Thomas Reid: Theory of Action

Reid pictureThomas Reid (1710-1796) made important contributions to the fields of epistemology and philosophy of mind, and is often regarded as the founder of the common sense school of philosophy. However, he also offered key arguments and observations concerning human agency and morality.

Reid carefully criticized the views of his contemporaries, and defended an account of human freedom in which he argues that only beings endowed with will and understanding, who also have power over their will and actions, and who are directed by motives and reasons, are agents, beings capable of acting freely. Agents are, in Reid’s terms, efficient causes of some of their actions, causing them by exerting their power to act. To say that an agent possesses active power is, for Reid, to say that the agent is capable of exerting a productive capacity and that in such cases it is really up to the agent to produce or to refrain from producing the actions which the agent has the power to produce. Reid presents this theory of action and human liberty primarily in his last published work, the Essays on the Active Powers of Man (1788).

Reid argues that human beings have power not only over their actions, but also over their choices and intentions. Reid therefore opposes what he calls the system of necessity, and openly challenges the views of philosophers such as John Locke, Joseph Priestley, Anthony Collins, and David Hume; who tend to share the view that human beings have freedom over their actions but not over their wills.

In the Essays on the Active Powers of Man, Reid develops his theory of action around an examination of active power, of the will, of human motives and beliefs, and around a defense of his account of human freedom.

Table of Contents

  1. On Active Power
    1. On the Notion of Power
    2. Active Power, Will, and Understanding
      1. General Observations Concerning Active Power
      2. Agents with Active Power are Endowed with Will and Understanding
  2. Of the Will
    1. General Observations
    2. Voluntary Operations of the Mind
  3. The Principles of Action or Motives
    1. Mechanical Principles
    2. Animal Principles
    3. Rational Principles
    4. Influence of Motives on the Will
  4. On Moral Liberty
    1. The Notion of Moral Liberty
    2. Of Causes
      1. Efficient Causes and First Principles
      2. Physical Causes
      3. Principles of Action and Causation
    3. The Problem of Infinite Regress
    4. First Argument for Moral Liberty
    5. Second Argument for Moral Liberty
    6. Third Argument for Moral Liberty
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. On Active Power

a. On the Notion of Power

Reid writes in the first essay of the Essays on the Active Powers that active power is the power of acting—the power of producing a work of art or of labor (EAP, 12). Reid starts his book by arguing that, contrary to what David Hume had defended (T.1.3.14), human beings have an idea of power. In order to show that we do have such a notion, Reid observes that the ideas of acting and being acted upon are found very early and universally in the minds of children. If one is able to form the thought of hitting or of being hit upon, and if all languages have active and passives voices, Reid argues, then one must be able to form the ideas of activity and of passivity (EAP, 13). Moreover, Reid contends that all humans have the notion of active power because many ordinary operations of mind imply a belief in active power, both in ourselves and in others. Actions such as deliberations, purposes, making promises, counsels, encouragements and commands imply, Reid writes, the belief that we have some degree of power over these operations and over their effects.

When Reid writes that humans have an idea or a notion of power, he means that humans have at least a conception of power. Conception, for Reid, is a term of art that should not be understood in the Kantian sense of subsuming some object under a particular concept, or as predicating some quality to the object. To the contrary, conception, for Reid, is one of the most basic cognitive capacities, whereby beings (both humans and some non-human animals) hold something in mind without predicating anything to it. The being grasps the object by holding it in mind without thinking anything about or of the object. Reid thinks that human beings all have, at the very least, a conception of power—even though they often also form more complex beliefs or judgments about power.

Hume, Reid points out, argues that since the notion of power is neither produced by sensation nor reflection, and since we cannot properly define the notion, then we have no such idea (EAP, 24). Reid, in reply, points out that although we do not directly perceive an agent’s power, we are nonetheless conscious of our exertions of power. Moreover, even though ‘power’ cannot be defined by appealing to more general or more simple categories, one may still form a conception of power from its effects, and one may still offer observations about its attributes and qualities. Reid therefore writes that since we do have a notion of power we may now study its characteristics. The first attribute Reid observes is that active power only exists in beings with will and understanding.

b. Active Power, Will, and Understanding

Reid turns to the question of whether beings who have active power could at the same time lack understanding and will (EAP 27). We cannot answer this question, Reid points out, by observing changes in nature since we do not perceive the agent nor the power behind these changes (more on changes in nature in section 4.b.ii). Reid writes that it is better to turn our attention to human agents, since, in agreement with Locke, Reid points out that our first ideas of power are taken from the power we find ourselves experiencing when we produce changes in our bodies and in the world around us (EAP, 20).

i. General Observations Concerning Active Power

By turning our view to our own exertions of power we notice, according to Reid, that power is brought into action by volition. A person’s capacity to act is actualized by exerting that power. There are many times when a person may not use his or her capacity to act. However, Reid argues, when they do exert that power, it is because the agents willed, at some point, to perform the action either immediately or later in time. An agent’s power, Reid writes, “is measured by what he can do if he will” (Of Power 10). For Reid, we notice that our willings or choices are exertions of power when we turn our attention to them. Opinions vary about Reid’s use of various terms related to volition, but one way to understand Reid is to think of volitions as willings, choices, or decisions. And, for Reid we are conscious that our choices are something over which we have some control. When we chose to do something immediately, the choice (or volition) “is accompanied with an effort to execute that which we willed” (EAP, 50). We may not always pay attention to this effort, but, Reid continues, “this effort we are conscious of, if we will but give attention to it; and there is nothing in which we are in a stricter sense active” (EAP, 51). Reid’s view, therefore, is that choices or willings are exertions of power, they are mental events through which the agent puts his or her power into action, and agents are conscious of these exertions of power.

