Diogenes of Apollonia (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Diogenes of Apollonia is often considered to be the last of the Presocratic Greek philosophers, although it is more than likely that Democritus was still active after the death of Diogenes. Diogenes’ main importance in the history of philosophy is that he synthesized the earlier Ionic monism of Anaximenes and Heraclitus with the pluralism of Empedocles and Anaxagoras. Diogenes serves as a sort of culminating point for Presocratic philosophy, uniting its differing tendencies toward emphasizing the absolute indivisibility or identity of reality with the equally absolute multiplicity of differing beings. Just as for Heraclitus, the truth for Diogenes was that one self-identical thing is all different things. By abiding by the Presocratic natural law that out of nothing comes nothing and into nothing, nothing goes, Diogenes proposed a definition of nature that identified it with life and explicitly affirmed that it is generated from itself. Diogenes’ main idea was that nature, the entire universe, is an indivisibly infinite, eternally living, and continuously moving substance he called, following Anaximenes, air. All the natural changes occurring throughout the universe—the various forms, the incalculable multiplicity the singular being takes—are one substance, air, under various modes. Air is also intelligent. Indeed, air is intelligence, or noesis in the Ancient Greek. Noesis is the purely intuitive, rational thinking that expresses and sustains all cosmic processes. As the self-causal power of rational, intuitive intelligence, air is also a god. When defining air solely as an atmospheric condition, as we do today, and in relation to the three other main elements, namely, fire, water, and earth, Diogenes’ air becomes the soul of singular beings. The soul is the source of every living thing’s sensitive ability to live, know, and thus also affect and be affected by other singular beings. The soul is also the way the absolute cosmic air identifies itself through a number of living differentiations as the means by which living creatures exhibit their differing degrees of temperature and density.  Through the soul, air is sometimes rarer or more condensed, and likewise sometimes hotter or cooler. The soul is the life-principle that, when mixed with and operating through other aerated forms like blood and veins, allows for the living functions of all singular beings to remain self-sustaining until the necessary process of decomposition affects them. Such decomposition, however, is just another means for nature’s processes to continue to function insofar as each decomposed being is the simultaneous site for the next modification that air will engender and express through itself. Ultimately, for Diogenes, the essence of all reality, identified as intelligent and divine air, is that it is both nature and life, as nature and life are identical as one absolute substance.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Substance Monism
  3. Air
  4. Intelligence and Divinity
  5. Cosmology and Physiology
  6. Influence and Historical Role
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

The exact chronology of the life of Diogenes of Apollonia is unknown, but most accounts place the date of his acme somewhere around 460-430 BCE.  It was once believed that he was from the Cretan city of Apollonia, but it is now thought that the Apollonia of which he was a citizen was the Milesian colony on the Pontus that was actually founded by the Presocratic philosopher Anaximander, and which is today the Bulgarian Black Sea resort town of Sozopol. It is also thought Diogenes lived for some time in Athens and that while there, he became so unpopular (being thought an atheist) that his life was in danger. Further proof of Diogenes’ probable residence in Athens is the parody we find of him in Aristophanes’ The Clouds, even though it is Socrates who is portrayed as holding Diogenes’ views. Diogenes Laertius writes, “Diogenes, son of Apollothemis, an Apolloniate, a physicist and a man of exceptional repute. He was a pupil of Anaximenes, as Antisthenes says. His period was that of Anaxagoras” (IX, 57). Theophrastus also mentions that Diogenes of Apollonia was ‘almost the youngest’ of the physical philosophers. It has been persuasively put forward that Diogenes Laertius was more than likely confused when he wrote that Diogenes of Apollonia was a pupil of Anaximenes, considering the agreed upon earliness and geographic location of Diogenes by most commentators. Like Anaximenes, however, Diogenes held that the fundamental substance of nature is air, but it is highly unlikely he could have studied with him. On the other hand, the view that Diogenes flourished in roughly the same period as Anaxagoras is uncontroversial.

