Ancient Ethics

Ethical reflection in ancient Greece and Rome starts from all of an agent’s ends or goals and tries to systematize them. Our ends are diverse. We typically want, among other things, material comfort, health, respect from peers and love from friends and family, successful children, healthy emotional lives, and intellectual achievement. We see all these things as good for us. So, systematizing our ends involves considering how various goods that we have or seek fit together. In particular, it involves thinking about what makes life good overall—what a happy human life consists in. In ancient ethical theory, then, the core question is: how can I live well? That is, how can I flourish and live a happy life? To a first approximation, happiness consists in having good things, but this formula must be read liberally. The most important goods in life may be activities or experiences, not things that one has in a quite narrow sense. If so, then happiness—having good things—centrally involves the relevant activities or experiences.

Rational reflection on these questions is not just an odd intellectual pursuit unconnected from living life well. Rather, the ancients agree that practical intelligence or wisdom—some sort of understanding of how our ends and goals fit together—is central to living well. We must grasp which ends subserve others (instrumentally or constitutively), which ends are important to our lives as a whole and which are not, and which ends we should reconceive, restrain, abandon altogether, or newly introduce because of how they fit (or fail to fit) with others. We can then guide our lives intelligently, better achieve our ends, and so live well and be happy. This ability to guide our lives intelligently is itself good for us. In fact, it can seem good in a different way from the other ends it governs. Other goods are bad in special circumstances and can be misused. For example, strength is bad when a tyrant conscripts the able-bodied to fight in an unjust war, and it can also be used to bully others. Practical intelligence is always good and cannot be misused; it is unconditionally good for the agent. Since happiness consists in having good things, in a suitably broad sense, and since practical intelligence is a preeminent good, living well centrally involves having and exercising practical intelligence.

This introduces another main feature of ancient ethics: it gives a central role to human excellence or virtue. Practical intelligence—a systematic, coherent grasp of all the goods in a life—is a virtue. Clearly, such a virtue, which amounts to expertise at living, plays a crucial role in living well (as expertise in any domain plays a crucial role in good performance in that domain). So this virtue, at least, is necessary for happiness. By reflecting on how practical intelligence connects to other virtues, we can see why ancient ethical theories say that virtue more generally is necessary, or even necessary and sufficient, for happiness.

Table of Contents

  1. Plato
  2. Aristotle
  3. Stoicism
  4. Academic Skepticism
  5. Epicureanism
  6. Pyrrhonism
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Works

1. Plato

Plato says that happiness is the possession, or the possession and correct use, of goods. Correlatively, misery is the possession of bads, or the possession and incorrect use of goods. If we ask why anyone does what she does, and reach the point of showing how her action fits into a happy life, we have fully explained and justified her action; no further question about why she wants to be happy and live well is apt. Put another way, we do everything for the sake of happiness, and we need nothing beyond happiness. Wisdom is both our highest good and the ability to use other goods well and beneficially. So, wisdom should be the first concern of anyone who wants to live well and be happy—that is, everyone. In particular, wisdom is more important than bodily and reputational goods such as health and honors. But as the condition that enables skillful activity in any domain is expertise in that domain, so too the state that enables skillful activity with goods is expertise concerning goods. So, wisdom—the highest human good—is knowledge of the good.

However, a problem lurks. If wisdom is the good for a human being, and the highest good for a human being is knowledge of the good, then wisdom seems to be knowledge of itself. This is unintelligible, and even if it were intelligible, it sounds useless. So, Plato introduces the form of the Good, distinct from other goods (including the highest human good) as the proper object of wisdom. The form of the Good is good without qualification—it is not merely the good of this or that sort of thing; it is what goodness is, in relation to which other goods are (qualifiedly) good. This gives a formal characterization of the Good; more substantively, the Good is unity. So, each thing is good when it is unified; civic unity is the highest good of a city, and psychological unity the highest good of a soul. That is, the soul achieves its highest good by putting its ends and attitudes into a coherent structure. This happens by coming to know the Good; when someone grasps that, she becomes like the object of her knowledge—the Good is unity, and knowing the Good unifies the soul. This identification of the Good with unity is one reason why Plato thinks that mathematics prepares the way for ethical knowledge.

That covers wisdom and its primary object, but what about other virtues? Plato sometimes says that all the virtues simply are wisdom—for example, that wisdom enables one to rule one’s pleasures and appetites (so that temperance is wisdom) and fears (so that courage is wisdom). On this view, there is only one virtue with several names. Elsewhere, he offers a somewhat weaker view: there are several virtues, but having one requires having them all. Even the weaker view provokes surprise; common sense says one can be, for example, just but not temperate, or wise but not courageous. Both versions of the claim that virtue is unified are grounded partly in the claim that affective states represent their objects as good or bad. For example, when someone fears heights on some occasion, she fears the harms of falling—fear represents something as bad for the subject. But wisdom systematically grasps what is really good and bad for us. So, the wise person never harbors any false belief about what is really good or bad for her. Hence, she fears things only to the extent that they really are bad for her—neither more nor less. That is, she is courageous, rather than cowardly or rash. Some things that the wise person knows are not bad may still appear bad to her, though, just as perceptual illusions persist even for those who do not trust in them.

