The New Atheists
The New Atheists are authors of early twenty-first century books promoting atheism. These authors include Sam Harris, Richard Dawkins, Daniel Dennett, and Christopher Hitchens. The “New Atheist” label for these critics of religion and religious belief emerged out of journalistic commentary on the contents and impacts of their books. A standard observation is that New Atheist authors exhibit an unusually high level of confidence in their views. Reviewers have noted that these authors tend to be motivated by a sense of moral concern and even outrage about the effects of religious beliefs on the global scene. It is difficult to identify anything philosophically unprecedented in their positions and arguments, but the New Atheists have provoked considerable controversy with their body of work.
In spite of their different approaches and occupations (only Dennett is a professional philosopher), the New Atheists tend to share a general set of assumptions and viewpoints. These positions constitute the background theoretical framework that is known as the New Atheism. The framework has a metaphysical component, an epistemological component, and an ethical component. Regarding the metaphysical component, the New Atheist authors share the central belief that there is no supernatural or divine reality of any kind. The epistemological component is their common claim that religious belief is irrational. The moral component is the assumption that there is a universal and objective secular moral standard. This moral component sets them apart from other prominent historical atheists such as Nietzsche and Sartre, and it plays a pivotal role in their arguments because it is used to conclude that religion is bad in various ways, although Dennett is more reserved than the other three.
The New Atheists make substantial use of the natural sciences in both their criticisms of theistic belief and in their proposed explanations of its origin and evolution. They draw on science for recommended alternatives to religion. They believe empirical science is the only (or at least the best) basis for genuine knowledge of the world, and they insist that a belief can be epistemically justified only if it is based on adequate evidence. Their conclusion is that science fails to show that there is a God and even supports the claim that such a being probably does not exist. What science will show about religious belief, they claim, is that this belief can be explained as a product of biological evolution. Moreover, they think that it is possible to live a satisfying non-religious life on the basis of secular morals and scientific discoveries.
Table of Contents
- Faith and Reason
- Arguments for and against God’s Existence
- Evolution and Religious Belief
- The Moral Evaluation of Religion
- Secular Morality
- Alleged Divine Revelations
- Secular Fulfillment
- Criticism of the New Atheists
- References and Further Reading
Though it is difficult to find a careful and precise definition of “faith” in the writings of the New Atheists, it is possible to glean a general characterization of this cognitive attitude from various things they say about it. In The Selfish Gene, Richard Dawkins states that faith is blind trust without evidence and even against the evidence. He follows up in The God Delusion with the claim that faith is an evil because it does not require justification and does not tolerate argument. Whereas the former categorization suggests that Dawkins thinks that faith is necessarily non-rational or even irrational, the latter description seems to imply that faith is merely contingently at odds with rationality. Harris’s articulation of the nature of faith is closer to Dawkins’ earlier view. He says that religious faith is unjustified belief in matters of ultimate concern. According to Harris, faith is the permission religious people give one another to believe things strongly without evidence. Hitchens says that religious faith is ultimately grounded in wishful thinking. For his part, Dennett implies that belief in God cannot be reasonable because the concept of God is too radically indeterminate for the sentence “God exists” to express a genuine proposition. Given this, Dennett questions whether any of the people who claim to believe in God actually do believe God exists. He thinks it more likely that they merely profess belief in God or “believe in belief” in God (they believe belief in God is or would be a good thing). According to this view there can be no theistic belief that is also reasonable or rational.