Reid’s account is hence different from an account such as the one Thomas Hobbes defended, where an agent is free or has active power (freedom) to perform an action if he willed to perform the action. If the agent wills to perform the action, but is prohibited from performing it, then the agent is not free, according to the Hobbesian picture (Hobbes, 1648, 240). Reid, however, contends that an agent is free not only to act if he willed to act, but that the agent is also free to will or to refrain from willing. The anti-Hobbesian view Reid defends is that an agent is not free unless he has power over his willing or refraining from willing. First, Reid argues, we have an idea of power that implies having control or power over our choices, and this belief is presupposed in many other beliefs, and in our everyday actions (see previous section and arguments for moral liberty). Second, Reid observes that we are conscious of the effort we exert when we choose. The exertion of power is the object of consciousness, which we directly observe if we carefully attend to the objects of our consciousness.

ii. Agents with Active Power are Endowed with Will and Understanding

That beings with active power possess a will follows immediately, Reid holds, from his claim that the power to act implies the power to will. Reid develops his argument for this claim in several steps. First, we are conscious of having power over many of our actions: over the movements of our bodies, and the movements of our minds. Second, for Reid, having power over an end such as an external action that depends on our will requires having power over the actions of the agents which bring about the end. Reid writes that the action or effect an agent produces “cannot be in his power unless all the means necessary to its production be in his power” (EAP, 203). By ‘necessary means’ Reid does not refer to all the involuntary physical or biological events that are necessary conditions for performing the action. After all, he writes that the man who intends to shoot his neighbor dead is the cause of the death, but “he neither gave to the ball its velocity, nor to the power its expansive force, nor to the flint and steel the power to strike fire…” (EAP, 41). The velocity of the ball is not something that is in the agent’s power, even though it is a necessary condition for the killing of the man. The choice and intention of the agent, however, are events over which the agent does have power (1.b.i).

Reid’s third step, therefore, is the premise that choices and intentions are actions; they are mental events over which the agent has power—the evidence for this claim is that agents are conscious of the effort of exerting their power when they choose. Furthermore, choices and intentions are necessary means to performing effects. Hume’s predecessors all agreed that we have power over our actions or effects. Reid, therefore, points out that “to say that what depends upon the will is in a man’s power, but the will is not in his power, is to say that the end is in his power, but the means necessary to that end are not in his power, which is a contradiction” (EAP, 201). For Reid, this statement follows from the claim that willings (choices) are actions. If an agent has the power to perform an external action A, then the agent has the power to perform another external action B required to perform A. But if an internal action C is required to perform A, then the agent who has the power to perform A, also has the power to C. Reid’s conclusion, therefore, is that agents who must carry out a chain of actions in order to perform an end must have the power over each specific action (including volitions) in the chain of actions in order to perform the end (see Yaffe 2004, chapter 1, for a more complete development of this argument).

Now, if the performance of an external action requires having power over the internal action of choosing, then the power to act requires having a will. Only agents with a will are capable of willing. This does not mean that all beings with a will have power over their wills. After all, some animals might be endowed with a will and act voluntarily but not have power to control their will. But having power over one’s will implies having a will. For Reid, therefore, human beings who are able to have some control over their actions and choices, who have active power, must be endowed with a will.

According to Reid, active power or human freedom requires having, not only a will, but also understanding to direct that will. To reach this conclusion Reid argues it is important to observe that the power to will implies the power to refrain from willing. To have control over our choices and to observe that our choices are exertions of active power leads to the observation that in many cases we are free to will or to refrain from willing. This is what Reid means we he argues that we have power over our actions. Actions (external actions or internal willings)—as long as they are truly the agent’s actions—are capacities to act or to refrain from acting. The inability to refrain from acting is the consequence of forces with respect to which an agent is passive. Reid therefore writes that

If, in any action [an agent] had the power to will what he did, or not to will it, in that action he is free. But if, in every voluntary action, the determination of his will be the necessary consequence of something involuntary in the state of mind, or of something in his external circumstances, he is not free; he has not what I call the liberty of a moral agent, but is subject to necessity. (EAP, 197)

To be active, for Reid, requires the ability to will and to refrain from willing to perform an action. The two way power of willing and refraining from willing defines a person’s capacity to truly have control over his choices and actions.

If active power is a power to will and to refrain from willing, Reid thinks only beings with understanding could have such a two-way power. This two-way power implies the capacity to weigh reasons, or at least to be able to act in light of a reason, or against some good reason, and this would require possessing intellectual capacities. Hence liberty, Reid writes, “implies, not only a conception of what he wills, but some degree of practical judgment or reason” (EAP, 196). The power to act, therefore, implies the power to will. The power to will together with the capacity to weigh reasons and act in light of them or not (the ability to will and to refrain from willing for certain reasons), require that the being with active power be endowed with both a will and some degree of understanding.

2. Of the Will

a. General Observations

Reid introduces his essay on the will (Essay II of EAP,) by pointing out that the will is the power to determine to act or to refrain from acting. If active power is the power to act freely, to have power or control of the direction of (some of) our thoughts, of our bodies, and to initiate changes outside of us, the will seems to be simply the capacity to determine, that is, to choose, to decide, and to intend a certain course of action. Since we have no direct knowledge of the will other than by its effects, Reid focuses his discussion on what he calls ‘volitions,’ a term that refers to the acts of the will.

Reid continues by describing five essential qualities of every act of will. First, acts of will are about something—they have an object. The person who wills must will something, Reid writes, and this implies being able to have a conception of what is willed, and an intention to carry out what is willed. Acts of will produce voluntary actions, and what distinguishes them from things done by instinct or from habit is precisely that voluntary actions involve a conception and intention, whereas things done instinctively do not require any thought or intention.

Second, the object of will must be some action of the person who wills. For Reid, this is what distinguishes willings (acts of will) from commands and desire. We may desire things that are not within our power, and we may command others to do things we do not desire them to do (think of the judge who commands that one be punished even though he or she does not desire that the criminal be punished). Acts of will, for Reid, are therefore to be distinguished from desires. Third, the object of the act of will must be something we believe to be in our power and to depend upon our will (EP 50). If one loses the power to speak, for instance, and if one believes one has no such power, one does not will to speak—only to try to speak if recovery, say, is possible.

