Divine Command Theory
Philosophers both past and present have sought to defend theories of ethics that are grounded in a theistic framework. Roughly, Divine Command Theory is the view that morality is somehow dependent upon God, and that moral obligation consists in obedience to God’s commands. Divine Command Theory includes the claim that morality is ultimately based on the commands or character of God, and that the morally right action is the one that God commands or requires. The specific content of these divine commands varies according to the particular religion and the particular views of the individual divine command theorist, but all versions of the theory hold in common the claim that morality and moral obligations ultimately depend on God.
Divine Command Theory has been and continues to be highly controversial. It has been criticized by numerous philosophers, including Plato, Kai Nielsen, and J. L. Mackie. The theory also has many defenders, both classic and contemporary, such as Thomas Aquinas, Robert Adams, and Philip Quinn. The question of the possible connections between religion and ethics is of interest to moral philosophers as well as philosophers of religion, but it also leads us to consider the role of religion in society as well as the nature of moral deliberation. Given this, the arguments offered for and against Divine Command Theory have both theoretical and practical importance.
Table of Contents
- Modern Moral Philosophy
- Some Possible Advantages of Divine Command Theory
- A Persistent Problem: The Euthyphro Dilemma
- Responses to the Euthyphro Dilemma
- Speech Acts and Obligations to Act
- Ethics Without God
- Other Objections to Divine Command Theory
- Conclusion: Religion, Morality, and the Good Life
- References and Further Reading
In her influential paper, “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Elizabeth Anscombe (1958) argues that moral terms such as “should” and “ought” acquired a legalistic sense (that is, being bound by law) because of Christianity’s far-reaching historical influence and its legalistic conception of ethics. For example, use of the term “ought” seems to suggest a verdict on an action, and this in turn suggests a judge. On a law conception of ethics, conformity with the virtues requires obeying the divine law. A divine law requires the existence of God, as the divine lawgiver. Anscombe claims that since we have given up on God’s existence, we should also give up the use of moral terms that are derived from a theistic worldview. Since we have given up belief in God, we should also give up the moral understanding that rests on such belief, and engage in moral philosophy without using such terms. For Anscombe, this meant that we should abandon talk of morality as law, and instead focus on morality as virtue.
Alan Donagan (1977) argues against these conclusions. Donagan’s view is that Anscombe was mistaken on two counts. First, he rejects her claim that we can only treat morality as a system of law if we also presuppose the existence of a divine lawgiver. Second, Donagan contends that neither must we abandon law-based conceptions of morality for an Aristotelian virtue ethic. The reason for this, according to Donagan, is that a divine command must express God’s reason in order for it to be expressive of a divine law. Given this, if we assume that human reason is at least in principle adequate for directing our lives, then the substance of divine law that is relevant to human life can be appreciated with human reason, apart from any reference to a divine being. Moreover, according to Donagan, even if we conceive of morality as Aristotle did, namely, as a matter of virtue, it is quite natural to think that each virtue has as its counterpart some moral rule or precept. For example, ‘to act in manner x is to be just’ has as its counterpart ‘to act in manner x is morally right’. And if we can apprehend the relevant moral virtue via human reason, then we can also apprehend the relevant moral law by that same reason. Given the foregoing points raised by Anscombe and Donagan, a divine command theorist might opt for a conception of morality as virtue, as law, or both.
Before looking at some possible advantages of Divine Command Theory, it will be helpful to clarify further the content of the view. Edward Wierenga (1989) points out that there are many ways to conceive of the connection between God and morality. A strong version of Divine Command Theory includes the claim that moral statements (x is obligatory) are defined in terms of theological statements (x is commanded by God). At the other end of the spectrum is the view that the commands of God are coextensive with the demands of morality. God’s commands do not determine morality, but rather inform us about its content. Wierenga opts for a view that lies between these strong and weak versions of Divine Command Theory. In what follows, I will, following Wierenga, take Divine Command Theory to include the following claims: (i) God in some sense determines what is moral; (ii) moral obligations are derived from God’s commands, where these commands are understood as statements of the revealed divine will.