The New Atheists appeal to the deliverances of the empirical sciences as their criterion for rational religious belief. Harris and Dawkins are quite explicit about this. Harris equates a genuinely rational approach to spiritual and ethical questions with a scientific approach to these sorts of questions. Dawkins insists that the presence or absence of a creative super-intelligence is a scientific question. The New Atheists also affirm evidentialism, the claim that a belief can be epistemically justified only if it is based on adequate evidence. The combination of their reliance on science and their adherence to evidentialism entails that a religious belief can be justified only if it is based on adequate scientific evidence. The New Atheists’ conclusion that belief in God is unjustified follows, then, from their addition of the claim that there is inadequate scientific evidence for God’s existence (and even adequate scientific evidence for God’s non-existence). Dawkins argues that the “God Hypothesis,” the claim that there exists a superhuman, supernatural intelligence who deliberately designed and created the universe, is “founded on local traditions of private revelation rather than evidence” (2006, pp. 31-32).
The New Atheists are not philosophers of religion, and none of them addresses either theistic or atheistic arguments to any great extent. Dawkins does devote a chapter apiece to each of these tasks in the process of making a case for his claim that there almost certainly is no God. Harris, who thinks that atheism is obviously true, does not dedicate much space to a discussion of arguments for or against theism. He does sketch a brief version of the cosmological argument for God’s existence but asserts that the final conclusion does not follow because the argument does not rule out alternative possibilities for the universe’s existence. Harris also hints at reasons to deny God’s existence by pointing to unexplained evil and “unintelligent design” in the world. Hitchens includes chapters entitled “The Metaphysical Claims of Religion are False” and “Arguments from Design,” but his more journalistic treatment of the cases for and against God’s existence amounts primarily to the claim that the God hypothesis is unnecessary, since science can now explain what theism was formerly thought to be required to explain, including phenomena such as the appearance of design in the universe. After considering the standard arguments for God’s existence and rehearsing standard objections to them, Dennett argues that the concept of God is insufficiently determinate for it to be possible to know what proposition is at issue in the debate over God’s existence.
Dawkins’ argument for the probable non-existence of God is the most explicit and thorough attempt at an atheistic argument amongst the four. Dawkins labels his argument for God’s non-existence “the Ultimate Boeing 747 gambit,” because he thinks that God’s existence is at least as improbable as the chance that a hurricane, sweeping through a scrap yard, would have the luck to assemble a Boeing 747 (an image that he borrows from Fred Hoyle, who used it for a different purpose). At the heart of his argument is the claim that any God capable of designing a universe must be a supremely complex and improbable entity who needs an even bigger explanation than the one the existence of such a God is supposed to provide. Dawkins also says that the hypothesis that an intelligent designer created the universe is self-defeating. What he appears to mean by this charge is that this intelligent design hypothesis claims to provide an ultimate explanation for all existing improbable complexity and yet cannot provide an explanation of its own improbable complexity. Dawkins further states that the God hypothesis creates a vicious regress rather than terminating one. Similarly, Harris follows Dawkins’ in arguing that the notion of a creator God leads to an infinite regress because such a being would have to have been created.
The New Atheists observe that if there is no supernatural reality, then religion and religious belief must have purely natural explanations. They agree that these sociological and psychological phenomena are rooted in biology. Harris summarizes their view by saying that as a biological phenomenon, religion is the product of cognitive processes that have deep roots in our evolutionary past. Dawkins endorses the general hypothesis that religion and religious belief are byproducts (what some evolutionary biologists call “spandrels”) of something else that has survival value. His specific hypothesis is that human beings have acquired religious beliefs because there is a selective advantage to child brains that possess the rule of thumb to believe, without question, whatever familiar adults tell them. Dawkins speculates that this cognitive disposition, which tends to help inexperienced children to avoid harm, also tends to make them susceptible to acquiring their elders’ irrational and harmful religious beliefs. Dawkins is less committed to this specific hypothesis than he is to the general hypothesis, and he is open to other specific hypotheses of the same kind. Dennett discusses a number of these specific hypotheses more thoroughly in his attempt to “break the spell” he identifies as the taboo against a thorough scientific investigation of religion as one natural phenomenon among many.
