorus used his premises in order to reach the conclusion. It is, however, known that the Master Argument was presented as a trilemma. According to Epictetus, Diodorus argued that the following three propositions cannot all be true (Mates 1961, p. 38):
An impossible proposition cannot follow from (or after) a possible one.
There is a proposition which is possible, but which neither is true nor will be true.
Diodorus used this incompatibility combined with the plausibility of (D1) and (D2) to justify that (D3) is false. Assuming (D1) and (D2) he went on to define possibility and necessity as follows:
The necessary is that which, being true, will not be false.
The reconstruction of the Master Argument certainly constitutes a genuine problem within the history of logic. However, it should be noted that the argument has been studied for reasons other than historical. First of all, the Master Argument has been read as an argument for determinism. Second, the Master Argument can be regarded as an attempt to clarify the conceptual relations between time and modality.
Prior’s reconstruction (1967, p. 32 ff.) of the Master Argument is based on the assumption that the statements in question are in fact propositional functions whose truth-values can vary from time to time. Prior uses his tense-operators in the reconstruction:
: “it is going to be the case that ”
( ~~): “it has always been the case that ”
( ~~): “it will always be the case that ”
With these assumptions it is possible to restate the reconstruction problem. Using symbols, (D1-3) can be formulated in the following way:
where is the strict implication defined as
Prior is, however, not able to reconstruct the argument only using (D1), (D2) and (D3). In addition to these, he needs two extra premises. He must assume the theses
Prior’s proof that the three Diodorean premises (D1’, D2’, D3’) are inconsistent given (D4) and (D5) can be summarised as a reductio ad absurdum proof in the following way
[from D2, 2 & 3]
[from 5 & D4]
[from 6 & D1]
[from 7; contradicts 4]
O. Becker (1960) has shown that the extra premises (D4) and (D5) can be found in the writings of Aristotle, and he claims it seems reasonable to assume that the extra premises were generally accepted in antiquity.
During the 1950s and the 1960s, Prior developed his calculus of tenses into a rather sophisticated formalism. In 1958 he entered into correspondence with Charles Hamblin of The New South Wales University of Technology, Australia. Their correspondence led to important results, especially on implicative relations among tensed propositions. Prior and Hamblin discussed two central issues in tense logic: the number of non-equivalent tenses, and the implicative structure of the tense operators. In 1958, Hamblin suggested a set of axioms with and as monadic operators, corresponding to “a simple interpretation in terms of a two-way infinite continuous time-scale”. Hamblin’s axioms are:
Hamblin also assumed three rules of inference:
R2: If is a thesis, then is also a thesis.
R3: If is a thesis, and ’ is the result of simultaneously replacing each occurrence of in by and each occurrence of in by , then ’ is also a thesis. (’ is the so-called mirror-image of .)
When these axioms and rules are added to the usual propositional calculus, a number of interesting theorems can be proved. In fact, Hamblin could prove that “there are just 30 distinct tenses”, which can be formed using only , and negation.
In 1965, Hamblin and Prior ended up with the following implicative structure for the tense-operators, which according to Hamblin is “a bit like a bird’s nest” (Øhrstrøm and Hasle, p. 178):
This result regarding so-called linear tense-logic was that Prior published his major work, Past, Present and Future (1967), in which he also showed that several other interesting tense logical systems can be established.
Prior was highly interested in the logical relations between the two doctrines of human freedom and divine foreknowledge. His preoccupation with free will was motivated by his struggle with the theological determinism that had drawn him to the Presbyterian Church in the first place.
Prior changed his mind regarding determinism around 1950. At this time, he developed into an adherent of indeterminism, and indeed, of free will. In his own words: “ the future is to some extent, even though it is only to a very small extent, something we can make for ourselves.” (“Some Free Thinking about Time”, Prior 2018)
Prior’s logical studies increasingly led him away from what he regarded as indispensable parts of the Christian faith. His main publication on the logical problems related to the doctrines of human freedom and divine foreknowledge was the paper, Formalities of Omniscience in 1962 (reprinted in Prior 2003, p. 39-58). In this article he discussed theological determinism in terms of temporal logic, and, as pointed out by Hasker (1989), he launched the modern discussion on divine foreknowledge and human freedom. The paper examines the idea of omniscience, especially in the form of the statement “God is omniscient”, and some putative consequences of it, such as:
“It is, always has been, and always will be the case that for all , if then God knows that ”, and:
“For all , if (it is the case that) , God has always known that it would be the case that ”.