There has been much debate over whether Diogenes wrote a single book or even as many as four. Only fragments of Diogenes’ work survive. A majority of the fragments that we have of Diogenes’ work come from Simplicius’ commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics and On the Heavens. Simplicius writes,

Since the generality of enquirers say that Diogenes of Apollonia made air the primary element, similarly to Anaximenes, while Nicolaus in his theological investigation relates that Diogenes declared the material principle to be between fire and air…, it must be realized that several books were written by this Diogenes (as he himself mentioned in On Nature, where he says that he had spoken also against the physicists—whom he calls ‘sophists’—and written a Meteorology, in which he also says he spoke about the material principle, as well as On the Nature of Man); in the On Nature, at least, which alone of his works came into my hands, he proposes a manifold demonstration that in the material principle posited by him is much intelligence. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 435)

The debate is over whether On Nature is the one book that Diogenes wrote and which covered many different yet nevertheless interrelated topics (such as man, meteorology, and the Sophists), or that On Nature, On the Nature of Man, Meteorologia, and Against the Sophists were four separate works. Diels, the early German collator of the Presocratic fragments, preferred the former option (DK 64B9), while commentators like Burnet (EGP 353) prefer the latter view. It also entirely possible that Simplicius was either confused or misinformed in his reading of Diogenes because of the fact that the quotations of Diogenes’ work, which he himself provides, contain discussions, for example, on the nature of man, which should have been impossible if indeed he only had a copy of On Nature in his possession. At the same time, we have evidence from a work of the medical author Galen that a certain Diogenes wrote a treatise that dealt with a number of diseases and their causes and remedies. It is probable that this was Diogenes of Apollonia because we have other reports from Galen (and Theophrastus) that Diogenes held views about diagnosing a patient by analyzing his tongue and general complexion. This evidence, along with his discussions regarding anatomy and the function of veins, leads to the probability that Diogenes was a professional doctor of some sort who could have produced a technical medical treatise. Another interesting piece of evidence that suggests Diogenes could have been a doctor is the methodological claim he makes regarding his own form of writing, and which sounds very similar to what is said in the beginning of some of the more philosophical works in the Hippocratic corpus. Diogenes Laertius says that this was the first line of Diogenes’ book: “It is my opinion that the author, at the beginning of any account, should make his principle or starting-point indisputable, and his explanation simple and dignified” (Fr. 1).  Such a no-nonsense approach to writing was often championed by the early medical thinkers.

2. Substance Monism

Following his own recommendation that an author should clearly state his purpose up front, Diogenes began his account of nature by explicitly establishing his principle, or starting-point.  He writes:

My opinion, in sum, is that all existing things are differentiated from the same thing, and are the same thing. And this is manifest: for if the things that exist at present in this world-order—earth and water and air and fire and all the other things apparent in this world-order—if any of these were different from the other (different, that is, in its own proper nature), and did not retain an essential identity while undergoing many changes and differentiations, it would be in no way possible for them to mix with each other, or for one to help or harm the other, or for a growing plant to grow out of the earth or for a living creature or anything else to come into being, unless they were so composed as to be the same thing.  But all these things, being differentiated from the same thing, become different kinds at different times and return into the same thing. (Fr. 2)

Diogenes was what we today call a ‘substance monist’.  Substance monism is the idea that everything is one thing. In other words, it means that all putative different things essentially are one self-identical thing. Substance Monism is an answer to the question, ‘what is and how many are there? According to Diogenes, for anything to be it must paradoxically be both identical to and different from the one, the thing that is – the one substance that is everything. The differences, however, of things from the one thing that is, are never ‘proper,’ as Diogenes argues. That is to say, the differences of things are never substantial, but rather they are only adjectival differences.