At the foundation of Dennett’s “proto-theory” about the origin of religion and religious belief is his appeal to the evolution in humans (and other animals) of a “hyperactive agent detection device” (HADD), which is the disposition to attribute agency—beliefs and desires and other mental states—to anything complicated that moves. Dennett adds that when an event is sufficiently puzzling, our “weakness for certain sorts of memorable combos” cooperates with our HADD to constitute “a kind of fiction-generating contraption” that hypothesizes the existence of invisible and even supernatural agents (2006, pp. 119-120). Dennett goes on to engage in a relatively extensive speculation about how religion and religious belief evolved from these purely natural beginnings. In doing so, he employs the concept of a “culturally based replicator,” which Dawkins had previously labeled a “meme” (on analogy with “gene,” which refers to biologically based replicators). Though Hitchens mentions Dennett’s naturalistic approach to religion in his chapter on “religion’s corrupt beginnings,” he focuses primarily on the interplay between a pervasive gullibility he takes to be characteristic of human beings and the exploitation of this credulity that he attributes to the founders of religions and religious movements. The scientific investigation of religion of the sort Dennett recommends has prompted a larger interdisciplinary conversation that includes both theists and non-theists with academic specialties in science, philosophy, and theology (see Schloss and Murray 2009 for an important example of this sort of collaboration).
The New Atheists agree that, while religion may have been a byproduct of certain human qualities that proved important for survival, religion itself is not necessarily a beneficial social and cultural phenomenon on balance at present. Indeed, three of the New Atheists (Harris, Dawkins, and Hitchens) are quite explicit in their moral condemnation of religious people on the ground that religious beliefs and practices have had significant and predominately negative consequences. The examples they provide of such objectionable behaviors range from the uncontroversial (suicide bombings, the Inquisition, “religious” wars, witch hunts, homophobia, etc.) to the controversial (prohibition of “victimless crimes” such as drug use and prostitution, criminalization of abortion and euthanasia, “child abuse” due to identification of children as members of their parents’ religious communities, etc.). Harris is explicit about placing the blame for these evils on faith, defined as unfounded belief. He argues that faith in what religious believers take to be God’s will as revealed in God’s book inevitably leads to immoral behaviors of these sorts. In this way, the New Atheists link their epistemological critique of religious belief with their moral criticism of religion.
The New Atheists counter the claim that religion makes people good by listing numerous examples of the preceding sort in which religion allegedly makes people bad. They also anticipate the reply that the moral consequences of atheism are worse than those of theism. A typical case for this claim appeals to the atrocities perpetrated by people like Hitler and Stalin. The New Atheists reply that Hitler was not necessarily an atheist because he claimed to be a Christian and that these regimes were evil because they were influenced by religion or were like a religion and that, even if their leaders were atheists (as in the case of Stalin), their crimes against humanity were not caused by their atheism because they were not carried out in the name of atheism. The New Atheists seem to be generally agreed that theistic belief has generally worse attitudinal and behavioral moral consequences than atheistic belief. Dennett is characteristically more hesitant to draw firm conclusions along these lines until further empirical investigation is undertaken.
These moral objections to religion presuppose a moral standard. Since the New Atheists have denied the existence of any supernatural reality, this moral standard has to have a purely natural and secular basis. Many non-theists have located the natural basis for morality in human convention, a move that leads naturally to ethical relativism. But the New Atheists either explicitly reject ethical relativism, or affirm the existence of the “transcendent value” of justice, or assert that there is a consensus about what we consider right and wrong, or simply engage in a moral critique of religion that implicitly presupposes a universal moral standard.