In his Critique of Practical Reason, Immanuel Kant, who has traditionally not been seen as an advocate of Divine Command Theory (for an opposing view see Nuyen, 1998), claims that morality requires faith in God and an afterlife. According to Kant, we must believe that God exists because the requirements of morality are too much for us to bear. We must believe that there is a God who will help us satisfy the demands of the moral law. With such a belief, we have the hope that we will be able to live moral lives. Moreover, Kant argues that “there is not the slightest ground in the moral law for a necessary connection between the morality and proportionate happiness of a being who belongs to the world as one of its parts and is thus dependent on it” (p. 131). However, if there is a God and an afterlife where the righteous are rewarded with happiness and justice obtains, this problem goes away. That is, being moral does not guarantee happiness, so we must believe in a God who will reward the morally righteous with happiness. Kant does not employ the concept of moral faith as an argument for Divine Command Theory, but a contemporary advocate could argue along Kantian lines that these advantages do accrue to this view of morality.
Another possible advantage of Divine Command Theory is that it provides an objective metaphysical foundation for morality. For those committed to the existence of objective moral truths, such truths seem to fit well within a theistic framework. That is, if the origin of the universe is a personal moral being, then the existence of objective moral truths are at home, so to speak, in the universe. By contrast, if the origin of the universe is non-moral, then the existence of such truths becomes philosophically perplexing, because it is unclear how moral properties can come into existence via non-moral origins. Given the metaphysical insight that ex nihilo, nihilo fit, the resulting claim is that out of the non-moral, nothing moral comes. Objective moral properties stick out due to a lack of naturalness of fit in an entirely naturalistic universe. This perspective assumes that objective moral properties exist, which is of course highly controversial.
Not only does Divine Command Theory provide a metaphysical basis for morality, but according to many it also gives us a good answer to the question, why be moral? William Lane Craig argues that this is an advantage of a view of ethics that is grounded in God. On theism, we are held accountable for our actions by God. Those who do evil will be punished, and those who live morally upstanding lives will be vindicated and even rewarded. Good, in the end, triumphs over evil. Justice will win out. Moreover, on a theistic view of ethics, we have a reason to act in ways that run counter to our self-interest, because such actions of self-sacrifice have deep significance and merit within a theistic framework. On Divine Command Theory it is therefore rational to sacrifice my own well-being for the well-being of my children, my friends, and even complete strangers, because God approves of and even commands such acts of self-sacrifice.
An important objection to the foregoing points is that there is something inadequate about a punishment and reward orientation of moral motivation. That is, one might argue that if the motive for being moral on Divine Command Theory is to merely avoid punishment and perhaps gain eternal bliss, then this is less than ideal as an account of moral motivation, because it is a mark of moral immaturity. Should we not instead seek to live moral lives in community with others because we value them and desire their happiness? In response to this, advocates of Divine Command Theory may offer different accounts of moral motivation, agreeing that a moral motivation based solely on reward and punishment is inadequate. For example, perhaps the reason to be moral is that God designed human beings to be constituted in such a way that being moral is a necessary condition for human flourishing. Some might object that this is overly egoistic, but at any rate it seems less objectionable than the motivation to be moral provided by the mere desire to avoid punishment. Augustine (see Kent, 2001) develops a view along these lines. Augustine begins with the notion that ethics is the pursuit of the supreme good, which provides the happiness that all humans seek. He then claims that the way to obtain this happiness is to love the right objects, that is, those that are worthy of our love, in the right way. In order to do this, we must love God, and then we will be able to love our friends, physical objects, and everything else in the right way and in the right amount. On Augustine’s view, love of God helps us to orient our other loves in the proper way, proportional to their value. However, even if these points in defense of Divine Command Theory are thought to be satisfactory, there is another problem looming for the view that was famously discussed by Plato over two thousand years ago.