Justice is a particularly important case; two of Plato’s longest works defend the claim that justice is unconditionally good for its possessor. The Gorgias says justice is organization, so a just soul is an organized soul; the Republic says justice is the condition in which each does its own work, so a just soul is one in which each part of the soul does its own work. As with the other virtues, justice is closely connected to wisdom. Again, wisdom is knowledge of the good; it is a systematic and coherent grasp of the relationships among all the goods one seeks. So, wisdom organizes the soul, and the wise person will be just. Because justice is so closely tied to wisdom, it is unsurprising that, like wisdom, it is unconditionally good for the agent. Thus, acting unjustly for the sake of mere conditional goods (for example, wealth or political power) is never prudent. For example, one cannot betray a friend and still have an organized soul; such actions reveal deep ignorance of what goods are most important and make life go well. Some scholars have worried that one could perhaps betray friends and still have an organized soul. Addressing this concern requires reflecting on whether loyalty to friends is actually more important than wealth. If it is, then someone with an organized soul will track this fact, and will never betray friends for the sake of wealth. And if having an organized soul is unconditionally good, then betraying friends for the sake of wealth is never prudent.

As we have seen, Plato thinks virtue is closely related to happiness. In particular, virtue is necessary for happiness—the vicious are not happy, but miserable. But we have not yet seen whether he thinks virtue suffices for happiness, or what else might conduce to happiness. Two important commitments in this regard—which Plato never explicitly thematizes, but regularly assumes—are that virtue and happiness (and vice and misery) come in degrees. Because virtue is the central determinant of happiness, it seems clear that as one becomes more virtuous, one becomes happier. One might take virtue to be the sole determinant of one’s degree of happiness. But in fact, Plato thinks that goods and bads other than virtue and vice—conditional goods such as wealth and honors—are relevant to how happy one is. These have opposite effects on the virtuous and vicious. Somebody with a certain degree of virtue, but with more conditional goods, is happier than somebody with the same degree of virtue but without those goods, or with correlative conditional bads. Somebody with a certain degree of vice, but with more conditional goods, is more miserable than somebody with the same degree of vice but without those goods, or with correlative conditional bads.

The reason for this is that conditional goods enable one to exercise one’s character more widely, while conditional bads prevent one from exercising one’s character as widely. Conditional goods thus allow a virtuous person to exercise her virtue more widely and a vicious person to exercise her vice more widely—they allow virtuous and vicious people to perform more virtuous and more vicious actions, making them happier and more miserable, respectively. Conditional bads keep virtuous and vicious people from performing actions that express their virtue or vice as fully, which makes them less happy and less miserable, respectively. Plato may think that these activities affect our happiness or misery directly, or he may think that their influence on our happiness is fully mediated by how they further shape our characters; he never commits himself one way or the other.

Plato thinks the highest human good is systematic knowledge of the Good (unity) together with the virtues identical to or entailed by that knowledge. Naturally, he rejects competing candidates for the highest human good, such as pleasure, love and friendship, and artistic achievement. In each case, he says how these other plausible candidates relate to his view.

The main alternative way of trying to unify our ends is hedonism, the view that the good—which we do everything for the sake of and which is all we need—is pleasure. Plato argues against hedonism in two main ways: (i) pleasure and pain occur together and cease together in the same place at the same time, as opposites like good and bad do not; (ii) pleasure is a process of restoration culminating in a good, harmonious condition, so pleasure cannot be the same as the good, harmonious condition it culminates in. These points are related: since pain is the felt disturbance of a good, harmonious condition, and pleasure the felt restoration to a good, harmonious condition, pleasure and pain (for example, pains of hunger and pleasures of eating) often occur together and cease together. This observation also allows Plato to argue that the virtuous live most pleasantly (although their pleasures do not make them happy). Because most bodily and reputational pleasures coincide with contrasting pains, they seem more intense than they are. (Compare how colors seem more intense against a contrasting background.) In fact, though, the pleasures associated with virtue and knowledge are larger than bodily and reputational pleasures—or so Plato argues.

Plato takes a similar line on love, friendship, and art: he denies that any of these provide the principles around which one can successfully organize one’s ends and live well, but he recognizes that they play important roles in such a life. When two people love each other and are friends, we can ask about the basis of their friendship. Any old relationship does not make life go well, and relationships directed at some objects can actually keep us from living well. So, we must say what love and friendship are for; Plato suggests that proper love and friendship are directed at the human good—at wisdom and virtue. But love and friendship are not just one way to seek wisdom and virtue. Plato always emphasizes the social character of philosophy (that is, love of wisdom). His approach to art is similar: the wrong kind corrupts us when young and tempts even good adults to hold vicious attitudes. However, the right kind of art is important to developing good character in childhood and to sustaining good character through an entire life.

One last topic deserves mention: Plato thinks that the soul is immortal and transmigrates. This is relevant to his ethics not because he thinks one should act differently in this life because the soul is immortal, but because it raises the stakes for decisions made in this life. Our choices have ramifications for our character in the afterlife and in our next life. So, Plato thinks about character development in the very long term—over many cycles of birth and death, covering many thousands of years.

2. Aristotle

Aristotle was Plato’s student, so we should not be surprised to see him developing similar ethical views. Still, there are differences of emphasis, points on which Aristotle is more explicit, and some points of clear disagreement between them.