The New Atheists’ appeal to a universal secular moral standard raises some interesting philosophical questions. First, what is the content of morality? Harris comes closest to providing an explicit answer to that question in stating that questions of right and wrong are really questions about the happiness and suffering of sentient creatures. Second, if the content of morality is not made accessible to human beings by means of a revelation of God’s will, then how do humans know what the one moral standard is? The New Atheists seem to be agreed that we have foundational moral knowledge. Harris calls the source of this basic moral knowledge “moral intuition.” Since the other New Atheists don’t argue for the moral principles to which they appeal, it seems reasonable to conclude that they would agree with Harris. Third, what is the ontological ground of the universal moral standard? Given the assumption that ethical relativism is false, the question arises concerning what the objective natural ground is that makes it the case that some people are virtuous and some are not and that some behaviors are morally right and some are not. Again, Harris’s view that our ethical intuitions have their roots in biology is representative. Dawkins provides “four good Darwinian reasons” that purport to explain why some animals (including, of course human beings) engage in moral behavior. And though Dennett’s focus is on the evolution of religion, he is likely to have a similar story about the evolution of morality. The fourth philosophical question raised by the New Atheists is one they address themselves: “Why should we be moral?” Harris’s answer is that being moral tends to contribute to one’s happiness. Dawkins replies to the critic who asks, “If there’s no God, why be good?” by questioning the necessity, desirability, and efficacy of a desire for divine approval as a motivator for moral behavior.
If there is no divine being, then there are no divine revelations. If there are no divine revelations, then every sacred book is a merely human book. Harris, Dawkins, and Hitchens each construct a case for the claim that no alleged written divine revelation could have a divine origin. Their arguments for this conclusion focus on what they take to be the moral deficiencies and factual errors of these books. Harris quotes passages from the part of the Old Testament traditionally labeled the “Law” that he considers barbaric (such as the command in Deuteronomy 13 to stone family members or close friends to death if they “secretly entice you” to “go worship other gods”) and then asserts (on the basis of his view that Jesus can be read to endorse the entirety of Old Testament law) that the New Testament does not improve on these injunctions. He says that any subsequent more moderate Christian migration away from these biblical legal requirements is a result of taking scripture less and less seriously. Dawkins agrees with Harris that the God of the Bible and the Qur’an is not a moderate. As a matter of fact, he says, “The God of the Old Testament is arguably the most unpleasant character in all of fiction” (Dawkins 2006, p. 31). Though he says that “Jesus is a huge improvement over the cruel ogre of the Old Testament” (Dawkins 2006, p. 25), he argues that the doctrine of atonement, “which lies at the heart of New Testament theology, is almost as morally obnoxious as the story of Abraham setting out to barbecue Isaac” (Dawkins 2006, p. 251). Hitchens adds his own similar criticisms of both testaments in two chapters: “The Nightmare of the ‘Old’ Testament” and “The ‘New’ Testament Exceeds the Evil of the ‘Old’ One.” He also devotes a chapter to the Qur’an (as does Harris) and a section to the Book of Mormon. Dennett hints at a different objection to the Bible by remarking that anybody can quote the Bible to prove anything.
This collective case against the authenticity of any alleged written divine revelation raises interesting questions in philosophical theology about what kind of book could qualify as “God’s Word.” For instance, Harris considers it astonishing that a book as “ordinary” as the Bible is nonetheless thought to be a product of omniscience. He also says that, whereas the Bible contains no formal discussion of mathematics and some obvious mathematical errors (he takes I Kings 7:23-26 to state that the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter— π—is 3:1), a book written by an omniscient being could contain a chapter on mathematics that would still be the richest source of mathematical insight humanity has ever known. This sort of claim invites further discussion about the sorts of purposes God would have and strategies God would employ in communicating with human beings in different times and places.
Each of the New Atheists recommends or at least alludes to a non-religious means of personal fulfillment and even collective well-being. Harris advocates a “spirituality” that involves meditation leading to happiness through an eradication of one’s sense of self. He thinks that scientific exploration into the nature of human consciousness will provide a progressively more adequate natural and rational basis for such a practice. For inspiration in a Godless world, Dawkins looks to the power of science to open the mind and satisfy the psyche. He celebrates the liberation of human beings from ignorance due to the growing and assumedly limitless capacity of science to explain the universe and everything in it. Hitchens hints at his own source of secular satisfaction by claiming that the natural is wondrous enough for anyone. He expresses his hope for a renewed Enlightenment focused on human beings, based on unrestricted scientific inquiry, and eventually productive of a new humane civilization. Dennett believes that a purely naturalistic spirituality is possible through a selfless attitude characterized by humble curiosity about the world’s complexities resulting in a realization of the relative unimportance of one’s personal preoccupations.