The dialogue between Socrates and Euthyphro is nearly omnipresent in philosophical discussions of the relationship between God and ethics. In this dialogue, written by Plato (1981), who was a student of Socrates, Euthyphro and Socrates encounter each other in the king’s court. Charges have been brought against Socrates by Miletus, who claims that Socrates is guilty of corrupting the youth of Athens by leading them away from belief in the proper gods. In the course of their conversation, Socrates is surprised to discover that Euthyphro is prosecuting his own father for the murder of a servant. Euthyphro’s family is upset with him because of this, and they believe that what he is doing—prosecuting his own father—is impious. Euthyphro maintains that his family fails to understand the divine attitude to his action. This then sets the stage for a discussion of the nature of piety between Socrates and Euthyphro. In this discussion, Socrates asks Euthyphro the now philosophically famous question that he and any divine command theorist must consider: “Is the pious loved by the gods because it is pious, or is it pious because it is loved by the gods?” (p. 14).
For our purposes, it will be useful to rephrase Socrates’ question. Socrates can be understood as asking “Does God command this particular action because it is morally right, or is it morally right because God commands it?” It is in answering this question that the divine command theorist encounters a difficulty. A defender of Divine Command Theory might respond that an action is morally right because God commands it. However, the implication of this response is that if God commanded that we inflict suffering on others for fun, then doing so would be morally right. We would be obligated to do so, because God commanded it. This is because, on Divine Command Theory, the reason that inflicting such suffering is wrong is that God commands us not to do it. However, if God commanded us to inflict such suffering, doing so would become the morally right thing to do. The problem for this response to Socrates’ question, then, is that God’s commands and therefore the foundations of morality become arbitrary, which then allows for morally reprehensible actions to become morally obligatory.
Most advocates of Divine Command Theory do not want to be stuck with the implication that cruelty could possibly be morally right, nor do they want to accept the implication that the foundations of morality are arbitrary. So, a divine command theorist might avoid this problem of arbitrariness by opting for a different answer to Socrates’ question, and say that for any particular action that God commands, He commands it because it is morally right. By taking this route, the divine command theorist avoids having to accept that inflicting suffering on others for fun could be a morally right action. More generally, she avoids the arbitrariness that plagues any Divine Command Theory which includes the claim that an action is right solely because God commands it. However, two new problems now arise. If God commands a particular action because it is morally right, then ethics no longer depends on God in the way that Divine Command Theorists maintain. God is no longer the author of ethics, but rather a mere recognizer of right and wrong. As such, God no longer serves as the foundation of ethics. Moreover, it now seems that God has become subject to an external moral law, and is no longer sovereign. John Arthur (2005) puts the point this way: “If God approves kindness because it is a virtue and hates the Nazis because they were evil, then it seems that God discovers morality rather than inventing it” (20, emphasis added). God is no longer sovereign over the entire universe, but rather is subject to a moral law external to himself. The notion that God is subject to an external moral law is also a problem for theists who hold that in the great chain of being, God is at the top. Here, there is a moral law external to and higher than God, and this is a consequence that many divine command theorists would want to reject. Hence, the advocate of a Divine Command Theory of ethics faces a dilemma: morality either rests on arbitrary foundations, or God is not the source of ethics and is subject to an external moral law, both of which allegedly compromise his supreme moral and metaphysical status.
One possible response to the Euthyphro Dilemma is to simply accept that if God does command cruelty, then inflicting it upon others would be morally obligatory. In Super 4 Libros Sententiarum, William of Ockham states that the actions which we call “theft” and “adultery” would be obligatory for us if God commanded us to do them. Most people find this to be an unacceptable view of moral obligation, on the grounds that any theory of ethics that leaves open the possibility that such actions are morally praiseworthy is fatally flawed. However, as Robert Adams (1987) points out, a full understanding of Ockham’s view here would emphasize that it is a mere logical possibility that God could command adultery or cruelty, and not a real possibility. That is, even if it is logically possible that God could command cruelty, it is not something that God will do, given his character in the actual world. Given this, Ockham himself was surely not prepared to inflict suffering on others if God commanded it. Even with this proviso, however, many reject this type of response to the Euthyphro Dilemma.