Aristotle provides formal criteria for our final end—happiness—that closely resemble Plato’s. We do everything for the sake of happiness and do not seek it for the sake of anything further, and we need nothing beyond happiness. The best candidate for something of this sort, he argues, is a full life of excellent rational activity. Some readers think Aristotle has a compound theory of happiness: it is a full life of excellent rational activity, plus external goods such as health, wealth, good looks, and good children. However, Aristotle clearly distinguishes what happiness consists in from what it needs as background conditions, and he thinks happiness needs external goods as background conditions, not as constituents. There are two reasons for this. First, excellent rational activity requires some external goods as tools; second, lack of some external goods “spoils our blessedness.” One way to understand the latter claim is to notice that excellent rational activity must be unimpeded and pleasant; since everyone wants external goods, we need some not to be pained at their lack. Aristotle and Plato agree in thinking that the virtuous person lives a better life with more external goods, but Aristotle thinks that enough external bads hinder excellent rational activity. They make the virtuous person unable to exercise her virtues fully, either for lack of tools or because her activities are impeded by pain. Plato thinks rather that lack of external goods or presence of external bads cannot prevent the virtuous person from living well, but only that these can prevent her from living the happiest possible life.

Aristotle distinguishes two kinds of virtues that rational creatures can have and exercise: intellectual and character virtues. The highest intellectual virtue is wisdom (sophia), which combines a grasp of the world’s highest principles (nous) and ability to reason deductively from them (epistêmê). The first principle of the world is the source of change that does not itself change—often called the “unmoved mover,” or God. Aristotle calls God the highest good, with which he proposes to replace Plato’s form of the Good. Plato distinguishes the form of the Good from any thinkers or thoughts about goodness, and identifies God with intelligence. But Aristotle says God is both thinker and object of thought. Plato’s God is personal; Aristotle’s is impersonal and does not think about the things it changes. God changes other things not by deliberating and acting, but by being what changing things strive to be like, to the extent possible. For example, the stars change in the smallest way possible for things that change: by circular motion. A life spent in exercising the highest intellectual virtues, to the extent possible, is the best life, and a life most like God’s. A life spent in exercising character virtues is also happy, but we exercise character virtues in part to make contemplation possible, while we contemplate just for its own sake. Thus, exercise of the character virtues fits the constraints on our final end less well than exercise of the highest intellectual virtues.

One intellectual virtue, practical wisdom (phronêsis), has a special relationship to character virtue; nobody can have any character virtue without practical wisdom, and nobody can have practical wisdom without all the central character virtues. Thus, Aristotle subscribes to a version of the unity of virtue. Practical wisdom and the character virtues shape and govern the parts of the human being that are non-rational but susceptible to reason (which are concerned with the material and social conditions of human life). One can exercise the character virtues in private life only or also in public life; the latter involves exercising them more widely, so it is preferable and more godlike. Thus, Aristotle addresses his discussion of character virtue to those who intend to enter politics. This is related to an odd feature of Aristotle’s account of justice: because each character virtue can be exercised in relation to others, he identifies “general justice” with the entirety of virtue. Again, practical wisdom and the character virtues can be exercised privately or politically, but achieve their fullest expression politically. The virtue concerned with other people is justice, so there is a sense in which justice encompasses all of character virtue and a correlative sense in which political expertise is simply practical wisdom writ large.

Aristotle describes each character virtue as being (and hitting) a “mean” in both action and feeling. Hitting the mean in action and feeling involves doing the right thing and feeling the right thing, at the right time, in the right ways, in relation to the right people. (Hitting the mean need not involve doing or feeling a moderate amount; it can be right to perform a grand action or to refrain from acting entirely, and it can be right to feel intensely or not to feel at all.) Each virtue is a mean by falling between two vices—wit, for example, is a mean that falls between buffoonery and boorishness.

The ability to figure out what to do can come apart from feeling the right way about one’s situation. (For example, one might see that one should confront a sexist comment, but be more afraid of doing so than one should be.) In such cases, one can either do the right thing despite one’s feelings, or act on one’s feelings contrary to one’s considered judgment. In the former case, the action is continent (but not virtuous); in the latter case, the action is incontinent (but not vicious). So, continence and incontinence are states of character between virtue and vice. Aristotle also sketches a character worse than vice, “brutishness,” and a character superior to virtue, which is godlike.

The ideal of being like God returns us to an important tension in Aristotle’s treatment of external goods. Usually, Aristotle thinks that lack of external goods can ruin the happiness of a virtuous person by impeding her exercise of virtue, and possession of external goods enables the wider exercise of virtue. He even introduces special virtues concerned with great wealth (magnificence) and great honor (magnanimity). Elsewhere, though, he argues that the contemplative life is superior to the political life in part because it needs fewer external goods, and he posits a godlike state that transcends virtue in its detachment from ordinary human concerns like health and wealth. This problem also arises in the case of friends. Friendship in the core sense involves seeking to become virtuous and acting well together. But the virtuous are self-sufficient, and the self-sufficient need friends least; so, the virtuous need friends least. In particular, the more godlike someone becomes, the less she needs friends at all. Aristotle has ways of trying to address this problem: he says that the virtuous need friends so that they have someone to benefit, and in order to best enjoy activities that are their own (since a friend is a “second self”). However, these two strands of Aristotle—one stressing the need for external goods and friends, the other stressing the need for independence from external goods and friends—remain in tension.

3. Stoicism

Stoicism comprises a centuries-long tradition, involving considerable disagreement among its adherents. This article focuses mainly on early Stoicism as articulated by its first three scholarchs: Zeno, Cleanthes, and especially Chrysippus. Some of the claims called “Stoic” here are rejected by other, later Stoics such as Panaetius and Posidonius. Some are rejected by an important early Stoic, Aristo, who lost a struggle to define the movement and so was retroactively deemed heterodox. There are disagreements among the earliest scholarchs as well, only a few of which are tracked here.