A number of essays and books have been written in response to the New Atheists (see the “Works about the New Atheism” sub-section of the “References and Further Reading” section below for some titles). Some of these works are supportive of them and some of them are critical. Other works include both positive and negative evaluations of the New Atheism. Clearly, the range of philosophical issues raised by the New Atheists’ claims and arguments is broad. As might be expected, attention has been focused on their epistemological views, their metaphysical assumptions, and their axiological positions. Their presuppositions should also prompt more discussion in the fields of philosophical theology, philosophy of science, philosophical hermeneutics, the relation between science and religion, and historiography. Conversations about the New Atheists’ stances and rationales have also taken place in the form of debates between Harris, Dawkins, Hitchens, and Dennett and defenders of religious belief and religion such as Dinesh D’Souza, who has published his own defense of Christianity in response to the New Atheists’ arguments. These debates are accessible in a number of places on the Internet. Finally, the challenges to religion posed by the New Atheists have also prompted a number of seminars and conferences. One of these is a conference presented by the Center for Philosophy of Religion at the University of Notre Dame, entitled, “My Ways are not Your Ways: The Character of the God of the Hebrew Bible” (held September 10-12, 2009). For an introduction to the sorts of issues this conference addresses, see Copan 2008.
Criticisms have been raised about a number of the New Atheists claims mentioned above. With respect to epistemology, critics point out that the New Atheist assumption that religious faith is irrational is at odds with a long philosophical history in the West that often characterizes faith as rational. This Western Philosophical tradition can be said to begin with Augustine and to include a number of prominent Western philosophers up to the present (including Anselm, Aquinas, Descartes, Pascal, and more recently, Alvin Plantinga and Richard Swinburne). Moreover, given the New Atheist epistemological assumptions (and their consequences for religious epistemology), some criticism of their views has included questions about whether their reliance on empirical science is scientifically justified and whether there is adequate evidence to support their thesis of evidentialism. As for metaphysics, Dawkins has been criticized for engaging in an overly cursory evaluation of theistic arguments and for ignoring the philosophical literature in natural theology. Some critics, like William Lane Craig, reply that, at best, Dawkins’ argument could show only that the God hypothesis does not explain the appearance of design in the universe but could not demonstrate that God probably doesn’t exist. Critics allege that Dawkins’ assumption that God would need an external cause flies in the face of the longstanding theological assumption that God is a perfect and so necessary being who is consequently self-existent and ontologically independent. Critics also maintain that Dawkins owes the defender of this classical conception of God further clarification of the kind of complexity he attributes to God and further arguments for the claims that God possesses this kind of complexity and that God’s being complex in this way is incompatible with God’s being self-existent. In reply to Dawkins, Craig argues that though the contents of God’s mind may be complex, God’s mind itself is simple. Finally, as regards ethics, critics argue that a problem with the New Atheists biological answer to the philosophical question concerning the ontological ground of the universal moral standard is that it could only explain what causes moral behavior; it can’t also account for what makes moral principles true. And critics contend that the New Atheists’ answer to the question, “Why be moral?” could only show that belief in God is not needed to motivate people to be moral; it doesn’t explain what does (or should) motivate atheists to be moral.
- Dawkins, Richard. The Selfish Gene, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989).
- An explanation and defense of biological evolution by natural selection that focuses on the gene.
- Dawkins, Richard. The God Delusion (Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 2006).
- A case for the irrationality and immoral consequences of religious belief that draws primarily on evolutionary biology.
- Dennett, Daniel. Breaking the Spell: Religion as a Natural Phenomenon (New York: Penguin, 2006).