Fourth, Reid points out that the volition to act immediately is accompanied with an effort to do what is willed. We might not always be conscious of this effort, especially when the action is easy, but Reid thinks we might still notice and be conscious of the effort involved if we are attentive to what is happening when we determine to act. Finally, Reid observes that in decisions and intentions that are important to an agent, there is always some motive or reason that influences and inclines the agent in willing one way or another. Unimportant actions might not be performed for particular reasons, but actions that are wise, virtuous, and meaningful are performed for reasons (they are motivated by rational principles of action; see section 3.c).

b. Voluntary Operations of the Mind

The intellect and the will are, Reid writes, always conjoined in the operations of the human mind (as far as we know). Even acts usually attributed to the understanding only, like perceiving and remembering, for instance, involve some degree of activity. Conversely, every act of will involves at least some conception, intention, belief, and often also some belief about the value or worth of the action. These operations clearly involve the understanding, Reid points out (EAP 60).

Reid writes that there are three operations of the mind that have mistakenly been thought to be intellectual operations only. Reid, however, holds that these operations are also active capacities. These voluntary operations he has in mind are attention, deliberation, and fixed purposes. It is important for Reid to show the voluntary aspect of these operations because they are involved in a person’s character traits and personalities. Reid’s ‘necessitarian’ opponents might think persons have no control over their personalities, but, for Reid, since the operations involved in them are active then persons will have some degree of control and hence responsibility over them.

The first voluntary operation Reid discusses is attention. The attention we might give to a subject or to an action for the most part depends upon our will. For Reid this does not mean, however, that attention is completely within the control of agents and that attention is always the result of an act of will. To the contrary, attention is often the involuntary result of some impulse or habit. Our passions and affections direct our attention to the objects that move them. Still, Reid holds, the attention one finds oneself to have may be changed or focused. Even though the wonderful smell of the garden draws my attention to it as I walk past, the act of stopping to consider the garden and to really pay attention to it is an act of the will, Reid argues. Since attention is a voluntary act, Reid will later be in a position to argue that “we ought to use the best means we can to be well informed of our duty, by serious attention to moral instruction…” (EAP, 271).

The next voluntary operation of the mind Reid discusses is deliberation. Genuine human actions are not always the result of deliberation. One may act freely out of a fixed resolution or habit to act virtuously, for instance. Moreover, one may not always have time to deliberate. And one does not deliberate in cases that are perfectly clear: “no man deliberates,” Reid writes, “whether he ought to choose happiness or misery” (EAP, 63). But when the times permits, and when the situation is unclear, then a person might deliberate. Deliberation, for Reid, is the exercise of the agent’s capacity to consider various reasons, various desires, or various feelings and affections that move him to perform a particular action or set of actions. Deliberation is an active capacity to consider outcomes and motives and then to determine to act according to, or against, some of these reasons. Since deliberation is an active operation, Reid will later be able to show that we have a duty to deliberate coolly and impartially about our actions.

Finally, fixed purposes and resolutions are also, and essentially, active operations of the mind according to Reid. He distinguishes them from volitions or determinations to act immediately. They are, rather, intentions to act at a distance. One may decide to perform a single action in the future, or one may resolve to follow a course of actions, or to pursue some general end. In fact, Reid’s view is that the general purposes and fixed resolutions of agents are the basis of the character traits of agents. Character traits, as opposed to natural tempers, are for Reid general and regular tendencies to act in a certain manner, and the tendencies result from the person’s resolution or purpose to act according to some plan or rule. A person who is a person of virtue, for instance, is a person who formed the resolution to be a person of virtue (EAP, 69), Reid writes. This resolution will express itself in the person’s general and regular tendency (the character trait) to act virtuously. Ultimately, therefore, the character traits of agents are based in voluntary determinations of the agent’s will. And a person’s constancy or steadiness depends on the person’s commitment to the person’s general purposes and resolutions. When an agent resolves to act according to his principles, this resolution is clearly an act of will, Reid argues. Reid concludes by pointing out that since resolution is a voluntary act, over which we have some control, it may therefore properly be a virtue, whereas willfulness, inflexibility and obstinacy may properly be recognized as vices.

3. The Principles of Action or Motives

It is vital, Reid maintains, to have a correct understanding of the various motives or incitements to act, because without these active power would be utterly useless and fickle. Whatever incites us to act is, according to Reid, a principle of action. By ‘principle of action’ Reid means the last answer to the ‘why did you act?’ question. For Reid, motives or principles of action are not instrumental means to reaching some further end (EAP, 110). Principles of action are motives for actions pursued for no further reason, or which are desired for no further end or purpose.

For Reid it is important to pay close attention to those principles on which human beings do or could act—recognizing that humans often act from a variety of principles concurring in one direction.  A correct account of the various motives or principles of action will help us understand the character of the action performed: whether it is instinctive, meaningful, the outcome of some natural affection, intelligible, meaningful, wise, virtuous, etc. (EAP, 75).

Reid categorizes these principles into three classes: the mechanical, the animal, and the rational principles of action.

a. Mechanical Principles

Mechanical principles of action are motives that influence beings to act and which do not require any thought or intention. Reid writes that they require no attention, no deliberation, no will, no conception and no intention. They are completely blind impulses. Among the collection of mechanical motives, Reid points out, we find instincts and habits. Instincts are blind tendencies that are natural, found early in animals and humans, and which do not require repeated use in order to motivate. The fact that infants cry when they are hurt, that they are afraid when left alone, that they are terrified by an angry tone of voice but soothed by soft and gentle voices, are the result, according to Reid, of such mechanical instincts (EAP, 79). Brute animals are also moved to perform amazing accomplishments (like honey combs or spider webs) from mere instinct, without any intelligence of the mechanics or mathematics displayed by their artworks. Another instinct Reid observes in both humans and animals is the instinct of imitation. And even belief, in the early part of our lives, is guided by instinct and imitation, Reid points out.