Prior discusses various interpretations of such statements, especially with reference to St. Thomas Aquinas. He argues against Thomas’ view that God’s knowledge is in some way beyond time, but otherwise he consents to most of what Thomas had said about tense-logical reasoning. According to Prior’s interpretation of Thomas’ philosophy, Thomas would even agree on the rejection of the “Diodorean” assumption, (D5).
On the basis of his studies of medieval logic, Prior developed an argument regarding the contingent future and divine foreknowledge. In this argument a new operator is needed:
: “God knows that ”
In “The Formalities of Omniscience” (2003, p. 39-58) as well as other writings, Prior presented several versions of the argument. The most interesting version can be rephrased using the following 5 principles:
(Infallibility of God’s knowledge)
(The fixity of the past)
(Basic assumption about modality)
(Principle of the excluded middle)
Here and represent arbitrary well-formed statements within the logic. If stands for some atomic statement, then is a statement about the contingent future.
Principle (P1) states that if something is going to happen, God has already known for some time that it is going to happen. According to (P2), if it was the case time units ago that God knew that would be the case time units later, then it necessarily follows that is the case now. The principle (P3) means that if was the case time units ago, then it is necessary that it was the case time units ago. (P4) is a basic assumption in modal logic, and (P5) which is about the determinateness of the future states that either is going to be the case in time units or ~ is going to be the case in time units.
The argument proceeds in two phases: first from divine foreknowledge to necessity of the future, and from that argument to the conclusion that there can be no real human freedom of choice. Formally, the argument goes as follows:
[from 1 & P1]
[from 2 & P3]
[from 3, 4, P4]
In this way it is proved that
and, similarly, it is possible to prove
The second part of the main proof is carried out in the following way:
[from 6, 7, 8]
Here (9) is conceived as a denial of the dogma of human freedom. Therefore, if one wants to save this dogma (and escape fatalism) at least one of the above principles (P1-5) has to be rejected. Prior realized that this can be obtained in several ways. He argued, however, that two of them are particularly important, that is, the denials of (P3) and (P5). The solution based in the denial of (P3) is called the Ockhamistic solution. According to this view not all propositions formulated in the past tense should be treated as statements properly about the past, and (P3) should only be accepted if is a statement about the proper past. This would rule out the use of (P3) to deduce (3) from (2), since is not a statement about the proper past.
Prior’s own position was that (P3) should in fact be accepted and (P5) should be rejected. His view on future contingents was that their truth value cannot be known now, not even by God, that is, there are no true statements about future contingents. On this view, the statement ‘There will be a sea-battle tomorrow’ cannot be true today, and the same is the case for the statement ‘There will be no sea-battle tomorrow’. Prior would maintain that both of these statements are in fact false today, and suggested the following condition of truth with respect to future statements:
nothing can be said to be truly ‘going-to-happen’ (futurum) until it is so ‘present in its causes’ as to be beyond stopping; until that happens neither ‘It will be the case that p’ nor ‘It will not be the case that p’ is strictly speaking true. (2003, p. 52)
Prior held that the proposition can only be true if it is ‘present in its causes’. The same can be said about ~. According to his view, propositions about the contingent future, are false or not well-formed. In consequence, the proposition ~ is false according to this view, if is a statement about the contingent future.
Prior believed that St. Thomas Aquinas also held these ideas. Prior pointed out that this position regarding the contingent future is also quite essential in Peirce’s philosophy. In fact, Prior called the way of answering the problems of arguments like the one presented above the Peircean solution. This view means that he had to reject ⊃ as a thesis. If is true now, but not something which had to be true (by necessity), then the Peircean solution implies that was false time units ago, for some .