“Nature” plays a significant role in Plato and Aristotle’s ethics, especially in the contrast between nature and convention. But nature as a central organizing principle in ethical theory takes off in the Hellenistic period. For the Stoics, this emerges in their formula for the final end, “living in accordance with nature.” Cleanthes understands “nature” here as cosmic nature, while Chrysippus understands both cosmic and human nature.

One key appeal to human nature comes in the form of a “cradle argument,” which uses the behavior of unsocialized babies to establish what is natural and not merely conventional. The Stoics say that a newborn first finds herself and her constitution congenial (oikeion). So, she has an impulse to preserve herself and her constitution. Thus, the newborn finds whatever preserves herself and her constitution congenial, and has an impulse toward them; she finds whatever destroys herself and her constitution uncongenial, and has an impulse away from them. Our constitution includes bodily, psychological, and social abilities. At first, these are unsophisticated; the baby can flail her limbs, perceive her surroundings, and demand food from her caretakers. All these capacities are natural to her, congenial to her, and she has an impulse to exercise and preserve them. In short, the uncorrupted baby, her capacities, the exercise of those capacities, and whatever conduces to the preservation and exercise of herself and her capacities, have value for her. The opposites all have disvalue.

Next, the Stoics sketch the development of more bodily, psychological, and social abilities. We can stand, walk, and run; we can distance ourselves from appearances and assess whether things are as they seem; and we can engage in reciprocal relationships with others. These developments are natural to us. We continue to find ourselves and our developing constitutions congenial and have an impulse to exercise and preserve ourselves and our constitutions. Again, all these things have value for us and the opposites have disvalue.

Some key psychological aspects of our constitution are the capacity to receive impressions (for things to seem a certain way); the capacity to assent to impressions and so form beliefs, or else to withhold assent; the capacity to receive “graspable impressions” (true impressions that could not possibly be false); and the ability to distinguish graspable from non-graspable impressions, and assent to the former but not the latter. Assent to a graspable impression produces a grasp (katalêpsis), which constitutes an infallible awareness of a small part of reality. Grasps are the Stoic “criterion of truth”—the proper touchstone for any inquiry or argument—but they do not amount to knowledge. Knowledge requires stability, even in the face of dialectical examination (as it did for Plato). That requires assenting only to graspable impressions and organizing one’s grasps into a stable explanatory structure. This sets a high bar for knowledge (and for virtue, which, as we shall see, the Stoics identify with knowledge). Few humans, if any, ever attain knowledge. Still, grasps are a stepping stone; both the wise and the foolish have them, and they offer a path from foolishness to wisdom. Even though few of us make it, wisdom is the natural end point of human development.

This brings us back to value, which is distinct from goodness. Only what always benefits is good, just as only what always makes things hot is heat. That is, goodness is unconditional value. Most valuable things lack unconditional value (are not good) for familiar reasons: in special circumstances, things that are ordinarily valuable are disvaluable, and most valuable things can be misused. So, the Stoics call conditionally valuable things preferred indifferents, which should be selected; conditionally disvaluable things are dispreferred indifferents, which should be rejected. Things of no value or disvalue, or very little, are strictly indifferent and should be neither selected nor rejected. Only good and bad things should be chosen and avoided; these unconditional impulses are only fittingly directed at good and bad objects.

This introduces a crucial concept: appropriate actions (kathêkonta), or actions that admit of a reasonable defense. Importantly, the agent need not be able to provide such a defense to perform an appropriate action. (Even non-rational animals have and can perform their own appropriate actions.) As the wise and foolish both have grasps, so both the virtuous and vicious can perform appropriate actions. However, only the wise person can defend her grasps and her actions in the face of all questioning. Since the wise person (also called the sage) does appropriate actions for the right reasons, the Stoics call her actions right actions (katorthômata). The sage’s rational defense of her actions appeals to the value and disvalue of the preferred and dispreferred indifferents at stake, and explains how her selections and rejections respond appropriately to that value and disvalue. There are no action-types (aside from virtuous actions) that the sage always performs; occasionally, even cannibalism and incest are appropriate actions.

If the sage appeals to the value and disvalue of indifferents to explain her actions, where do virtue and the good enter the picture? Start from the developing agent who not only reacts immediately to particular valuable and disvaluable things, but who can compare value and disvalue and sometimes, at least, find the appropriate action. The next step in proper development is to perform appropriate actions regularly and reliably. Eventually, the agent appreciates how appropriate actions fit together into an orderly, harmonious life. At this point, the developing agent comes to see that the order and harmony of her life—made possible by reasoning about value and disvalue—has a value different in kind from the value of the things she reasons about. That order and harmony is, in a word, good.

The primary good thing in Stoicism is virtue, or practical intelligence about comparative selection-value. (Other goods include virtuous activity, the virtuous agent, and a friend—only the good are friends, because only they harmonize with themselves and each other.) The virtuous person appreciates the relevant values at stake in her circumstances and has a stable, coherent view about how to compare the values at stake. (She also knows that she acts with imperfect information, so she acts “with reservation”—in the knowledge that new information may require a change of plans or attitudes.) Unlike preferred and dispreferred indifferents, one would always rather have virtue so understood, and it cannot be misused. That is, virtue has unconditional value—it is good. The sage selects and rejects indifferents constantly and firmly and so has the “smooth flow of life” that the Stoics call happiness.