Another response to the Euthyphro Dilemma which is intended to avoid the problem of arbitrariness is discussed by Clark and Poortenga (2003), drawing upon the moral theory of Thomas Aquinas. If we conceive of the good life for human beings as consisting in activities and character qualities that fulfill us, then the good life will depend upon our nature, as human beings. Given human nature, some activities and character traits will fulfill us, and some will not. For example, neither drinking gasoline nor lying nor committing adultery will help us to function properly and so be fulfilled, as human beings. God created us with a certain nature. Once he has done this, he cannot arbitrarily decide what is good or bad for us, what will help or hinder us from functioning properly. God could have created us differently. That is, it is possible that he could have made us to thrive and be fulfilled by ingesting gasoline, lying, and committing adultery. But, according to Aquinas, he did no such thing. We must live lives marked by a love for God and other people, if we want to be fulfilled as human beings. The defender of this type of response to the Euthyphro Dilemma, to avoid the charge of arbitrariness, should explain why God created us with the nature that we possess, rather than some other nature. What grounded this decision? A satisfactory answer will include the claim that there is something valuable about human beings and the nature that we possess that grounded God’s decision, but it is incumbent upon the proponent of this response to defend this claim.
In his “Some Suggestions for Divine Command Theorists”, William Alston (1990) offers some advice to advocates of Divine Command Theory, which Alston believes will make the view as philosophically strong as it can be. Alston formulates the Euthyphro dilemma as a question regarding which of the two following statements a divine command theorist should accept:
1. We ought to love one another because God commands us to do so.
2. God commands us to love one another because that is what we ought to do.
Alston’s argument is that if we interpret these statements correctly, a theist can in fact grasp both horns of this putative dilemma. One problem with opting for number 1 in the above dilemma is that it becomes difficult if not impossible to conceive of God as morally good, because if the standards of moral goodness are set by God’s commands, then the claim “God is morally good” is equivalent to “God obeys His own commands”. But this trivialization is not what we mean when we assert that God is morally good. Alston argues that a divine command theorist can avoid this problem by conceiving of God’s moral goodness as something distinct from conformity to moral obligations, and so as something distinct from conformity to divine commands. Alston summarizes his argument for this claim as follows:
…a necessary condition of the truth that ‘S ought to do A’ is at least the metaphysical possibility that S does not do A. On this view, moral obligations attach to all human beings, even those so saintly as to totally lack any tendency, in the ordinary sense of that term, to do other than what it is morally good to do. And no moral obligations attach to God, assuming, as we are here, that God is essentially perfectly good. Thus divine commands can be constitutive of moral obligations for those beings who have them without it being the case that God’s goodness consists in His obeying His own commands, or, indeed, consists in any relation whatsoever of God to His commands (p. 315).
Alston concludes that Divine Command Theory survives the first horn of the dilemma. However, in so doing, perhaps the theory is delivered a fatal blow by the dilemma’s second horn. If the divine command theorist holds that “God commands us to love our neighbor because it is morally good that we should do so,” then moral goodness is independent of God’s will and moral facts stand over God, so to speak, insofar as God is now subject to such facts. Hence, God is no longer absolutely sovereign. One response is to say that God is subject to moral principles in the same way that he is subject to logical principles, which nearly all agree does not compromise his sovereignty (See The Omnipotence Objection below). Alston prefers a different option, however, and argues that we can think of God himself as the supreme standard of goodness. God does not consult some independent Platonic realm where the objective principles of goodness exist, but rather God just acts according to his necessarily good character. But is not arbitrariness still present, insofar as it seems that it is arbitrary to take a particular individual as the standard of goodness, without reference to the individual’s conformity to general principles of goodness? In response, Alston points out that there must be a stopping point for any explanation. That is, sooner or later, when we are seeking an answer to the question “By virtue of what does good supervene on these characteristics?” we ultimately reach either a general principle or an individual paradigm. And Alston’s view is that it is no more arbitrary to invoke God as the supreme moral standard than it is to invoke some supreme moral principle. That is, the claim that good supervenes on God is no more arbitrary than the claim that it supervenes on some Platonic principle.