- A case for studying the history and practice of religion by means of the natural sciences.
- Dennett, Daniel. “Afterword” in Richard Dawkins, The God Delusion, 10th anniversary edition (London: Penguin Random House, 2016), pp. 421-26.
- Dennett’s retrospective about the impact made by the four original New Atheists following the initial publication of their books.
- Harris, Sam. The End of Faith: Religion, Terror, and the Future of Reason (New York: Norton, 2004).
- An intellectual and moral critique of faith-based religions that recommends their replacement by science-based spirituality.
- Harris, Sam. Letter to a Christian Nation (New York: Vintage Books, 2008).
- A revised edition of his 2006 response to Christian reactions to his 2004 book.
- Hitchens, Christopher. God is Not Great: How Religion Poisons Everything (New York: Twelve, 2007).
- A journalistic case against religion and religious belief.
- Berlinski, David. The Devil’s Delusion: Atheism and its Scientific Pretensions (New York: Crown Forum, 2008).
- A response to the New Atheists by a secular Jew that defends traditional religious thought.
- Copan, Paul. “Is Yahweh a Moral Monster? The New Atheists and Old Testament Ethics,” Philosophia Christi 10:1, 2008, pp. 7-37.
- A defense of the God and ethics of the Old Testament against the New Atheists’ criticisms of them.
- Copan, Paul and William Lane Craig, eds. Contending with Christianity’s Critics (Nashville, Tenn.: Broadman and Holman, 2009).
- A collection of essays by Christian apologists that addresses challenges from New Atheists and other contemporary critics of Christianity.
- Craig, William Lane, ed. God is Great, God is Good: Why Believing in God is Reasonable and Responsible (Grand Rapids: InterVarsity Press, 2009).
- A collection of essays by philosophers and theologians defending the rationality of theistic belief from the attacks of the New Atheists and others.
- D’Souza, Dinesh. What’s So Great About Christianity (Carol Stream, IL: Tyndale House Publishers, 2007).
- A defense of Christianity against the criticisms of the New Atheists.
- Eagleton, Terry. Reason, Faith, and Revolution: Reflections on the God Debate (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2009).
- A critical reply to Dawkins and Hitchens (“Ditchkins”) by a Marxist literary critic.
- Keller, Timothy. The Reason for God: Belief in God in an Age of Skepticism (New York: Dutton, 2007).
- A Christian minister’s reply to objections against Christianity of the sort raised by the New Atheists together with his positive case for Christianity.
- McGrath, Alister and Joanna Collicutt McGrath. The Dawkins Delusion? Atheist Fundamentalism and the Denial of the Divine (Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2007).
- A critical engagement with the arguments set out in Dawkins 2006.
- Ruse, Michael. “Why I think the New Atheists are a Bloody Disaster,” https://biologos.org/blogs/archive/why-i-think-the-new-atheists-are-a-bloody-disaster, posted August 14th, 2009.
- A criticism of the New Atheists by an atheist.
- Schloss, Jeffrey and Michael Murray, eds. The Believing Primate: Scientific, Philosophical, and Theological Reflections on the Origin of Religion (New York: Oxford University Press, 2009).
- An interdisciplinary discussion of issues raised by the sort of naturalistic account of religion promoted in Dennett 2006 and elsewhere.
- Stenger, Victor. God: The Failed Hypothesis. How Science Shows that God does not Exist (Amherst: Prometheus Books, 2008).
- A scientific case against the existence of God by a physicist who also taught philosophy and who is often classified as a New Atheist.
- Stenger, Victor. The New Atheism: Taking a Stand for Science and Reason (Amherst: Prometheus Books, 2009).
- A review of and expansion upon the principles of the New Atheism with responses to many of its critics.
- Ward, Keith. Is Religion Dangerous? (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2006).
- A defense of religion against the New Atheists’ arguments by a philosopher-theologian.
James E. Taylor
U. S. A.