Since happiness is the possession (or possession and correct use) of goods, and since the Stoics think virtue is the only good and cannot be misused, the virtuous person is happy. The sage’s happiness does not depend upon whether she actually acquires preferred indifferents and not dispreferred indifferents; that is why they are indifferent (with respect to happiness). Virtue is perfect psychological coherence, which does not come in degrees, so neither does happiness. Thus, the sage is fully happy even on the rack (because she has and exercises virtue) and she always acts virtuously. Cicero illustrates this point with the example of Regulus, a Roman general who was captured by the Carthaginians. Regulus promised that he would carry terms of surrender back to Rome and then return. When he arrived in Rome, he argued against accepting the terms, returned to Carthage as promised, and was tortured and killed there. (Notice that this counts as an appropriate action only if keeping a promise to the enemy and its effects had greater selection-value than Regulus’ physical comfort and continued life and their effects. One cannot assume that Regulus’ behavior is required by justice, because the Stoics deny such general claims as “one should always keep promises,” “one should never have sex with close relatives,” and “one should never consume human flesh.”) On the flip side, everyone who is not a sage is foolish (because we all lack perfect psychological coherence) and miserable (because we all have the only bad thing, vice). All non-sages are equally vicious and miserable, even those who are making progress (prokopê), much as those who are underwater but rising toward the surface are drowning no less than those who are not rising toward the surface.

We are now in a position to understand the view most often associated with Stoic ethics: advocacy of freedom from passions (apatheia). This does not mean that we should have no affective life at all. The Stoics have a technical definition of passions (pathê) as fresh, weak judgments that something is good or bad. (A judgment is fresh when it is newly assented to; a judgment is weak when it is unstable and so not known, even if it is true.) The four highest species of passion are pleasure, pain, desire, and fear. Pleasure and desire represent their objects as good in the present and future, respectively, while pain and fear represent their objects as bad in the present and future. The sage has good versions of three of these four: joy (reasonable elation), wish (reasonable choice), and caution (reasonable avoidance). They omit any good version of pain, which suggests that the “good feelings” (eupatheiai) are strong, known judgments about what is good and bad, and are never directed at preferred and dispreferred indifferents. The sage, being wise, will never judge that anything that is neither good nor bad—for example, any preferred or dispreferred indifferent—is either good or bad. Further, the sage never is bad, but may become bad again. So, she is fittingly cautious about future bads, but she will never experience a negative affect directed at her present badness. For as long as she is wise, she is virtuous, good, and happy, not vicious, bad, and miserable.

So far we have focused on human nature, but we saw above that Cleanthes and Chrysippus both think our end involves living in accordance with cosmic nature. Accordingly, physics (knowledge of nature in general) is a virtue. But how more specifically does knowledge of the cosmos connect to ethics? In at least two ways. First, the Stoics are pantheists—the study of nature reveals that it is providentially ordered, and indeed that the cosmos simply is God. God’s beneficial arrangement of the cosmos (that is, of God’s body) requires that God be good and virtuous. Given the paucity of human sages, physics is the study of the only virtuous, good thing we know. Second, the Stoics use the providential governance of the cosmos and our role as parts of it to argue for ethical conclusions—especially that we should value the common interest more than our own. Chrysippus uses a striking image: suppose our feet were rational. The rational foot would understand itself as part of a larger rational organism, and conduct itself accordingly. For example, given its understanding of what is valuable for the whole of which it is a part, the foot would sometimes want to be muddied. The foot might even desire to be amputated if amputation were the only way for the whole rational animal to carry on in the best way. But each human being is in fact a rational part of a rational whole, the cosmos. So, given our understanding of what is valuable for the cosmos as a whole, we should sometimes want to have dispreferred indifferents, and even sometimes to die, so that the whole cosmos can carry on in the best way.

4. Academic Skepticism

The Academics take their name from Plato’s Academy. Arcesilaus was a head of the Academy who took the school back to (what he thought were) its skeptical roots. Here he could appeal to Plato’s Socrates, who denied knowing anything important and tried to show others that they were in the same position. He could also appeal to Plato, who can be seen as distancing himself from any dogmatic views by writing dialogues, many of which end in puzzlement anyway. The Academics would argue on both sides of any question; in one famous case, Carneades—the greatest of the Academics—went to Rome and argued for justice on one day and against justice on the next. A favorite Academic target was the Stoic claim that cognitive impressions exist and can be distinguished from non-cognitive ones; debates between Academics and Stoics persisted for quite a long time.

Like other global skeptics, Academics must explain how they can maintain their skepticism without walking off cliffs. They say that they do and maybe even believe what is reasonable or plausible. Plausibility comes in degrees, and Carneades suggests three important grades: initially plausible impressions, uncontroverted impressions (which are not only plausible but also agree with related plausible impressions), and thoroughly tested impressions (which require examining each of the related plausible impressions that agrees with an uncontroverted impression). One can rely on different grades of plausibility depending on the matter at hand. To jump away from something on the ground that may be a poisonous snake, the Academic only needs a plausible impression; to decide how to live, she will want thoroughly tested impressions.