Robert Adams (1987) has offered a modified version of the Divine Command Theory, which a defender of the theory can appropriate in response to the Euthyphro Dilemma. Adams argues that a modified divine command theorist “wants to say…that an act is wrong if and only if it is contrary to God’s will or commands (assuming God loves us)” (121). Moreover, Adams claims that the following is a necessary truth: “Any action is ethically wrong if and only if it is contrary to the commands of a loving God” (132). On this modification of Divine Command Theory, actions, and perhaps intentions and individuals, possess the property of ethical wrongness, and this property is an objective property. That is, an action such as torturing someone for fun is ethically wrong, irrespective of whether anyone actually believes that it is wrong, and it is wrong because it is contrary to the commands of a loving God.
One could agree with this modification of Divine Command Theory, but disagree with the claim that it is a necessary truth that any action is ethically wrong if and only if it is contrary to the commands of a loving God. One might hold that this claim is a contingent truth, that is, that in the actual world, being contrary to the commands of a loving God is what constitutes ethical wrongness, but that there are other possible worlds in which ethical wrongness is not identified with being contrary to the commands of a loving God. It should be pointed out that for the theist who wants to argue from the existence of objective moral properties back to the existence of God, Adams’ stronger claim, namely, that an action is wrong if and only if it goes against the commands of a loving God, should be taken as a necessary truth, rather than a contingent one.
At any rate, whichever option a modified divine command theorist chooses, the modification at issue is aimed at avoiding both horns of the Euthyphro Dilemma. The first horn of the dilemma posed by Socrates to Euthyphro is that if an act is morally right because God commands it, then morality becomes arbitrary. Given this, we could be morally obligated to inflict cruelty upon others. The Modified Divine Command Theory avoids this problem, because morality is not based on the mere commands of God, but is rooted in the unchanging omnibenevolent nature of God. Hence, morality is not arbitrary nor would God command cruelty for its own sake, because God’s nature is fixed and unchanging, and to do so would violate it. It is not possible for a loving God to command cruelty for its own sake. The Modified Divine Command Theory is also thought to avoid the second horn of the Euthyphro Dilemma. God is the source of morality, because morality is grounded in the character of God. Moreover, God is not subject to a moral law that exists external to him. On the Modified Divine Command Theory, the moral law is a feature of God’s nature. Given that the moral law exists internal to God, in this sense, God is not subject to an external moral law, but rather is that moral law. God therefore retains his supreme moral and metaphysical status. Morality, for the modified divine command theorist, is ultimately grounded in the perfect nature of God.
Philip Quinn (1978, 1998) offers the following two statements, which he takes to be equivalent:
- The moral law imposes the obligation that p.
- God commands that p.
For Quinn, then, an agent is obliged to p just in case God commands that p. God is the source of moral obligation. Quinn illustrates and expands on this claim by examining scriptural stories in which God commands some action that apparently violates a previous divine command. Consider God’s command to the Israelites to plunder the Egyptians reported in Exodus 11:2. This seems to go against God’s previous command, contained within the Ten Commandments, against theft. One response to this offered by Quinn is to claim that since theft involves taking what is not due one, and God commanded the Israelites to plunder the Egyptians, their plunder of the Egyptians does not count as theft. The divine command makes obligatory an action that would have been wrong apart from that command. Such moral power is not available to human beings, because only God has such moral authority by virtue of the divine nature.
Elsewhere, Quinn (1979) considers a different relationship between divine commands and moral obligations. Rather than equivalence, Quinn offers a causal theory in which our moral obligations are created by divine commands or acts of will: “…a sufficient causal condition that it is obligatory that p is that God commands that p, and a necessary causal condition that it is obligatory that p is that God commands that p” (312).
Quinn’s accounts lead us to the question of the relationship between speech acts and obligations to act, discussed by philosophers such as Rawls (1999) and Searle (1969). Consider the act of making a promise. If S promises R to do a, is this sufficient for S incurring an obligation to do a? On the account offered by Rawls, under certain conditions, the answer is yes. Just as rules govern games, there is a public system of rules that governs the institution of promising, such that when S promises R to do a, the rule is that S ought to do a, unless certain conditions obtain which excuse S from this obligation. If S is to make a genuine promise that is morally binding, S must be fully conscious, rational, aware of the meaning and use of the relevant words, and free from coercion. For Rawls, promising allows us to enter into stable cooperative agreements that are mutually advantageous. If the institution of promise making is just, then Rawls argues that the principle of fairness applies. For Rawls, the principle of fairness states that “a person is required to do his part as defined by the rules of an institution when two conditions are met: first, the institution is just (or fair)…and second, one has voluntarily accepted the benefits of the arrangement or taken advantage of the opportunities it offers to further one’s interests” (96). If these conditions are met, then S does incur an obligation to do a by virtue of S’s promise to R.