According to Peter Geach, Prior regarded his own research into the logic of ordinary language constructions as a continuation of the medieval tradition (Geach 1970, p. 188). In doing so, Prior sought an account of truth for propositions in modal logic which was more in line with intensional logic. This led him to important contributions to the logic of modality. He gave the very first formulation of the answer which is now normally given, that is, the answer in terms of accessibility between possible worlds. In fact, already in 1951, he had suggested dealing with modal logic using ‘state-descriptions’ (see Copeland 1996, p. 11). A few years later he showed how tense logic can be studied using instants as state-descriptions, which are ordered by an earlier-later relation. Together with Carew Meredith, these ideas were later further developed, and they thereby led to the significant invention of possible world semantics (see Copeland 1996, p. 8 ff.). In 1956, Prior and Meredith wrote a brief joint paper entitled Interpretations of Different Modal Logics in the ‘Property Calculus’ (1956). This paper, which was circulated in mimeograph form, contained the essential elements of possible worlds semantics for propositional modal logic. It seems that Jack Copeland (2002) is right in holding that in this paper a binary relation appeared for the first time as an accessibility-like interpretation of the relation in an explicitly modal context. The authors do not suggest any philosophical explanation of the relation or of the related object. Nevertheless, there can be no doubt that they had a relation between possible worlds in mind. As Jack Copeland has pointed out, Meredith, in a letter to Prior dated 10 October 1956, in fact uses the term ‘possible world’ and Meredith and Prior in Computations and Speculations (Bodleian Library, box 8, p. 119) used the same term. Later Prior wrote:
I remember C. A. Meredith remarking in 1956 that he thought the only genuine individuals were ‘worlds’, i.e. propositions expressing total world-states, as in the opening of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus (‘The world is everything that is the case’). [2003, p. 219]
Using the idea of branching time which had been suggested by Saul Kripke in 1958, Prior showed that important differences between some of the systems can be illustrated graphically (Ploug and Øhrstrøm 2012). In fact, Prior discussed three different models of branching time. The main difference between these models has to do with the status of the future. The models fall into a small number of groups, where the basic ideas can be shown in a very intuitive way: consider once again the old Aristotelian example about the possible sea-fight tomorrow. Let us consider three ways (a, b and c below) of defining truth for statements like :
(a) The first answer is that the two possibilities, sea-fight and no sea-fight, are both part of the future, and that none of them has any superior status relative to the other. This answer can be represented graphically in the following way:
The arrows on the end of the two future branches indicate that the statements ‘There is going to be a sea-battle (tomorrow)’ and ‘There is not going to be a sea-battle (tomorrow)’ are both true in this picture of branching time. That is, if we let stand for ‘There is a sea-battle going on’, and stand for ‘There is going to be a sea-battle tomorrow’, then
is true. The corresponding tense-logical system is called Kb after Saul Kripke.
(b) Prior named the Ockham-model after William of Ockham (c. 1285-1349), who in his logic had insisted that God knows the truth-value of every future contingent statement. According to this model, only one possible future is the true one, although we as human beings do not know which of them it is. Let us assume that there is in fact going to be no sea-fight tomorrow. In this case the future should be represented graphically in the following way, where a line not ending in an arrow indicates that it will be false to assert that the corresponding state-of-affairs will be the case tomorrow:
So, ~~ is the true description of this situation, even though we may be unable to know this at the present moment (, and so forth, being defined as above).
(c) Prior named the Peirce-model after Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914). According to this model, which Prior himself adopted as covering his own view, it makes no sense to speak about the true future as one of the possible futures. There is no future yet, just a number of possibilities. Hence, the future, or perhaps rather, the ‘hypothetical future,’ should be represented graphically in this way:
Neither nor ~ are true on this picture. However, if some proposition holds tomorrow in all possible futures—that is, if the truth of tomorrow is regarded as necessary—then is true.