In the Academic–Stoic debate, both sides made accommodations under dialectical pressure. Eventually, one Academic, Antiochus of Ascalon, rejected skepticism and accepted views close to Stoicism in both epistemology and ethics. (Cicero, another late Academic who held more firmly to skepticism, did something similar; his De Officiis rehearses and then supplements the Stoic Panaetius’ work on appropriate actions.) Antiochus claims to be recovering an ancient consensus among Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics. In ethics, this putative consensus says that virtue suffices for happiness, but possession of external and bodily goods makes the happy person happier, while their lack makes her less happy. The Stoics (says Antiochus) just use new and misleading language to state this consensus view. Antiochus’ “consensus view” lies quite close to Plato’s (as described above), but he papers over differences among his view, Aristotle’s view, and the Stoics’ view on the role of bodily and external goods in happiness. Antiochus’ view of Aristotle is understandable, though, especially since the Aristotelians of his day did hold the view that he attributes to Aristotle.

5. Epicureanism

The views canvassed above all accept that living well consists in virtue or virtuous activity. (Though the Academics are skeptics, they reliably seem to find this sort of view more plausible than the alternatives.) Another kind of ancient ethical theory says that living well consists in pleasure; the most important such view is Epicureanism.

Although they are outliers in other ways, the Epicureans operate from standard constraints on our final end: we do everything else for its sake, and we do not seek it for the sake of anything else. They use several approaches to defend their claim that the final end of all our actions is pleasure. First, they say that pleasure’s goodness is evident in perception and need only be pointed out, not argued for—much as we need not argue that fire is hot, since its heat is evident in perception. Second, like the Stoics, the Epicureans offer a version of the cradle argument. Where the Stoics say that the newborn’s first, uncorrupted impulse is for the exercise and preservation of herself and her constitution, the Epicureans say that she goes for pleasure. Finally, some Epicureans responded to arguments against hedonism. Sadly, no direct replies to the best anti-hedonist arguments of antiquity survive, but we do have some attempts to explain why many people deny the obvious truth of hedonism.

In one way, bodily pleasures and pains have a special role in the Epicurean view: all other pleasures and pains must be “referred to” them, directly or indirectly. For example, worry about losing one’s job might be referred directly to pains of hunger and physical exposure (because the job pays for food and shelter). Worry about what the boss thinks might be referred to worry about losing one’s job, and indirectly to the same bodily pains. This can be repeated indefinitely; perhaps one’s worry about proper clothing is referred to what the boss thinks, and so on. The key claim is that all psychological pleasures and pains must ultimately be referred back to the body. Plato and others, in contrast, say that we have basic non-bodily pleasures and pains—for example, shame at one’s bad reputation, or pleasure when one learns something new, just by themselves.

In another way, though, psychological pleasures and pains have a special role: they have greater magnitude than bodily pleasures and pains. On this point, the Epicureans actually agree with Plato and others above. However, they explain the comparative magnitudes in a different way: the body only registers what is happening right now, while the soul ranges over past, present, and future. The soul thus represents to itself a much larger array of pleasures and pains, and can feel more pleasure and pain than the body can at a moment. (Here the Epicureans disagree with their hedonist predecessors, the Cyrenaics, who say that bodily pain is used as punishment because its magnitude is greater than pain of the soul.)

The other most important Epicurean thesis about pleasure and pain is their denial that there is any neutral hedonic state in which one experiences neither pleasure nor pain. (On this point, they disagree with both Plato and the Cyrenaics.) If there is no neutral hedonic state, then complete removal of pain obviously cannot culminate in the neutral state; the condition in which one is completely free of pain must be pleasure. In fact, once pain is removed, they say, pleasure cannot be intensified, in either the body or the soul. Because psychological pleasures are greater than bodily pleasures, freedom from disturbance of the soul (ataraxia) is the key determinant of happiness, more important than freedom from bodily pain (aponia). Thus, any bodily pain can be outweighed by the pleasure of freedom from disturbance, and the Epicurean sage can live well in any external circumstances, even on the rack. Ataraxia (sometimes translated “tranquility”) requires three main subsidiary achievements: freedom from fear of death, freedom from fear of the gods, and freedom from excessive desire.

Epicurean arguments that death is not fearful continue to attract a great deal of attention from contemporary philosophers. The Epicureans argue that death is the end for us; we are not immortal. Then—and this is where contemporary discussion usually begins—being destroyed cannot harm us, for two reasons. First, when we are dead, we perceive nothing, and only what we perceive can harm us. (Some people object: things we do not perceive can harm us, as when a friend betrays us but we never find out.) Second, when we exist, we are not yet dead, so death cannot harm us while we are alive. Once we are dead, we no longer exist, so death cannot harm us when we are dead either. The second argument can be developed in various ways. The Epicurean poet Lucretius asks whether we were harmed by our pre-natal non-existence, and argues that if we were not, then our post-mortem non-existence also will not harm us. (Some people object: we can be harmed when we do not exist, as when a project that we care about and work hard to support fails after our death. Nothing pre-natal could harm us in this way.) One important clarification: as we shall see, the Epicureans think it is (usually) natural to try to avoid death. However, trying to avoid death does not entail fearing it, any more than we must fear getting our shoes wet in order to avoid getting our shoes wet.

The Epicureans try to remove fear of the gods by appealing to the concept of divinity: gods are immortal and blessed. But perfectly blessed gods can neither be benefited nor harmed by others (including human beings). So, they will never be grateful to human beings for benefiting them or angry at human beings for harming them. Therefore, the phenomena popularly ascribed to divine agency—for example, thunderbolts, seen as expressions of divine anger—cannot be explained that way. To vindicate this claim, they offer scientific accounts of the world solely in terms of the basic principles of atoms and void.