What implications does the above have for Divine Command Theory? Speech acts can entail obligations, as we have seen with respect to the institution of promise making. However, the case of divine commands is asymmetrical to the case of promising. That is, rather than incurring obligations by our own speech acts, Divine Command Theory tells us that we incur obligations by the communicative acts of another, namely, God. How might this work?
An advocate of Divine Command Theory might argue that some of Rawls points apply to the obligations created by the communicative acts of God. For example, our divine command theorist might claim that if God commands S to do a, S must do a if S meets Rawls’ demands of full consciousness, rationality, awareness of the meaning and use of the relevant words, and freedom from coercion. The rule of fairness applies and its demands are satisfied, according to our divine command theorist, because she holds that the institution of obedience to God’s commands is just and fair, given God’s nature, and because S has voluntarily accepted the benefits of this arrangement with God or taken advantage of the opportunities afforded by the arrangement to further her own interests. So, if S has consented to be a follower of a particular religion, and if the requirements of that religion are just and fair, and if S benefits from this arrangement, then S can incur obligations via divine commands. The upshot is not that the foregoing religious and metaphysical claims are true, but rather that by applying some of Rawls’ claims about promise making, we are able to recognize a possible connection between divine commands and the obligation to perform an action. In the next section, Kai Nielsen challenges the truth of these claims, as well as the overall plausibility of Divine Command Theory.
In his Ethics Without God, Kai Nielsen (1973) argues against the Divine Command Theory and espouses the view that morality cannot be dependent on the will of God. Nielsen advances an argument for the claim that religion and morality are logically independent. Nielsen admits that it may certainly be prudent to obey the commands of any powerful person, including God. However, it does not follow that such obedience is morally obligatory. For a command of God’s to be relevant to our moral obligations in any particular instance, God must be good. And while the religious believer does maintain that God is good, Nielsen wants to know the basis for such a belief. In response, a believer might claim that she knows God is good because the Bible teaches this, or because Jesus embodied and displayed God’s goodness, or that the world contains evidence in support of the claim that God is good. However, these responses show that the believer herself has some logically prior criterion of goodness based on something apart from the mere fact that God exists or that God created the universe. Otherwise, how does she know that her other beliefs about the Bible, Jesus, or the state of the world support her belief that God is good? Alternatively, the religious believer might simply assert that the statement “God is good” is analytic, that is, that it is a truth of language. The idea here is that we are logically prohibited from calling any entity “God” if that entity is not good in the relevant sense. In this way, the claim “God is good” is similar to the claim “Bachelors are unmarried males.” But now another problem arises for the religious believer, according to Nielsen. In order to properly refer to some entity as “God,” we must already have an understanding of what it is for something to be good. We must already possess a criterion for making judgments of moral goodness, apart from the will of God. Put another way, when we say that we know God is good we must use some independent moral criterion to ground this judgment. So, morality is not based on God because we need a criterion of goodness that is not derived from God’s nature. It follows that God and morality are independent.
Nielsen considers another possibility that remains open to the divine command theorist: she might concede that ethics does not necessarily depend on God, but maintain that God is required for the existence of an adequate morality, that is, one that satisfies our most persistent moral demands. If we take happiness to be the ultimate aim of all human activity, then the ultimate aim of all of our moral activity is also happiness. The divine command theorist can then claim that the mistake of Nielsen and other secular moralists is that they fail to see that only in God can we as human beings find ultimate and lasting happiness. God gives purpose to our lives, and we are fulfilled in loving God. Given this fact of human nature, the divine command theorist can argue that only by faith in God can we find purpose in life. Goodness may not be identical with the will of God, but loving God is the reason we exist. On this account, we need God to be fulfilled and truly happy. We are secure in the knowledge that the universe is not against us, ultimately, but rather that God will guide us, protect us, and care for us. This frees us from anxiety, and enables us to direct our lives towards genuine happiness by living according to the will of God in friendship with God. While from a secular perspective it may seem irrational to live according to an other-regarding ethic, from the viewpoint of the religious believer it is rational because it fulfills our human nature and makes us genuinely happy.