Human beings can also learn to perform an action easily, without any thought, by having performed the action frequently, as well as by the natural instinct to imitate others. The habit or facility to perform an action is therefore a mechanical principle, according to Reid. Speaking, writing, riding a bicycle are, Reid points out, often performed blindly by those who have developed the habit of such activities (EAP, 88-90). These actions are carried out involuntarily and without any particular intention. The mechanical principle of habit will therefore be of great help, according to Reid, in developing the habit of performing those types of action a person has resolved to perform. Certain character traits, Reid holds, are the effect of a person’s fixed resolutions or purposes. These fixed resolutions and the actions one performs in line with them are, for Reid, voluntary operations (see 2.b.). But when these actions are performed regularly, the mechanical principle of habit helps agents acquire a facility to perform them.

b. Animal Principles

The second category of principles of action are those that Reid calls ‘animal’ because, he holds, we have them in common with many brute animals (EAP, 92). Among the animal motives, Reid notes the appetites (hunger, thirst, lust), constant desires (such as a desire for knowledge, power and esteem), benevolent affections (gratitude, love, parental affection, pity, esteem, friendship, and public spirit), and malevolent affections (emulation and resentment).

Reid argues that animal motives move all human beings who are capable of having thoughts, even though an animal motive is of a more instinctive sort when it is at work in animals and small children. When animal motives move and influence a being, the mental state which is, at the very least, required, is a conception of the object or action toward which the being is moved. Conception is the bare minimum mental capacity necessary in order to be moved by animal motives, but animal motives may require in many cases forming beliefs (propositional attitudes), or even forming beliefs about value. Esteem for the wise, for instance, may require believing that the person esteemed is wise, virtuous, or acted in an estimable manner. Animals may have an instinctive kind of admiration or affection for its master, but it does not involve thinking of its master as wise, virtuous, or kind. According to Reid, the mental capacities of animals is smaller than those of humans, and animals consider actions only, and not the intentions of others. A motive such as gratitude, for instance, is observable in the dog who is “kindly affected to him who feeds it” (EAP 115), even though the person is about to kill it. Humans who are moved by gratitude, however, have in mind the intention of the benefactor, and the gratitude of humans suppose beliefs such as that the action of the benefactor goes beyond what justice or morality requires (Ibid.).

Reid’s understanding of the nature of beliefs is not always clearly expressed. He often writes of beliefs in the same way he writes of judgments, where “the objects of judgment” are “expressed by a proposition”, but at other times he writes of belief as an attitude (belief, disbelief or doubt) about that judgment or proposition, and which accompanies the judgment (EAP, 347). Reid, furthermore, thinks that animals of the most sagacious kind are capable of having conceptions of states of affairs, but he is unsure whether they are capable of forming beliefs. He writes in one place that he thinks brutes do not have opinions (EAP, 147), but he writes in another passage that brutes have instinctive beliefs, and, he points out: “Whether brutes have anything that can properly be called belief, I cannot say; but their actions shew something that looks very like it” (EAP, 86). In any case, whether or not they are capable of having beliefs, Reid points out, “it will be granted, that opinion in men has a much wider field than in brutes” (EAP, 147). Only the beliefs of human beings, Reid points out, involve evaluations, values, and reasoning about laws and systems. Animal motives (appetites, desires, affections) are present both in animals and in human beings. However, when they move animals and small children they are more simple mental operations, more similar to the mechanical motives, whereas when they are at work in adult human motivation they usually involve higher mental capacities.

Reid understands animal motives as desire/object pairs. He writes that animal motives always involve a desire for some object and sometimes—but not always—a sensation or feeling which is typical of each desire. Reid calls all animal motives animal or natural desires, since they all aim to achieve or attain some object or end.

Furthermore, according to Reid, each natural animal motive or natural desire has its own natural object (EAP, 113). Desires for the good of certain persons, desires for knowledge, desires for power, etc. imply a state or mental act in the agent who desires and some object desired. Reid writes, for example, that when we come to realize that food will satisfy our hunger, the desire and its object “remain through life inseparable. And we give the name of hunger to the principle that is made up of both” (EAP, 93). It is therefore natural, according to Reid, to describe each animal motive either in terms of the desire or mental state involved, or in terms of the end desired.

c. Rational Principles

Reid observes that human beings are not only moved by passions, affections or desires, but also by a third important class of motives, which he calls ‘the rational principles of action.’ Reid further distinguishes between two different rational principles of action: our overall good, and our duty. Reid calls these ‘rational’ because “they can have no existence in beings not endowed with reason, and, in all their exertions, require, not only intention and will, but judgment or reason” (EAP, 154).

The first rational motive, a regard for our good as a whole, which Reid also characterizes as regard for one’s overall interest or happiness, is a rational motive because only beings with reason are able to consider and be moved by what is their overall good. Reid observes that being motivated by our overall happiness requires the ability to compare actions and to determine the possible outcomes and consequences of future courses of action. Directing our actions in order to aim at our overall happiness therefore clearly requires having rational capacities.

The second rational motive, a regard for duty, also involves the rational capacity to form judgments or evaluations of what one ought, morally, to do. Agents must have the rational capacities to consider existing actions and agents, to see that this action is morally good, and that one wrong, and hence to form specific and particular estimations of the moral quality of actions and of persons. Agents must also have the capacity to form general principles or axioms such as “what is in no degree voluntary, can neither deserve moral approbation nor blame” (EAP, 271), or “we ought to act that part towards another, which we would judge to be right in him to act towards us, if we were in his circumstances and he in ours” (EAP, 274). Forming these beliefs requires a minimum level of rational capacities, for Reid, but also, and more importantly, a moral faculty or sense, which he also calls ‘conscience.’ These capacities are required to be able to judge that a future action is one we should perform.

If animal principles are best understood as desire/object pairs, rational motives, rather, are best understood in terms of the end, object or state of affairs, to which they aim rather than as the mental state required in order to be moved toward that end (Yaffe 2004, 108). It is true that Reid often speaks in a language that implies that rational principles are some kind of mental state. After all, Reid often writes that rational principles of action imply a belief or judgment about what is good: prudentially or morally. And it is easy to conclude that the motive is the belief, thought, judgment or conviction itself rather than the end that is pursued. However, as Yaffe points out, when Reid seems to hold such a view it is because he is emphasizing the point that in order to move us, ends must bear a special relation to us. An end is a reason for me only if I think of that end and if I think of my future actions as bearing the relevant kind of relation to me and to the end (Yaffe 2004, 108).