Finally, the Epicureans divide desires: some are natural and others are not. The former are grounded in actual human needs; the latter (for example, the desire to have statues erected in one’s honor) are not. Among the natural desires, some are necessary and others are not. Unnecessary natural desires are grounded in actual human needs (they are natural), but they aim to meet that need in a particular way, even though it could be met in many other ways. For example, caviar can meet the human need for food, so desire for caviar is natural. But our need for food can be met in many ways, so the desire for caviar is not a necessary desire. Natural and necessary desires are for the proper objects of genuine human needs. There are three kinds of natural and necessary desires, depending on what they are necessary for: happiness, freedom from bodily pain, and life. This division is fairly clear: we need some things to stay alive, and desires for those things are natural and necessary. But we could be alive and in severe bodily pain, which is naturally bad for us. So, desires for what we need to remove bodily pain are also necessary—for example, food and drink in general (but not caviar and champagne specifically). Further, we can be alive and free from bodily pain but still miserable, because our minds are troubled. Thus, we also have natural and necessary desires for what can remove mental trouble: virtue and friendship.

Several virtues can be treated fairly quickly. Courage is the state in which one is free from irrational fear of death and the gods (which also requires piety). Temperance is the state in which one has natural desires and abandons unnecessary desires whenever circumstances make it difficult to eat (say) caviar instead of barley. Wisdom is knowledge of death, the gods, desires and pleasures, and the basic structure of the cosmos; it instills piety, courage, and temperance. That leaves the most interesting virtue for the Epicureans, justice, which has both social and personal aspects. Socially, justice is a useful agreement—in particular, an agreement to neither harm nor be harmed. For an agreement to be just, it must actually be useful. Which agreements are useful (and so just) varies, so different agreements are just in different circumstances. Still, the core concept of justice as a useful agreement does not change. Next, there are two accounts of why personal justice is important. First, even if one can get away with violating just social agreements, one cannot be sure that one will get away with it. So, violating just social agreements causes fear. Fear is a psychological pain; since such pains are greater than bodily pains, whatever material goods one hopes to gain by violating a just social agreement cannot compensate for injustice’s cost in fear. Second, whatever one might hope to gain through injustice will not be necessary for life, health, or tranquility. Since the sage is temperate, she desires only what is necessary to life, health, and tranquility. Such limited goods are (usually) easily obtained. So, the sage has no incentive to violate just social agreements. Whenever extreme circumstances might seem to give an incentive, we should reconsider whether the original agreements are genuinely useful in those extreme circumstances, and so whether the agreements are still just.

Lastly, Epicurus praises friendship for its ability to make us tranquil. It is tricky to say how friendship and justice differ. Epicurus says justice is an agreement neither to harm nor be harmed, which suggests a possibility: justice seeks mutual avoidance of harm—not only by not harming one another, but also by assisting each other in not being harmed. Friendship goes beyond that; it requires mutual benefit. But what kind of benefits? Friends help each other when necessary, and Epicurus agrees that this is one benefit of friendship. But more important for our tranquility is our confidence that we will have help from our friends in the future, if we need it. This includes not only help with mundane tasks like moving, or momentous ones like providing for one’s children after one dies; the Epicureans actually formed a sort of commune near Athens, and dedicated their days to philosophical therapy through an elaborate set of confessional practices. Thus, friends help each other to achieve the highest good (tranquility) by helping each other to achieve its necessary means (virtue).

6. Pyrrhonism

Pyrrho himself is a nebulous figure, but in the wake of the Academy’s later skeptical turn (see above), Aenesidemus revived his legacy by using him as a figurehead for a different skeptical tradition. The differences between Academics and Pyrrhonists are not always easy to discern. Our main source for Pyrrhonism, Sextus Empiricus, says there are three kinds of philosophers: dogmatists (who claim to have grasped the truth), Academics (who say the truth cannot be grasped), and Pyrrhonists (who are still inquiring). Thus, Sextus effectively characterizes Academics as dogmatists who claim to have grasped one truth. However, his classification does not withstand scrutiny. The Academics follow persuasive appearances, and any claim that the truth cannot be discovered may be understood as what is plausible after extensive inquiry (not: what they claim to grasp as the truth). As we shall see, the Academics use of persuasive appearances is not far from what the Pyrrhonists say and do.

Still, there is a clear difference in the ethical attitudes taken by Academics and Pyrrhonists. The Academics typically say that something like the Aristotelian or Stoic view—that virtue and virtuous activity are the highest or only goods—is plausible. The Pyrrhonists say that their end is tranquility (again, ataraxia). This places their ethical attitude closer to the Epicureans, though their recipe for tranquility is rather different. (Here it is worth noting that later Roman Stoics also emphasized tranquility in a way that the early Stoics did not.)

We must work up to that point by considering the development of a young Pyrrhonist. First, she notices that different appearances often make incompatible reports. (The wind seems warm to her and cold to another; cremating the dead seems respectful to her and disrespectful to another.) Aenesidemus listed many ways that appearances can disagree, the “Aenesideman modes.” Such disagreement or relativity of appearances is puzzling: which appearances reflect how things really are? On topics that we care about, such puzzlement is painful and provokes attempts to remove it by vindicating some appearances over others. That is, puzzlement provokes inquiry into how things really are in themselves, as opposed to how they appear to various subjects.