In order to describe the semantics for these tempo-modal systems in an more precise manner, Prior (1967, p. 126 ff.) needs a notion of temporal ‘routes’ or ‘temporal branches,’ that is, maximally ordered (that is, linear) subsets in (TIME,<). The term ‘chronicle’ is used in this article. Call the set of all such chronicles.
An Ockhamistic valuation operator, , can be defined in the structure (TIME,C,<). Given a truth-value for any propositional constant at any moment in TIME, Ock(t,c,p) can be defined recursively for any moment in any chronicle, :
~ iff not
iff ’ for some ’ with ’
iff ’ for some ’ with ’
iff ’ for all with ’.
can be read ‘ is true at in the chronicle ’. A formula is said to be Ockham-valid if and only if for any in any in a branching time structure, .
It may be doubted whether Prior’s Ockhamistic system is in fact an adequate representation of the tense logical ideas propagated by William of Ockham. According to Ockham, God knows the contingent future, so it seems that he would accept an idea of absolute truth, also when regarding a statement about the contingent future—and not only what Prior has called “prima-facie assignments” (1967, p. 126) like . That is, such a proposition can be made true ‘by fiat’ simply by constructing a concrete structure that satisfies it. But Ockham would accept that could be true at without being relativised to any chronicle.
Now, let us turn to the Peirce system. In this system the truth-operator differs from the Ockhamistic operator when it comes to the evaluation of propositions on the form . In this case the Peircean truth-operator can be defined as follows:
Prior argued that this idea is included in Peirce’s philosophy. By analysing Peirce’s way of thinking and transferring this into the modern logic of time, Prior (1967, p. 132) found that in the Peircean system the following formula must hold for any proposition :
whereas its ‘excluded middle’ analogue
does not hold in general. This is due to the fact that both assertions, and ~, can be false, if they represent a pair of statements about the contingent future. It turns out, in the Peircean system and are equivalent. It is also obvious that in this ⊃ does not hold in general.
The discussion regarding the Ockhamistic versus the Peircean system was crucial for Prior in his attempts to deal with philosophical arguments in favour of determinism. His careful analyses of these systems were, however, not his only contribution to the further development of tense-logic. In fact, he studied a number of tense-logical systems corresponding to various notions of time (for instance, dense time, circular time, discrete time). He dealt with many of his findings in the paper, Recent Advances in Tense Logic, which was published shortly after his death in 1969.
Prior was very interested in questions about time and existence. In particular, he discussed ideas of reality and quantification in the light of his temporal logic. He considered questions concerning the relation between logic and existence “the untidiest and most obscure part of tense-logic,” (1967, p. 172) and it was important to him to find solutions firmly grounded in tense-logic.
Among other things, Prior is famous for having introduced and defended the idea of presentism, that is, the position that only the present is real. In the paper The Notion of the Present, which he read at the launching of The International Society for the Study of Time in 1969, Prior offered this definition of presentism:
They [the present and the real] are one and the same concept, and the present simply is the real considered in relation to two particular species of unreality, namely the past and the future. (1970, p. 245)
The paper was published after his death based on his notes, and it has since become a well-received article among some presents. But, as pointed out by Oaklander, although philosophers such as William Lane Craig, John Bigelow and Robert Ludlow, “acknowledge their debt to Prior, [they] for one reason or another find his particular explication of presentism wanting“ (2002, p. 76-77). Prior’s definition has thus been much criticised for its rather radical implications for time and existence. Quentin Smith, himself a presentist, deems it “logically self-contradictory”:
If the real stands in relation to two particular species of the unreal, the unreal is real, since only something real can stand in relation to something. Unreality can no more stand in relation than it can possess monadic properties. (2002, p. 123)
However, as demonstrated in (Jakobsen 2011) it is evident from Prior’s notes that he struggled with formulating his definition in a satisfactory manner. It is important to emphasize that Prior was not stating that the present somehow stands in a relation to the unreal future and unreal past. It is rather that we understand what the present is, as we contrast it, in our mind, as the real to some present ideas of what isn’t real, namely ideas of the past and the future.
Prior’s ideas of presentism give rise to important questions regarding time and quantification. A key problem seems to be this: How can we quantify over future and past objects, if only the present exists? Prior considered the following example (1957a, p. 26):
(b)It will be the case that someone is flying to the moon.