Now, while we do not find the term ‘substance’ in the fragments we have of Diogenes’ writing, the idea of a substance, and, moreover, the idea of substance monism, can help us understand what Diogenes meant when he said ‘all existing things are differentiated from the same thing, and are the same thing.’ A substance is what a thing is. It is the basic being of a thing; the essential reality a thing has to have in order for it be what it is.  Things are substances if they essentially are the things they are. The essence of a substance is its own existence. This line of arguing was common to all the Presocratics because for them it was a natural law that out of nothing came nothing and into nothing, nothing went. To truly be, something had to be the essential source or cause of its own existence. Reality or being, therefore, for most of the Presocratics, and especially for Diogenes, is absolutely immanent to itself, and so all the differences there are in nature inhere in, or are internal to, it. This line of reasoning was an early version of what was to become the ontological argument. A Substance is a thing that exists because that is what it is: a thing that exists, a thing that exists on the basis of its own immanent self-sufficiency.

Diogenes was concerned with understanding what it is that makes a thing be what it is, what a thing’s substantial being is, and how many of these things or substances there really are. He wanted to know what makes a thing substantial. To understand what things are, what makes things be what they are, and how many of them there are, Diogenes simply observed both what he himself was composed of and what the primary qualities of everything he had ever experienced and thus thought about were. Like all the Presocratic philosophers, Diogenes’ chief observation was that all things are natural or physical. Diogenes observed that all things of this ‘present world-order’ are natural or physical elemental qualities such as earth, water, fire, and air. The observation that all things are natural or physical also implied that all things change, and that everything is moving in some degree, both growing and decaying, composing and decomposing, and speeding up and slowing down. For Diogenes, then, all things are physical and moving, for they are all natural and living. Therefore, the one self-identical substance that is in essence all different things is nature itself, which is the mobile, living, and absolutely physical identity of the universe. Furthermore, all the different things nature expresses of itself, or modifies via itself are variable forms of earth, water, fire, and air, which compose and decompose with each other in many ways as nature lives and moves. The elemental qualities of nature differ from each other only in degree and are in essence simply a variety of ways in which nature is identical to itself.

The observation that all things are physical, mobile, and different only in elemental degrees led Diogenes to note that if this is indeed the case then all things must be interrelated in some way. Relations, however, seem to demand some form of proper or substantial difference in order to occur. Diogenes was troubled by the apparent demands of proper duality implied by the living and flowing relations he observed as occurring throughout all of nature. The problem he had was that if all the things he observed relating throughout nature were really different from each other, then there was nothing in them or about them that made such relations even possible in the first place (for how could things truly relate that are really different from each other?) and thus, even more threateningly, everything he perceived as expressing a certain substantial identity was then utterly deceptive and false. In response to this dilemma, he noticed that if things relate in some degree, as they certainly seem to, there must be at least something they share, something in common between them that enables them to relate. That it is manifestly clear that things relate allowed Diogenes to assert the equally indubitable fact that there must be something between them they must all share that allows them to relate.  If things were so different from each other that either they could not relate at all or that their relations brought about only their total fragmentation or annihilation, nothing in nature could grow or move or become in any way radically contrary to what he observed as happening in nature. For this reason, Diogenes posited that there must be some one thing, some self-identical substance that allows all the naturally different things to interact, relate, and compose and decompose with each other. Without a fundamental substance implicitly and inherently linking all things together, nothing would have a common ground to share and work upon or a situational medium through which to change and grow. Therefore, there must be a thing that makes all things relatable, a thing that allows all things to be different from each other to some degree, yet still be connected enough to each other to allow them to interact and compose and decompose with each other. This thing, for Diogenes, was going to have to be every where, all the time because there was nowhere at any time that he did not observe natural bodies moving, growing, and relating.