In response to this, Nielsen argues that we simply do not have evidence for the existence of God. Without such evidence, the religious believer’s claim that human nature is truly fulfilled in relationship to God is groundless (for more on the issues Nielsen raises, see Moreland and Nielsen, 1990). Moreover, people can, have, and do live purposeful lives apart from belief in God. Religious faith is not necessary for having a life of purpose. Nielsen adds the skeptical doubt that human beings do not have any ultimate function that we must fulfill to be truly happy. We were not made for anything. This realization need not lead us to nihilism, however. For Nielsen, the notion that in order to have a purpose for our lives there must be a God trades on a confusion. Nielsen argues that even if there is no purpose of life, there can still be a purpose in life. While there may not be a purpose for humans qua humans, we can still have purpose in another sense. That is, we can have purpose in life because we have goals, intentions, and motives. Life is purposeless in the larger sense, but in this more restricted sense it is not, and so things matter to us, even if God does not exist. Life has no Purpose, but our lives can still have purpose. A divine command theorist would likely challenge Nielsen’s view that purpose in the latter sense is sufficient for human flourishing.
An implication of the Modified Divine Command Theory is that God would not, and indeed cannot, command cruelty for its own sake. Some would argue that this implication is inconsistent with the belief that God is omnipotent. How could there be anything that an all-powerful being cannot do?
In his discussion of the omnipotence of God, Thomas Aquinas responds to this understanding of omnipotence, and argues that it is misguided. Aquinas argues that we must consider “the precise meaning of ‘all’ when we say that God can do all things” (First Part, Question 25, Article 3). For Aquinas, to say that God can do all things is to say that he can do all things that are possible, and not those that are impossible. For example, God cannot make a round corner, because this is absolutely impossible. Since “a round corner” is a contradiction in terms, it is better to say that making a round corner cannot be done, rather than God cannot make such a thing. This response, however, is insufficient for the issue at hand, namely, that on a Modified Divine Command Theory, God would not and cannot command cruelty for its own sake. There is no logical contradiction in terms here, as there is in the case of the round corner. Aquinas offers a further response to this sort of challenge to God’s omnipotence. His view is that “to sin is to fall short of a perfect action; which is repugnant to omnipotence” (Ibid). For Aquinas, there is something about the nature of sin (a category in which commanding cruelty for its own sake would fall) that is contrary to omnipotence. Hence, that God cannot do immoral actions is not a limit on his power, but rather it is entailed by his omnipotence. Aquinas’ view is that God cannot command cruelty because he is omnipotent.
On Divine Command Theory, it problematically appears that God’s goodness consists in God doing whatever he wills to do. This problem has been given voice by Leibniz (1951), and has recently been discussed by Quinn (1978), Wierenga (1989), Alston (1989), and Wainright (2005). The problem is this: if what it means for an action to be morally required is that it be commanded by God, then God’s doing what he is obligated to do is equivalent to his doing what he commands himself to do. This, however, is incoherent. While it makes sense to conceive of God as forming an intention to do an action, or judging that it would be good to do an action, the notion that he commands himself to do an action is incoherent. Moreover, on Divine Command Theory, God could not be seen as possessing moral virtues, because a moral virtue would be a disposition to do an action that God commands. This is also incoherent.
In response, divine command theorists have argued that they can still make sense of God’s goodness, by pointing out that he possesses traits which are good as distinguished from being morally obligatory. For example, God may be disposed to love human beings, treat them with compassion, and deal with them fairly. These dispositions are good, even if they are not grounded in a disposition to obey God. And if we take these dispositions to be essential to God’s nature, that is, if they are possessed by God in every possible world in which God exists, then, as Wierenga (1989) points out, while it is still the case that whatever God does is good, “the range of ‘whatever God were to do’ includes no actions for which God would not be praiseworthy” (p. 222). Wainright (2005) explains further that while it is true that the moral obligatoriness of truth telling could not have been God’s reason for commanding it, the claim that God does not have moral reasons for commanding it does not follow. This is because the moral goodness of truth telling is a sufficient reason for God to command it. Once God does command it, truth telling is not only morally good, but it also becomes morally obligatory, on Divine Command Theory.