When an agent is moved by the motive of duty, the agent is moved by a future ideal or by a future state of affairs that will instantiate that ideal. The agent, for instance, recognizes that an action that does not yet exist is one he ought to bring about because the action is conducive to duty. Ultimately, for Reid, the motive does not depend on the agent’s desires since an agent might not desire to do what he thinks he ought to do.

For Reid animal motives, or passions in general, serve an important purpose and are good and useful parts of human and animal nature. These motives, when they are not deformed by bad education and bad habits, are often conducive to virtue (Kroeker 2011). However, if there is a conflict between animal and rational motives, the rational ones have the final word, according to Reid. Rational principles are simply better guides to what is wise and virtuous since they require knowing not only what we naturally desire but also what, in the long term, will be better, would fulfill moral laws and requirements, or would bring about that which is valuable. By their moral sense, in fact, human beings recognize the value and worth of their natural animal motives, and they might also consider which course of action, whether with or without the influence of animal motives, would be morally valuable. By adopting such a position, Reid clearly opposes the view of David Hume who holds that all motives are passions, and that ultimate ends are determined by human desires and not by the intrinsic value or worth of future courses of action (T 3.1 and EPM 161).

d. Influence of Motives on the Will

Reid further distances himself from the Humean position and from the position of philosophers such as Anthony Collins and Joseph Priestley (as well as Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Baruch Spinoza and perhaps David Hartley) by claiming that motives do not causally necessitate the agent’s choices, intentions and actions. Rather, Reid argues that motives influence the agent in his or her volitions.

Animal motives and rational motives, Reid observes, influence agents in different ways. Animal motives, or what has commonly been called ‘passion,’ draw us “toward a certain object, without any farther view, by a kind of violence, a violence which indeed, may be resisted if the man is master of himself, but cannot be resisted without a struggle” (EAP, 55-56). These passions move us easily, and counterbalance the defects of our wisdom and virtue, Reid points out. For example, we often eat out of mere hunger, without any thought about what is wise or good for us, or without any thought about the quality of the object. In fact, Reid points out that it is often difficult to answer questions about what we should eat, how much, and how often. If we had to reason about such questions, we would often fail to be moved to eat. These passions, therefore, serve to preserve the human species, and to help us perform tasks (EAP, 52). Passions may be stronger or weaker, but an effort is always required to resist them. Two passions may move a being in contrary ways. In animals and in humans who do not have time to deliberate or think about what they are doing, the strongest passion may prevail (EAP, 53). But human beings are usually able to form some judgment about what they are doing, and to weigh goods and evils. Human beings are therefore usually passive in part, and active in part. When the passion is irresistible or when there is no time to determine, human beings are mostly passive. But when the person is able to deliberate calmly and impartially, and to determine according to distant goods and values (and not only in terms of present gratification), the active power of the person is increased.

Rational principles of action never causally determine an agent’s choices and intentions. They function like advice or like the testimony of various parties in front of a judge. They leave a person completely at liberty to choose and to determine (EAP, 59). By the rational principles of action, Reid writes, we judge “what ends are most worthy to be pursued, how far every appetite and passion may be indulged, and when it ought to be resisted” (EAP, 56). Therefore, both kinds of principles of action move us in different ways. The phenomenology involved is different in both cases. Passions are felt like forces that push us, whereas the rational principles are felt like arguments or advice, which may, at the most, produce a cool conviction of what we ought to do.

4. On Moral Liberty

a. The Notion of Moral Liberty

According to Reid, moral liberty is the agent’s power to act. Moral liberty and active power are therefore identical for Reid (see section 1 for more on active power). Moreover, moral liberty is more than the power an agent has over his or her voluntary actions. It is also power over “the determinations of his own will” (EAP, 196). Here Reid distinguishes between merely voluntary actions and free voluntary actions. Small children and animals, Reid observes, may act voluntarily if their actions are the result of their choices and intentions. However, their voluntary actions are determined by the strongest passion, appetite, affection or habit. Brute animals, Reid writes, lack moral government, which is the control one has to choose according to what one thinks is best or required. These beings, Reid continues, have no conception of a law or of a guide to action by which they could direct or fail to direct their choices and actions (EAP, 197). Instead of being guided by the moral law they are guided, blindly, by the physical laws that govern their constitution, in the same manner as the inanimate creation is governed by physical laws. Hence, since they cannot form the conception of what is best or required, they cannot govern their choices accordingly. Since their voluntary actions are the result of choices that are causally determined by physical laws, Reid concludes that they lack moral liberty.

Moral liberty, Reid contends, is a two-way power to will or not to will something (see 1.b). Reid holds that agents who possess moral liberty must not only be capable of following rules, guidelines, advice and arguments, they must also be capable of disobeying these directives (EAP, 200).  One may imagine, Reid writes, some puppet that is endowed with understanding and will, but who has no degree of active power. This puppet, Reid points out, would be an intelligent machine, but it would still be subject to the same laws of motion as inanimate matter (EAP, 222). The puppet, that is, would be incapable of disobeying these laws. But being incapable of disobedience implies, Reid holds, that the puppet is not active in its obedience – it does not even obey in the proper sense of the term. To be free, or to possess active power in Reid’s sense, would mean that the puppets’ obedience is obedience in the proper sense; “it must therefore be their own act and deed, and consequently they must have power to obey or disobey” (EAP, 222). When agents act freely, their actions are truly up to them, and hence they must be capable of willing and of refraining from willing the action they perform. Free actions, for Reid, are the effects of the agent’s exertion (putting into effect) of his active power. He writes that it is “the exertion of active power we call action” (EAP, 13). For Reid, therefore, only actions that are produced by an agent’s exertion of this kind of active power are genuine, free, actions.

b. Of Causes

i. Efficient Causes and First Principles

According to Reid, we all have an idea of productive causes. These productive or efficient causes, for Reid, are causes that have the power to bring about certain events. Efficient causes have the power to produce changes. Efficient causes are therefore very different in nature from events that constantly precede or follow other events in nature. Events in nature, humans come to realize, are passive rather than active. “Instead of moving voluntarily, we find them to be moved necessarily; instead of acting, we find them to be acted upon…” Reid writes (EAP, 207). Moreover, Reid points out that constant conjunction does not link true causes with effects. Priestley and Hume, Reid writes, define a cause as a circumstance that is constantly followed by a certain event (EAP, 205). Reid disagrees—he holds that genuine causes cannot be defined this way. A preceding event does not have the power to produce the effect with which it is constantly conjoined, Reid points out. Smoke is constantly conjoined with fire, but, according to Reid, fire is not the active producer of smoke. And yet we all have a notion of causes that are productive—of causes which actually produce and are responsible for change.