Substance monism, therefore, served not only to explain the absolute immanence and essential self-identity of nature to itself, it also explained how all the kinds of living, growing, and interacting of singular beings occur throughout nature. By sharing the common substance they all modify, all the different things of nature, all the elemental and formal means of composing and decomposing could relate, interact, and help and harm each other through the infinite and eternal process of natural or physical growth and decay. In other words, for Diogenes and his kind of substance monism, being is becoming, nature is nurturing, and all forms of movement, work, creation, destruction, and causality are so many ways one self-identical substance naturally lives the life of all its self-differentiated forms. For Diogenes, substance monism entails that nature is life and that, in essence, the universe lives. One absolutely physical identity underwrites all the apparent diversity.

3. Air

Diogenes’ substance monism may seem radically opposed to what we believe today, especially with respect to our definitions of nature and life. Yet, even in Diogenes’ own time, his thinking was considered to be as peculiar and eclectic as that of many of the other Presocratics. Presocratic philosophy was often considered, in its own time and even today, to be neither religious nor scientific, but rather idiosyncratic and esoteric because of its emphasis on achieving the experience of a direct and immediate intuition of the essence of nature. Such an intuition defines the rarity and excellence of Presocratic wisdom. Like other Presocratics, Diogenes was a sage-like independent spirit who neither followed nor founded a school and who made use of the best elements of other philosophies he thought worthy of greater elaboration and which could yield him the wisdom he sought and loved. One such philosopher he borrowed from, as we mentioned, was Anaximenes. Like Anaximines, Diogenes maintained that air is the one substance of which everything is made, and is a mode of. In his Refutation of all Heresies, Hippolytus reports,

Anaximenes…said that infinite air was the principle, from which the things that are becoming, and that are, and that shall be, and gods and things divine, all come into being, and the rest from its products. The form of air is of this kind: whenever it is most equable, it is invisible to sight, but is revealed by the cold and the hot and the damp and by movement. It is always in motion; for things that change do not change unless there be movement. Through becoming denser or finer it has different appearances; for when it is dissolved into what is finer it becomes fire, while winds, again, are air that is becoming condensed, and cloud is produced from air by felting. When it is condensed still more, water is produced; with a further degree of condensation earth is produced, and when condensed as far as possible, stones. The result is that the most influential components of generation are opposites, hot and cold. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 145)

Diogenes agreed with Anaximenes and proposed that air is the one substance that is reality. Following Anaximenes, Diogenes argued that air is the essential identity of all different things and that all different things are just so many forms of condensed or rarefied air. Nature, as air, is an infinite and eternal process that, through its indivisible mobility and continuity, constantly becomes all the ways it comes to be and passes away through an absolute multiplicity of singular beings. All different things are momentarily denser or finer forms or modes of one ubiquitous air. Through Simplicius, Theophrastus tells us,

Diogenes the Apolloniate, almost the youngest of those who occupied themselves with these matters (that is, physical studies), wrote for the most part in an eclectic fashion, following Anaxagoras in some things and Leucippus in others. He, too, says that the substance of the universe is infinite and eternal air, from which, when it is condensed and rarefied and changed in its dispositions, the form of other things comes into being. This is what Theophrastus relates about Diogenes; and the book of Diogenes which has reached me, entitled On Nature, clearly says that air is that from which all the rest come into being. (Fr. 2)