When the Pyrrhonist inquires, though, she discovers equally strong reasons on both sides of every question. Further, whatever considerations she might appeal to in trying to resolve the dispute are also matters of disagreement, requiring more inquiry, and so on. The state in which one finds equally strong reasons on both sides of an issue is “equipollence”; the Pyrrhonist responds to equipollence by suspending judgment on which appearances reflect how things really are. When she does so, the pain that she felt at being puzzled dissolves. Sextus offers a simile: Apelles was trying and failing to paint the froth on a horse’s mouth. In frustration, he threw his sponge at the canvas; fortuitously, it produced the desired effect. Likewise, the budding Pyrrhonist wants to rid herself of troubles about the real nature of things by discovering the truth. She never finds reasons for any particular view better than the reasons on the other side. So, she suspends judgment. But when she does, she fortuitously achieves the end she sought: tranquility. As mentioned above, though, she does not rest on her laurels at this point; rather, she keeps inquiring.

Like Academics, Pyrrhonists must explain how they act. The Pyrrhonist criterion of action is the appearance. We can approach this through the examples of relativity above. When the wind seems warm to one person and cool to another, and they have equally strong reasons to trust each appearance, they might suspend judgment on the question whether the wind is really warm or cool. But this does not remove the appearances; the wind still seems cool to one and warm to the other. It also does not prevent either from acting on her appearance. One might put on another layer of clothing, while the other takes one off. Likewise when two people disagree whether it is respectful to cremate the dead. We might find equally good reasons to say that cremation is respectful and that it is disrespectful. But it may still seem respectful to one person and disrespectful to the other, and nothing prevents each person from acting on how things seem to them. (It is an open question whether this will produce toleration of different opinions or simply make practical disputes irresolvable.) It is unclear exactly how much the Pyrrhonist criterion of action, the appearance, differs from the Academic criterion, the plausible appearance. For example, both Pyrrhonists and Academics follow their traditional religious practices, which suggests some convergence in how ancient skeptics of different stripes deal with action.

Again, their clearest difference concerns the final end. Naturally, the Pyrrhonists do not dogmatically assert that tranquility is the end; it simply seems to them to be the end, and they act based on that appearance. But they say more about why Pyrrhonism seems to be the best path to tranquility—better than Epicureanism, for example. Certain appearances and feelings are unavoidable for us: hunger seems painful and leads us to relieve it. There is no getting rid of these appearances and feelings. However, those who dogmatically assert that pain is bad (for example) face a double dose of pain. They feel not only the inevitable pain of hunger, but also the further pain of mental trouble on reflecting that they possess something that is (by their lights) really bad for them. The Pyrrhonist, however, suspends judgment on the question whether the pains of hunger are really bad for her. Thus, she maintains her tranquility even in the face of life’s inevitable nuisances.


7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • J. Annas and R. Woolf, Cicero: On Moral Ends (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
    • Cicero presents the ethical views of the Epicureans, Stoics, and Antiochus, and disputes them with reference to Carneades’ division of ethical theories.
  • C. Brittain, Cicero: On Academic Scepticism (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 2006).
    • Our main source of information about the Stoic–Academic debate and the development of the Skeptical Academy.
  • J. Cooper, Plato: Complete Works (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 1997).
  • R. Crisp, Aristotle: Nicomachean Ethics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000).
  • M. Griffin and E. Atkins, Cicero: On Duties (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
    • Cicero adapts and extends Panaetius’ work on appropriate actions.
  • B. Inwood and L. Gerson, Hellenistic Philosophy (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 1998).
    • An excellent source book.
  • A. Long and D. Sedley, The Hellenistic Philosophers (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987).
    • Another excellent source book; v.1 contains translations, while v.2 contains the texts translated (and sometimes more) together with a substantial bibliography.

b. Secondary Works

  • K. Algra, et al., The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000).
    • A series of essays by various authors on central topics, and contains an extensive bibliography.
  • J. Annas, An Introduction to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1981).
  • J. Annas, The Morality of Happiness (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993).
    • Influential overview of the ethical theories of Aristotle and the main Hellenistic schools.
  • J. Annas, Platonic Ethics, Old and New (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000).
    • Argues for a Stoicized interpretation of Plato’s ethics by reference to Middle Platonist readings of Plato.
  • J. Barnes, The Toils of Skepticism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
  • T. Brennan, The Stoic Life (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2005).
  • S. Broadie, Ethics with Aristotle (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991).
  • G. Fine, Plato 2: Ethics, Politics, Religion, and the Soul (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
    • A collection of essays, including many classics.
  • T. Irwin, Plato’s Ethics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).
  • R. Kraut, Aristotle on the Human Good (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989).
  • P. Mitsis, Epicurus’ Ethical Theory (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1989).
  • M. Nussbaum, The Fragility of Goodness (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986).
    • A study of moral luck in Greek tragedy, Plato, and Aristotle.
  • M. Nussbaum, The Therapy of Desire (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1994).
    • Essays on ethical theory and therapy in Aristotle and Hellenistic philosophy.
  • T. O’Keefe, Epicureanism (Berkeley: University of California Press, 2009).
  • G. Lear, Happy Lives and the Highest Good (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004).
    • A study of the relationship between ethical and theoretical virtues in Aristotle.
  • A. Rorty, Essays on Aristotle’s Ethics (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980).
    • A collection of essays, including many classics.
  • H. Thorsrud, Ancient Skepticism (Berkeley: University of California Press, 2008).

Author Information

Clerk Shaw
University of Tennessee
U. S. A.