There is someone who will fly to the moon.
Here Prior understands (b) as, “There is someone presently existing who is going to fly to the moon”. If stands for the future operator, the structure of (a) is : p) (that is, a quantification “within a modality”), whereas the formal structure of (b) is : Fp. The relation between statements like (a) and (b) had been studied by Ruth Barcan Marcus since 1946 in an attempt to combine modal logic with quantification theory. In particular, Ruth Barcan Marcus (1946) had studied systems in which the following formula holds:
This formula is now known as Barcan’s formula and it can be applied to all kinds of modal operators. Prior maintained that Barcan’s formula should not hold in general for the future operator. He wanted a clear logical distinction between quantification “within a modality” and quantification outside the scope of a modality.
However, Prior realised that for formal reasons it is rather difficult to keep the quantification within a modality. With just a few seemingly quite straight forward axioms of tense logic and Prior’s own general theory of quantification, Barcan’s formula for the future operator becomes provable (Jakobsen et al. 2011). As demonstrated by Philip Hugly and Charles Sayward (1996, p. 240), Prior has argued there are non-eliminable, non-substitutional, non-objectual, non-referential kinds of quantification. They have suggested that, following Prior’s ideas, quantification can be presented as “a method for constructing general sentences applicable to virtually any type or category of term” (1996, p. 265). Prior rejected the view suggested by Niko Cocchiarella according to whom it is acceptable to quantify over individual name-variables even when these names were now empty. Prior rejected the view primarily for metaphysical reasons. It seemed to him such a view would introduce a kind of waiting room from where future existents waited to be called to the scene (1957a, p. 158). According to Prior, quantification over possibilia or future existents cannot be done over individual name variables, since there aren’t any facts about them before they exist, and, if there are no facts about them, it means that they don’t exist. On the other hand, he found that it is fully acceptable to quantify over common nouns. In fact, as discussed in (Jakobsen and others 2011), he developed a so-called ε-calculus in order to deal with the logic of past and future objects.
A major challenge in dealing with non-existing objects has to do with the problem of statability. The point is that since new things have been brought into existence today, there are some statements which can be stated today, but which could not be stated yesterday. This was probably Prior’s main motivation for his proposal in 1957 of the modal system wherein it is assumed that in certain possible worlds, some propositions simply cannot occur. An example could be propositions directly concerned with individuals, which are absent from those worlds, since, according to Prior, no facts can be stated about an individual except when exists.
In 1959, Prior described the basic idea of the system with a hint to Wittgenstein, in the following way:
Nothing can be surer than that whereof we cannot speak, thereof we must be silent, though it does not follow from this that whereof we could not speak yesterday, thereof we must be silent today.
When translated into tense logical terms, the system offers an interesting example of a logical system which is, among other things, designed to solve problems associated with non-permanent or contingent existents.
It is interesting to study the problem of statability and its implications for the philosophy of time. However, it turns out to be a very difficult task to establish a tense logical formalism within which we can deal with the temporal aspects of statability in a satisfactory way (see for instance Wegener & Øhrstrøm 1997). However, the basic idea is evident when we are dealing with identifiable individuals. The very fact that individuals come into being makes it impossible for us to formulate crucial statements about such individuals in a satisfactory way before they have actually been brought into being. As Prior has pointed out, the statement, ‘It is not the case that Julius Caesar existed in 200 B.C.E.’ makes sense, but here it is important that the main verb is in the past and not in the present tense (2003, p. 92). In 200 B.C.E., a statement like ‘Julius Caesar does not exist’ would not make any sense. It was simply not statable then.
It may be argued that many future tense statements are not about particulars, but rather are about types. However, this observation certainly does not solve the problem of statability. Prior’s claim regarding non-statability is not only about the non-existence of subjects of predication. It is also a question about other parts of the vocabulary. The point is that new concepts, that is, new predicates, may arise. This means that the language of specification may be growing in a very radical manner.