The idea that to be morally mature, one must freely decide which moral principles will govern one’s life serves as an objection to Divine Command Theory, because on the theory it is not our own wills that govern our moral lives, but the will of God. We are no longer self-legislating beings in the moral realm, but instead followers of a moral law imposed on us from the outside. In this sense, autonomy is incompatible with Divine Command Theory, insofar as on the theory we do not impose the moral law upon ourselves. However, Adams (1999) argues that Divine Command Theory and moral responsibility are compatible, because we are responsible for obeying or not obeying God’s commands, correctly understanding and applying them, and adopting a self-critical stance with respect to what God has commanded us to do. Given this, we are autonomous because we must rely on our own independent judgments about God’s goodness and what moral laws are in consistent with God’s commands. Additionally, it seems that a divine command theorist can still say that we impose the moral law on ourselves by our agreeing to subject ourselves to it once we come to understand it, even if it ultimately is grounded in God’s commands.
The last objection to note is that given the variety and number of religions in the world, how does the divine command theorist know which (putatively) divine commands to follow? The religions of the world often give conflicting accounts of the nature and content of the commands of God. Moreover, even if such a person believes that her religion is correct, there remains a plurality of understandings within religious traditions with respect to what God commands us to do. In response, some of the issues raised above regarding autonomy are relevant. A divine command theorist must decide for herself, based on the available evidence, which understanding of the divine to adopt and which understanding of divine commands within her particular tradition she finds to be the most compelling. This is similar to the activity and deliberation of a secular moralist who must also decide for herself, among a plurality of moral traditions and interpretations within those traditions, which moral principles to adopt and allow to govern her life. This takes us into another problem for divine command theory, namely, that it is only those who follow the correct religion, and the correct interpretation of that religion, that are moral, which seems highly problematic. However, Divine Command Theory is consistent with the belief that numerous religions contain moral truth, and that we can come to know our moral obligations apart from revelation, tradition, and religious practice. For example, a divine command theorist could grant that a philosophical naturalist may come to see that beneficence is intrinsically good through a rational insight into the necessary character of reality (see Austin, 2003). It is consistent with Divine Command Theory that we can come to see our obligations in this and many other ways, and not merely through a religious text, religious experience, or religious tradition.
In his A Just Society (2004), Michael Boylan argues that we must engage in self-analysis for the purpose of both constructing and implementing a personal plan of life that is coherent, comprehensive, and good. In this activity, we must recognize that there are many types of values by which we live, including but not limited to religious, ethical, and aesthetic values. Of particular interest in this context is Boylan’s discussion of God’s command to Abraham to kill Isaac. Here we have a conflict between the religious and the ethical. Boylan notes that in the story, Abraham does not kill Isaac, but if he had his community must judge him to be a murderer. The reason for this is that Abraham’s community does not know whether the command to kill Isaac was a legitimate divine command, or some delusion of Abraham’s. So, this community must depend upon the ethical prohibition against murder when evaluating Abraham’s actions. Boylan’s position contrasts with Kierkegaard’s, who is generally interpreted as believing that Abraham’s action is justified by a suspension of the ethical, so that in this case the religious trumps the ethical. However, in such disputes, Boylan argues that when the commands of religion (or the values of aesthetics) clash with the demands of morality, in a just society morality should win the day.
Regardless of what one makes of this, when evaluating the philosophical merits and drawbacks of Divine Command Theory, one should take a broad perspective and consider the possible connections between the theory and other religious and moral issues, as well as the relevant aesthetic, epistemic, and metaphysical questions, in order to develop a personal plan of life that is coherent, comprehensive, and good.
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Michael W. Austin
Eastern Kentucky University
Last updated: August 21, 2006 | Originally published: August/21/2006
Categories: Philosophy of Religion