Now, there is for us something obviously problematic about Diogenes’ thinking regarding air. The problem we have with trying to reconcile Diogenes’ thinking with what we know today is figuring out how ‘air’ can still be an absolutely cosmic, indivisibly infinite, and eternally living substance when it is limited to only the earth’s atmosphere. We understand air today to be reducible to other properties. To approach this problem it must first be understood what Diogenes meant by the term we are using. Aer in Ancient Greek was rooted in the verb ‘to blow, or breathe’ and the term often denoted a certain sense of loftiness and light, spirited movement.  Aer was also associated with the wind, the sky, and brightness. What Diogenes meant by air was the celerity and rapidity of the light and fluid movement of nature’s waxing and waning, its constant condensing and rarefying, its expanding and contracting. Air, for Diogenes, is the gaseous fluidity of all living and natural phenomena. It is important to understand that by ‘air’ Diogenes did not intend the grand total of all the substantially distinct atoms of oxygen, nitrogen, argon and so on that compose our atmosphere, but rather the simple fact that all things are natural, living, and moving. Air, for Diogenes, was both the constant stirring of the atmosphere as a singular elemental formation, and also all the ‘inhalations’ and ‘exhalations’ of the planetary and celestial movements. Air expresses the becoming of being, the living of nature. A mobile movement, a movement conceived not as the attribute or property of an immobile substance, but rather as a substance itself, movement itself conceived as substance, is what Diogenes understood by air. Air is the indivisible body that is the universe, all that is: “this very thing [air] is both eternal and immortal body, but of the rest some come into being, some pass away” (Fr. 7). And of the rest that come into being and pass away, they are all ways air modifies itself.  Atmospheric air is, therefore, another way absolute, substantial air (aer) becomes and expresses itself.

4. Intelligence and Divinity

Diogenes, moreover, says that air is intelligence. The Ancient Greek term for intelligence is noesis. Noesis is not just intelligence in the sense of being sharp or smart. What Diogenes designated by noesis was the active power of a mind to immediately intuit and know what it thinks. Noesis is not so much a belief held by a mind, as it is the activity of thinking itself that is a mind. A mind is an actively thinking thing. Now, we might be wondering how the absolute cosmic substance, air, could also have an immediately intuitive and active mind, that is, how it could also be a thinking thing. First, it is important to keep in mind that everything was physical for Diogenes. Thinking was a physical process for him that was not limited to only organisms with brains. (There will be more on this in the next section.) In other words, thinking did not solely mean cognition for Diogenes. Air is intelligence itself; pure thought intuitively thinking itself.  Just as all singular bodies are in air as modes or ways it modifies and transforms itself through condensation and rarefaction, so too are all minds, all intellects or intelligent beings, in air as modes or ideas through which it immediately intuits and thus thinks itself. If air is intelligence, or purely active thinking, and intelligence is thus the one indivisible body that imbues everything, then every singular body is also going to be imbued with mind. Second, Diogenes argued that intelligence was the power inherent to air with which it could absolutely and internally differentiate itself in a rational and measured fashion. We have already seen the four main elements of nature as an example of this rational and measured differentiation. Intelligence was for Diogenes a sufficient reason for all the differences of degree found throughout nature:

For, he [Diogenes] says, it would not be possible without intelligence for it [sc. the substance] so to be divided up that it has measures of all things—of winter and summer and night and day and rains and winds and fair weather. The other things, too, if one wishes to consider them, one would find disposed in the best possible way. (Fr. 3)

The intelligence and the soul, the thinking and the living of singular beings are modifications of substantial air-intelligence. Through the cessation of breathing, sensing, and knowing, living beings decompose and lose their intelligence, but only so there can be a simultaneous re-composition of air-intelligence elsewhere. Diogenes says, “Men and the other living creatures live by means of air, through breathing it. And this is for them both soul [that is, life principle] and intelligence, as will be clearly shown in this work; and if this is removed, then they die and intelligence fails.” (Fr. 7)

Diogenes also says that air is divine. Divinity designated natural power for the Presocratics, who also tended not to anthropomorphize their gods. Instead, a divinity for the first philosophers was more a natural force, usually an elemental power found permeating all of nature and imbuing it with all its creative and destructive power. Along with substance monism, pantheism—the idea that everything is divine, that God is all things—was an idea shared by many of the Presocratics. For Diogenes, his substance monism definitely entailed pantheism. Air-intelligence is divine. Only a god could remain identical to itself while also rationally differentiating itself through an infinity of singular beings. Only a god as well could have the intuitive intelligence to actively and affirmatively know all the self-identical differentiations it expressed of itself. As Diogenes says, it is only nature conceived as an absolutely immanent and divine air-intelligence that could be “both great and strong and eternal and immortal and much-knowing (Fr. 8).” Diogenes summarized all these points wonderfully when he wrote:

And it seems to me that that which has intelligence is what men call air, and that all men are steered by this and that it has power over all things. For this very thing seems to me to be a god and to have reached everywhere and to dispose all things and to be in everything. And there is no single thing that does not have a share of this; but nothing has an equal share of it, one with another, but there are many fashions both of air itself and of intelligence. For it is many-fashioned, being hotter and colder and drier and moister and more stationary and more swiftly mobile, and many other differentiations are in it both of taste and of color unlimited in number. And yet of all living creatures the soul is the same, air that is warmer than the outside, in which we exist, but much cooler than that near the sun. But in none of living creatures is this warmth alike (since it is not even so in individual men); the difference is not great, but as much as still allows them to be similar. Yet it is not possible for anything to become truly alike, one to the other, of the things undergoing differentiation, without becoming the same. Because, then, the differentiation is many-fashioned, living creatures are many fashioned and many in number, resembling each other neither in form nor in way of life nor in intelligence, because of the number of differentiations. Nevertheless, they all live and see and hear by the same thing, and have the rest of their intelligence from the same thing. (Fr. 5)

5. Cosmology and Physiology

Singular beings are not only composed of air, they also live and have intelligence by breathing air. The soul or life principle of all things is an absolute and divine air-intelligence that, in a sense, breathes through itself in all the forms it takes on. Air is both eternal and omnipresent as it takes on an unlimited number of forms. Like many of the Presocratics, Diogenes provides an account of how air modifies itself through a variety of physical compositions ranging from galaxies and solar systems to respiratory, circulatory, and cognitive systems. Diogenes provides us with a cosmogony that explains the creation of the earth and sun on the basis of the condensation and rarefaction of air. In The pseudo-Plutarchean Stromateis, which Eusebius preserved, it is stated that:

Diogenes the Apolloniate premises that air is the element, and that all things are in motion and the worlds innumerable. He gives this account of cosmogony: the whole was in motion, and became rare is some places and dense in others; where the dense ran together centripetally it made the earth, and so the rest by the same method, while the lightest parts took the upper position and produce the sun. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 445)

Diogenes also made some cosmological observations. He gave an interesting account of heavenly bodies that included an attempt to explain meteorites.

Diogenes says that the heavenly bodies are like pumice-stone, and he considers them as the breathing-holes of the world; and they are fiery. With the visible heavenly bodies are carried round invisible stones, which for this reason have no name: they often fall on the earth and are extinguished, like the stone star that made its fiery descent at Aegospotami. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 445)

There are many similarities between Diogenes’ cosmogony and cosmology and that of his fellow Presocratics. First, he posits the existence of innumerable worlds like many other Presocratics. It makes sense that Diogenes asserts an immeasurable plurality of worlds because he places no restrictions to the amount of differentiations and composition air can take. Why wouldn’t there be a plethora of worlds littered throughout the universe insofar as worlds are, by definition, just momentary formations of the universe (air) anyway? Secondly, it is from Anaxagoras that Diogenes likely borrowed the idea of a noetic substance forming a vortex within itself. Thirdly, it was common in the Ionic tradition to describe the origin of the earth as the formation of more concentrated and denser material in the center of such a vortex. Likewise, the rarer material would go to the extremes of the vortex, following the law that differentiation is a symmetrical process whereby like follows like. Lighter air, therefore, tends towards greater heights and extremities while denser air tends to concentrate into relative core positions. With respect to astronomical objects, it seems Diogenes said heavenly bodies were like pumice stone because pumice is both glowing and light, or ‘airy,’ and composed of translucent and very porous bubble walls, which are, once again, qualities that accommodate the substance that Diogenes countenances.