Reflecting on the temporal aspects of statability, Prior (2003, p. 91) maintained that the passage of time not only means that more and more possibilities are lost. It also gives rise to new possibilities for us as new individuals come into being.
Furthermore, it should be mentioned that Prior was interested in the questions concerning identity of things over time. How can one thing at one time be the same as another thing at another time? How can a thing keep its identity over time? How can we be sure that individual things never split up into two (or more) identical individual things? Prior discussed these problems in a rather entertaining way in his, “The Fable of the Four Preachers” (available in Prior 2018). In addition, he analysed the problems formally, showing that we may easily run into serious troubles if we assume that one thing can become two things (2003, p. 96 ff.).
It was Peter Geach who sometime in the early 1960s made Prior aware of the importance and relevance of McTaggart’s distinction between the so-called A-series and B-series conceptions of time (1967, p. vi). Since then the notions and arguments in McTaggart’s paper, The Unreality of Time (1908), have become necessary ingredients of all major treatments of the philosophical problems related to temporal logic.
McTaggart’s A-series conception is based on the notions of past, present, and future, as opposed to a ‘tapestry’ view on time, as embodied by the B-series conception of time. Prior later formally elaborated McTaggart’s distinction, and showed that we can discuss time using either a tense logic, corresponding to the A-series conception, or using an earlier-later calculus, corresponding to the B-series conception. Prior’s interest in McTaggart's observations was first aroused when he realised that McTaggart had offered an argument to the effect that the B-series presupposes the A-series rather than vice versa (1967, p. 2). Prior was particularly concerned with McTaggart’s argument against the reality of tenses. Prior’s studies brought renewed fame to this argument. In consequence, it has been very important in the philosophical debate about various kinds of temporal logic and their mutual relations.
Prior rejected McTaggart’s conclusion; and he held that the temporal world should in fact be described in terms of tenses (that is, McTaggart’s A-series). In his view, the alternative description of temporality in terms of earlier-later (that is, McTaggart’s B-series) was secondary. Prior clearly considered this tense-logical view to be the fundamental one when it comes to the study of time. On the other hand, he found that the relations between the A-series and the B-series are crucial when it comes to a deeper understanding of logic and time. In his studies of the relations between the A-series and the B-series, Prior introduced four grades of ‘tense logical involvement’. (See Prior 2003, p. 119 ff.)
The first grade defines tenses entirely in terms of objective instants and an earlier-later relation. For instance, a sentence such as , ‘It will be the case that ’, is defined as a short-hand for ‘There exists some instant which is later than now, and is true at ’, and similarly for the past tense; these definitions are
Tenses, then, can be considered as mere meta-linguistic abbreviations, so this is the lowest grade of tense logical involvement. The tenses are simply seen as a handy way of summarizing the properties of the before-after relations, which constitute the B-theory. The tenses do not have any independent epistemological status. The basic idea is a definition of truth relative to temporal instants:
In addition, there may be some specified properties of the before-after relation, like, for instance, transitivity:
In this way, instants acquire an independent ontological status. As we have seen, Prior rejected the idea of temporal instants as something primitive and objective.
In the second grade of tense logical involvement, tenses are not reduced to B-series notions. Rather, they are treated on a par with the earlier-later relation. Specifically, a bare proposition is treated as a syntactically full-fledged proposition, on a par with propositions such as (‘it is true at time that ’). The point of the second grade is that a bare proposition with no explicit temporal reference is not to be viewed as an incomplete proposition. One consequence of this is that an expression such as ’ is also well-formed, and of the same type as and . Prior showed how such a system leads to a number of theses, which relate tense logic to the earlier-later calculus, and vice versa. The following crucial rule of inference makes this relation within the second grade clear:
He also stated the following basic assumptions regarding the truth-operator:
: ⊃ :
According to the second grade of tense logical involvement, A-concepts and B-concepts are regarded as being on the same conceptual level. Neither set of concepts is conditioned by the other.