An efficient or productive cause, Reid holds, “is that which has power to produce the effect” (Of Power, 6) and “which produces a change by the exertion of its power” (EAP, 13). To produce an effect, there must be in the cause a power to produce the effect, and the exertion of that power. For Reid, a power that cannot be exerted is no power at all (EAP, 203). The only things which possess the power to produce changes and which can exert this power are beings with will and understanding (see section 1.b.ii). Beings with active power, the will to exert it, and understanding to direct it, are agents. Efficient causes—causes in the proper sense—are therefore agents (EAP, 211).

Furthermore, Reid observes that a principle or belief that appears very early in the mind of human beings is that everything that begins to exist must have a cause (in the proper or real sense of the term) of its existence, “which had power to give it existence” (EAP, 15 and 202). For Reid “that things cannot begin to exist, nor undergo any change, without a cause that hath power to produce that change…is so popular, that there is not a man of common prudence who does not act from this opinion, and rely upon it every day of his life” (EAP, 25).

In examining Reid’s account, three questions must be answered. First, ‘what are first principles?’ Second, ‘is this principle of causality—that whatever begins to exist must have a cause—truly a first principle?’ And third, ‘if it is a first principle, does it require holding a strong notion of causes (causes as efficient causes or as agents)? ‘

First principles, according to Reid, are propositions “which are no sooner understood than they are believed” (EIP 452). First principles are things human beings believe naturally: “there is no searching for evidence, no weighing of arguments; the proposition is not deduced or inferred from another…” (Ibid.). What is believed, is, for Reid, a first principle when it functions as an axiom for other propositions. Other propositions are discovered through the power of reasoning – either by inductive or by deductive reasoning. Reasoning is the capacity of drawing a conclusion from a chain of premises, Reid writes. But “first principles, principles of common sense, common notions, self-evident truths” (EAP, 452), are words that all express propositions that do not require reasoning from a chain of premises.

For instance, the proposition that the objects we perceive really do exist is a first principle (EIP 476). It is not something we usual hold by deducing it from other premises. Furthermore, it is not inferred from repeated experiences since the proposition is supposed in the experience itself. Another example is that the future will resemble the past (EIP 489). “Antecedently to all reasoning,” Reid writes, “we have, by our constitution, an anticipation, that there is a fixed and steady course of nature” (Inquiry 199). The child, Reid observes, who has once been burnt by fire will continue to shun fire. Repeated experiences and reasoning may help them confirm that fire always burns, but children will believe that the fire which burned them once will burn them again by nature, before reasoning and experience have offered any confirmation of such a fact. One may offer support for first principles, and false first principles may be defeated (EIP 463-467), but first principles are natural and found to be true as soon as they are understood and regardless of any proof in their favor.

The principle of causality, according to Reid, is one of these natural principles. That whatever begins to exist must have a cause which produced it is, according to Reid, a first principle of our human constitution (EIP 497). Reid writes that Hume has convincingly showed that the arguments offered in defense of this principle all take for granted what must be proved (EIP 498). This principle cannot be proved by induction from experience either, according to Reid. Indeed, Reid writes, “in the far greatest part of the changes in nature that fall within our observation, the causes are unknown, and therefore, from experience, we cannot know whether they have causes or not” (EIP 499). Yet, it would be absurd, Reid argues, to conclude that these events do not have causes. The proposition that every change must have a cause that produced it is therefore a first principle, an axiom that humans hold, not as a result of any kind of reasoning or of repeating observations, but as a result of their natural constitution.

Finally, now, even if Reid is correct to think of the principle of causality as a first principle, why should we think that every change or any beginning of existence must have an efficient cause? One of Reid’s strategies is to show that we hold this belief in cases of human actions. Those actions which are truly an agent’s actions, Reid argues, are actions that are up to the agent, that are within the agent’s control, and really produced by the agent. The cause of human actions is an agent with the power to act, with the will to act, with understanding to direct his power, and who exerted his power (sections 1.b and 4.a).

Another strategy to which Reid appeals, in order to show that when we think of causes of some change we have in mind efficient causes, is to focus on what causes the beginning of existence. One natural belief, according to Reid, is the belief that nothing can come into existence without an efficient cause (EAP, 202). The first cause, that which brought things into existence, it is commonly believed, is a cause which had power to bring about existence and understanding to bring about the order of existence. Order and purposiveness (teleology) are effects of something with power and intelligence. Existence and order do not just pop into being, according to Reid. We all believe, in practice if not in words, that existence has a cause. And since existence is ordered and purposeful, we think of the cause as an efficient cause (a substance endowed with active power, will, and understanding). Reid then seems to think that we all believe that the first coming into existence is caused by an efficient cause, and this would explain why we believe that all change is caused (perhaps in the beginning, or by intermediate actions), by an efficient cause. Hence, we hold the belief that we, as human beings, are sometimes efficient causes, and we hold the belief that existence itself, and the course of nature, requires an efficient cause.

ii. Physical Causes

Although the proper sense of the term ‘cause’ is efficiency or productive causality, Reid recognizes that there is also a lax or popular use of the term. We often use the term ‘cause’ to describe events in nature that are constantly conjoined with other events, which we call ‘effects.’ Causes in this sense—in the Humean sense—are not agents but events constantly conjoined with others according to the laws of nature. Only efficient causes are causes per se, for Reid, but events that ‘cause’ others according to laws of nature may be called ‘causes’ or ‘necessary causes’ as long as we bear in mind that this is an improper use of the term.