From extrasolar objects and the solar system down to the earth itself, Diogenes continues to explain all physical and psychological phenomena as so many self-modifying processes of one substantial air. Within and through the atmospheric air of our planet, Diogenes addresses the thinking and sensing of particular organisms. The law of like following like is as applicable on earth as it is throughout the cosmos. From Theophrastus’ de sensu, Diogenes is reported as having a detailed theory of sensation and cognition based on the reception and circulation of air within and between singular beings. Each of the five senses are dealt with in terms of how they process air. Degrees of intelligence or cognitive ability are also delineated by the amount and kind of air each being possesses. The differences between beings are defined by how swiftly, and with how much agility, they engender and circulate. Some beings, for example, have more intelligence, or more complex brain activity while others have say, a better sense of smell. All kinds of perception, however, are ways that air processes and modifies itself.

Diogenes attributes thinking and the senses, as also life, to air.  Therefore he would seem to do so by the action of similars (for he says that there would be no action of being acted upon, unless all things were from one). The sense of smell is produced by the air round the brain…Hearing is produced whenever the air within the ears, being moved by the air outside, spreads toward the brain. Vision occurs when things are reflected on the pupil, and it, being mixed with the air within, produces a sensation. A proof of this is that, if there is an inflammation of the veins (that is, those in the eye), there is no mixture with the air within, nor vision, although the reflexion exists exactly as before. Taste occurs to the tongue by what is rare and gentle. About touch he gave no definition, either about its nature or its objects. But after this he attempts to say what is the cause of more accurate sensations, and what sort of objects they have. Smell is keenest for those who have least air in their heads, for it is mixed most quickly; and, in addition, if a man draws it in through a longer and narrower channel; for in this way it is more swiftly assessed. Therefore some living creatures are more perceptive of smell than are men; yet nevertheless, if the smell were symmetrical with the air, with regard to mixture, man would smell perfectly….(Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 448).

It seems that for Diogenes correspondence in perception entails a matching-up of the degrees of air within the brain with air that is being received through the sensitive faculties. Sensation itself is the reception of air by air and so is a mixing of airs through the aerated blood channels that are themselves oxygenated through respiration.  (Diogenes also attempted an anatomy of the veins.) Usually, the reception of air by air takes place in an organism as an agitation or irritation of the sense organs and thus also the brain. An accurate or adequate perception is one in which there is a mutually interpenetrating coalescence of finer air flows within, between, and amongst the parts of organisms and the finer air received through sensations. This entails that a certain kind of affective or sensitive openness, which can be regarded as a susceptibility to finer air, allows for greater perceptual correspondences with the other kinds of air-composites.  Such affective openness implies that one must come to pursue or avoid interaction with other air-composites in accordance with how they increase or decrease one’s respiratory and cognitive abilities. The trick is to have sensitive correspondences serve the rationally differentiated regulatory systems that allow organisms to survive and persevere. Overall, Diogenes was one of the first thinkers to emphasis the relationship between sensation, respiration, and cognition.

Theophrastus continues in his report of Diogenes’ thinking regarding sensation and cognition. Pleasure and pain are also definable by the sensitive reception and circulation of air.

That the air within perceives, being a small portion of the god, is indicated by the fact that often, when we have our mind on other things, we neither see nor hear.  Pleasure and pain come about in this way: whenever air mixes in quantity with blood and lightens it, being in accordance with nature, and penetrates through the whole body, pleasure is produced; but whenever the air is present contrary to nature and does not mix, then the blood coagulates and becomes weaker and thicker, and pain is produced. Similarly, confidence and health and their opposites…Thought, as has been said, is caused by pure and dry air; for a moist emanation inhibits the intelligence; for this reason thought is diminished in sleep, drunkenness, and surfeit. That moisture removes intelligence is indicated by the fact that other living creatures are inferior in intellect, for they breathe the air from the earth and take to themselves moister sustenance. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 448)