It may be a bit puzzling that and can be treated as being on the same logical level, if one expects the former to belong to the logical language (or object language) and the latter to the semantics (or metalanguage). In Prior’s opinion, this is not at all surprising. In a paper on some problems of self-reference, he stated:
In other words, a language can contain its own semantics, that is to say its own theory of meaning, provided that this semantics contains the law that for any sentence , means that is true. (1976b, p. 141)
This becomes even clearer in the third grade, according to which instants are seen as a special type of proposition. These instant-propositions describe the world uniquely, and are for this reason also called world-state propositions. Like Prior, let be instant-propositions instead of . In fact, Prior assumed that such propositions are what ought to be meant by ‘instants’:
A world-state proposition in the tense-logical sense is simply an index of an instant; indeed, I would like to say that it is an instant, in the only sense in which ‘instants’ are not highly fictitious entities. (1967, p. 188-9)
The traditional distinction between the description of the content and the indication of time for an event is thereby dissolved. From the properties of the logical language which embodies the third grade of tense logical involvement, Prior also showed that can be defined in terms of a primitive necessity-operator. Then tense logic, and indeed, all of temporal logic can be developed from the purely ‘modal notions’ of past, present, future, and necessity.
This idea of treating instants as some kind of world propositions was one of Prior’s most interesting constructions. It has been taken up by Patrick Blackburn (2006), Torben Braüner (2011) and others. They have shown that Prior’s ideas can be further developed into very useful structures, which they have labelled hybrid logics.
The fourth grade consists in a tense logical definition of the necessity-operator such that the only primitive operators in the theory are the two tense logical ones: and . Prior himself favoured this fourth grade. It appears that his reasons for wanting to reduce modality to tenses were mainly metaphysical, since it has to do with his rejection of the concept of the (one) true (but still unknown) future. If one accepts the fourth grade of tense-logical involvement, it will turn out that something like the Peirce solution will be natural, and that we have to reject solutions like the Ockhamistic theory.
Prior dealt with many problems within philosophical logic, and it was very important for him to view logic as strongly related to reality. He held that logic “is not primarily about language, but about the real world” (Copeland 1996, p. 45). According to him, the tenses are essential for the understanding of reality. “I believe in the reality of the distinction between past, present, and future”, he claimed (Copeland 1996, p. 47). In fact, he held that tense logic is important not only in philosophy, but also in metaphysics and in physics. He argued that the physicist should understand that tense-logical questions ought to be taken into serious consideration in the development of relativistic physics and other parts of the natural sciences dealing with time. He claimed that in doing so the scientist and the logician may co-operate:
The logician must be rather like a lawyer—not in Toulmin’s sense, that of reasoning less rigorously than a mathematician—but in the sense that he is there to give the metaphysician, perhaps even the physicist, the tense logic that he wants, provided that it be consistent. He must tell his client what the consequences of a given choice will be and what alternatives are open to him; but I doubt whether he can, qua logician, do more (1967, p. 59).
During the last years of his life, Prior became very interested in the logical aspect of the notion of the self and in what he called ‘Egocentric Logic’. In fact, he was preparing the book Worlds, Times, and Selves, which Kit Fine finished after Prior’s death and published in 1976. A significant formal part of this work consists in developing the egocentric counterpart to ordinary tense or modal logic, whose crucial feature is the operator “that picks out those propositions that correspond to instants, worlds or selves, as the case may be” (1977, p. 8).
Prior’s most important achievement was his establishment of temporal logic as a research field within philosophical logic. He initiated a number of interesting studies within this new field, and he clearly demonstrated that temporal logic can be understood as having fundamental relations to essential problems in philosophy, theology and science (see e.g. Hasle et al. 2017).
This article is an elaboration and an update of Øhrstrøm, P. & Hasle, P.:“A.N. Prior’s Logic”. In Gabbay, D.; Woods, J. (Editors): Logic and the Modalities in the Twentieth Century. The Handbook of the History of Logic, Elsevier, Vol. 6, Chapter 5, pp. 323-71.
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Department of Communication and Psychology Aalborg University
Per Frederik Vilhelm Hasle
Department of Information Studies University of Copenhagen
Department of Communication and Psychology Aalborg University