Originally, however, Reid notices that human beings were prone to think of inanimate beings as agents. In agreement with Hume, Reid writes that human beings tended to think a soul or agent is the cause of any motion that is not accounted for. In anticipation to contemporary cognitive science, Reid recognizes that humans have what is called today a ‘hyper active agency detecting device.’ We are prone to attribute powers to beings, qualities and relations that are inanimate and passive (Of Power, 6 and EAP, 207). Then by reflection and education human beings can come to observe that objects in nature are merely passive, and that they have no productive force or power. As philosophy advances, Reid writes, we find that objects which appeared to be intelligent and active are dead, inactive, passive, and moved necessarily (EAP, 207).

Nonetheless, many human beings still tend to think of laws of nature as powers or as causes in the true sense of having power to initiate change (EAP, 211). They observe constant conjunction, events constantly following others in similar circumstances, such as heat and ice melting. However, they do not perceive the real connection between these events. “Antecedent to experience,” Reid writes, “we should see no ground to think that heat will turn ice into water any more than that it will turn water into ice” (Of Power, 7). And yet the tendency is to attribute to laws of nature behind these events the same productive powers we attribute to agents. But, Reid argues, Newton himself was correct to write that a little reflection will clearly show that laws of nature cannot produce any phenomenon “unless there be some agent that puts the law in execution” (Of Power, 7). It is as absurd to attribute agency to laws of nature as it is to attribute agency to beings who lack will and understanding. However, one may continue to use the word ‘cause’ to refer to events constantly preceding others according to the laws of nature, or to refer to the laws themselves, but one must recognize, Reid insists, that such a use is a popular and improper use of the term.

We do not observe active power in inanimate beings, and we do not perceive such a productive power in the laws of nature. Still, human beings all believe that beginning of existence, order and purpose require an efficient cause (4 b.i) Our causal beliefs, Reid argues, are teleological—we assume there is purpose and activity behind events in nature. Our context, education, bad science, or certain kinds of religion or philosophy might then lead us to give up such teleological beliefs. But, for Reid, careful attention to those beliefs that are presupposed behind our arguments and practices will reveal that human beings all have the (legitimate) tendency to think of nature as purposeful.

For Reid, laws of nature express purpose because they are expressions of divine character traits. Every agent who forms resolutions and fixed purposes will tend to act in a regular manner (section 2.b). Since natural events do not have any productive capacity, since the laws of nature are not productive powers, since all change and beginning of existence requires an efficient cause, and since human agents are not these efficient causes, there must be another agent behind the existence and motion of nature, God. Events in nature follow regular courses of action, which, like all regular courses of actions, express the character traits or fixed resolutions of an agent: the Author of nature. We do not know exactly how this efficient cause acts in nature, Reid points out (EAP, 210). He might have acted once, or might act in all changes, or act through intermediary agents. But “it is sufficient for us to know, that, whatever the agents may be, whatever the manner of their operation, or the extent of their power, they depend upon the first cause, and are under his control; and this indeed is all that we know; beyond this we are left in the darkness” (EAP, 30). In conclusion, therefore, efficient causes are agents, beings with active power, will and understanding. Events in nature and inanimate objects are not agents, and hence are called ‘causes’ in a popular sense only, but they require an efficient cause, an agent who acts orderly and purposefully.

iii. Principles of Action and Causation

In opposition to his ‘necessitarian’ opponents, Reid argues that the rational principles of action that motivate human agents in their choices and actions are not causes (in any sense of the term). The opponents Reid confronts directly are David Hume and Joseph Priestley, but he also has in mind philosophers such as Locke, Collins, Leibniz, and Spinoza. All of these philosophers held, according to Reid, that the will is not free, but that human choices and decisions are determined, necessarily, by the strongest, or, under some views, the best, motive.

In Reid’s account, the two great categories of motives or principles of action are the animal and the rational ones. Reid points out animal motives may function as physical causes do, but only in cases where the agent has no power. In cases of torture, or of madness, human beings may lose all power of self-government and of action. In such instances we do not hold them responsible for their actions (although we might hold them responsible for previous actions which were in their power) because we recognize that the animal motive (pain, fear, etc.) was irresistible. For this reason Reid concludes that when a person discloses an important secret by the agony of the rack, for example, we pity him more than we blame him (EAP, 57-58). If the person with strength of mind succeeds in resisting the passion (the fear of pain, for instance), we impute the action to the person. If the person fails after trying, we impute the action more to the passion than to the person, and we blame the person in proportion to a person’s capacity to resist passions (EAP, 59). The extent to which we have power to act is inversely proportional to the influence of animal motives. Animal motives, therefore, may act as physical causes, but never as efficient causes, since events or mental states are not beings with power and understanding.

On the other hand, rational principles of action—which are valuable ends that agents recognize they may instantiate by their actions—never act as physical causes. It is impossible for such motives to function as physical causes, Reid argues. These motives are non-existing ends that the agent considers, and since they are not existing states of affairs there is no way they could function as physical causes (EAP, 214; more on this in Yaffe 2004). They could not function as efficient causes either, since efficient causes are substances with power and understanding. Hence (rational) motives are neither causes nor agents, “they suppose an efficient cause, and can do nothing without it” (EAP, 214). Instead of thinking of rational motives as causes, Reid writes, we should rather think of them as advice or exhortation, which leave agents perfectly free to determine their choices and actions.

Defenders of necessity (Collins, Hume, Kames, Hartley, Priestley, Leibniz) have argued, Reid writes, that the strongest of contrary motives must prevail. And if there is but one motive, they hold, then this motive determines the agent. There is a necessary relation, according to these philosophers, between a person’s motives and his actions. Motives, according to them, function as necessary causes. The strongest or best motive is the motive that causally determines the action.