The key to cultivating a stronger intelligence, greater pleasures, and a good sense of taste (for the wise man is the sage, the sapiens, the one who tastes well) is to take in, breathe, and allow to permeate one’s organic structure the finer, lighter, dryer, warmer, and swifter air. To breathe well is to live well. To stand erect, awake, warm-blooded, firm, and at attention is to manifest a stronger and more well-regulated and attuned disposition.  Like Heraclitus, Diogenes advises that one must avoid excessive moistening. To become more god-like, more substantially identical with what one essentially is, one should actively, aggressively, and affirmatively seek out other aerated bodies of similar dispositions and compose well with them. Certain compositions lead to the reproduction of new organic forms. Since air is the vitality of its own natural and substantial existence, it will continuously reproduce itself through the distribution of its own aerated seeds.  Indeed, air, understood as nature’s ubiquitous and eternal living, is constantly conceiving itself, impregnating and giving birth to its own various forms of gradients of denser or finer air.

Diogenes, it is worth mentioning, also had an interest in embryology. The self-conception of air takes place through the intermingling of aerated sperm and eggs. For Diogenes, life grows naturally and intelligently at all levels because of the aerated nature of blood and veins.

And in the continuation he shows that also the sperm of living creatures is aerated and acts of intelligence take place when the air, with the blood, gains possession of the whole body through the veins; in the course of which he gives an accurate anatomy of the veins. Now in this he clearly says that what men call air is the material principle. (Fr. 5)

6. Influence and Historical Role

The Eleatic philosophers were monists, believing that were there two things, we would have to say of one that it is not (the other). They thought, however, that one may not speak of what is not, as one would be speaking of nothing. The fact that there is only one thing in existence was thought to entail that change could not occur, as there would need to be two things for there to be the relata required for a causal relation. Diogenes seems to have agreed with the monistic aspect of the Eleatic philosophy while attempting to accommodate the possibility of change. His move was to claim that one thing might be a causa sui, and that the change we experience is the alteration thereof. The substance best suited as the substrate was thought to be air, and here rings reminiscent the view of Anaximenes. One also finds, arguably, the influence of Anaxagoras, when one considers the claim that this substance is intelligence or nous. Finally, it is worth noting that the idea that the universe is a living being is broached in Plato’s Timaeus. And the idea of substance monism has had other advocates in the history of philosophy, most famous perhaps being Benedict Spinoza

7. References and Further Reading

There are no monographs on Diogenes of Apollonia in English. Unfortunately, Diogenes has been given rather brief attention throughout the secondary literature. Diogenes is usually addressed in chapters in books on the Presocratics.

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul (1 vol. ed.), 1982, 568-592.
  • Burnet, J. Early Greek Philosophy. London: Black (4th ed.), 1930.
  • Diels, H. “Leukippos und Diogenes von Apollonia.” RM 42, 1887, 1-14.
  • Diller, H. “Die philosophiegeschichtliche Stellung des Diogenes von Apollonia.” Hermes 76, 1941, 359-81.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. The Presocratic Tradition from Parmenides to Democritus. Vol. II. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993, 362-381.
  • Huffmeier, F. “Teleologische Weltbetrachtung bei Diogenes von Apollonia.” Philologus 107, 1963, 131-38.
  • Jaeger, Werner. The Theology of the Early Greek Philosophers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1967, 155-171.
  • Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven, and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd edn. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Laks, Andre. “Soul, Sensation, and Thought.” The Cambridge Companion to Early Greek Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999, 250-270.
  • Laks, Andre. Diogene d’ Apollonie. Paris: Lille, 1983.
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy Before Socrates. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994, 344-352.
  • Shaw, J. R. “A Note on the Anatomical and Philosophical Claims of Diogenes of Apollonia.” Aperion 11.1, 1977, 53-7.
  • Warren, James. Presocratics. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2007, 175-181.

Author Information

Jason Dockstader
Email: jdock36@hotmail.com
University College Cork