In response to such views, Reid examines what test these philosophers use to determine the strength of a motive. Reid asks us to consider how we judge which of two motives is the strongest. One way to establish which motive is the strongest is to consider which motive prevails. The strongest motive, according to such a position, is simply the motive that prevails (that wins). Or, one could claim that “by the strength of motive is not meant its prevalence, but the cause of its prevalence…” (EAP, 217). But, Reid points out, this answer simply asserts that the strongest motive is the strongest motive. To prevail or win is identical to being the strongest (Ibid). This solution, therefore, fails to offer a test or way of determining which motive is the strongest. Moreover, it assumes what must be proved: that the strongest motive, or the cause of the strongest motive, is the necessary cause of action. These accounts all beg the question and assume, Reid argues, that “motives are the causes, and the sole causes of actions” (Ibid.). Reid points out that the test of the strength of motives we use to determine if motives are necessitating causes to action must not assume that motives function as necessitating (physical) causes.

In reaction to his opponents, Reid writes that the strength of animal motives is determined differently from the strength of rational motives. The strongest animal motive, Reid observes, is the one that is most difficult to resist. The strength of animal motives is determined by the effort required to resist them. In a limited number of situations, they are irresistible (in cases of torture, for instance) but in the majority of situations agents are able to resist strong animal motives, Reid notices. Brutes cannot resist the strongest animal motive because they are not capable of forming the notion of ‘ought’ and ‘ought not’ (EAP, 219). Agents, on the other hand, sometimes act according to rational motives, because they are able to recognize that an action is worth performing even if it is contrary to a strong animal motive. They can consider whether the action will be either prudentially or morally valuable, and hence act according to rational motives. The strongest rational motive, Reid observes, is the one that offers the best reason to act. It is not the one which is hardest to resist, but it is “that which it is most our duty and our real happiness to follow” (EAP, 219). The best reason, furthermore, cannot be a necessitating cause to action. Indeed, ends such as moral value or overall well-being are non-existing states of affairs, and they are not substances. Hence they could be neither necessary (physical) causes nor efficient causes.

Finally, Reid points out that it is true that we often reason from men’s actions to their motives. But we do not have enough evidence to be able to conclude, inductively, that human beings are always determined by motives (EAP, 220). Indeed, we do not have empirical data to justify such an inference. The relation strong motive-action is a probable one, but there are too many instances in which humans resist strong motives, or act according to weak motives, or act in light of future values, or act against what they consider to be best. The relation is probable, at best, but far from being certain, Reid concludes. Moreover, in many cases that are unimportant, it is possible for agents to act without any motive at all (EAP, 215; see also Rowe 1991, 171-175).

c. The Problem of Infinite Regress

Several well-known objections could be offered to theories of liberty such as Reid’s. One kind of objection is that theories of action which hold that choices and actions are not causally determined by motives, or that hold that agents have power over their will (their volitions), lead to problems of infinite regress. Some argue that accounts of liberty such as Reid’s presuppose a regress of acts of will. Others argue that they lead to a regress of motives or reasons for action. And some point out that they lead to a regress of exertions of power. All such kinds of infinite regresses are impossible, the objections go, and hence the doctrine of liberty which Reid defends must therefore be false.

Reid offers a response to the first kind of regress. Indeed, he notices that an objection first advanced by Thomas Hobbes is that the claim that we have power over our will (to will this way or that) amounts to saying that we may will it, if we will. Hobbes therefore argues, Reid notes, that in order to act the will must thus be determined by a prior will, which must in turn be determined by a prior will, and so on ad infinitum (EAP, 199). Hobbes, Reid writes, therefore holds that liberty consists only in the power to act as we will, and it does not extend to the will itself.

In response to Hobbes, Reid points out that his account does not imply an infinite regress of acts of will because even though the determinations of the will are effects, Reid writes, which must have a cause, the cause of the determining (the choice or intention) is not some previous choice or intention. If the will is free, the agent is the cause of the agent’s determinations, he writes, and the action is thus imputable to the agent. If another agent is the cause (either immediately or by the interposition of other events), then the determination is imputable to that other agent. There is no regress of acts of will, according to Reid, since the cause is the agent and not another act of will (EAP, 201). Moreover, as explained in section 1.b.ii, Reid argues that power over an end action requires having power over the intermediary actions leading up to the end. Volitions (choices or willings) are internal actions leading up to the end, and hence power over the end implies having power over the volitions (Ibid.).

Another possible regress implied by Reid’s account of liberty (which is often called today a ‘libertarian’ account of freedom, to be distinguished from the political theory) is a regress in reasons or explanations. Under an account like Reid’s, the agent is influenced by different motives, desires, reasons, and the agent then decides to act in line with one motive rather than another. How does the agent make this choice? Leibniz, for instance, writes that if the best motive does not causally necessitate the choice, then the agent must have a further reason or motive to choose one motive rather than another. Leibniz imagines that the agent must listen to different voices, different motives, and that in order to choose between these voices or considerations, the agent must listen to yet another higher-order voice, and choosing this higher-order motive requires considering still higher-motives. The agent, that is, needs a higher order motive in order to choose between lower order motives. But then, Leibniz argues, the agent would need a reason to choose the higher-order motive, and so on ad infinitum (see Leibniz 1985, and Rowe 1991b:181). Since agents cannot go through an infinite number of reasons, and in order to keep from falling into the regress trap, a more appealing account, according to Reid’s opponents, is the one that holds that agents are determined, necessarily, by the strongest or the best motive.

According to Reid, however, the process of weighing motives and of deliberation does not lead to an infinite regress of motives. Rational motives may be higher-order motives about which animal motive should be acted upon or resisted, or about the overall prudential or moral value of the courses of action to which various motives lead (EAP, 57). But at the moment of decision, deliberation has stopped. Deliberation ends with a final judgment about what one ought to do, and with an intention either to act accordingly, or to refrain from acting according to what is best. “The natural consequence of deliberation on any part of our conduct,” Reid writes, “is a determination how we shall act; and if it is not brought to this issue it is lost labour” (EAP, 64). At the moment of decision, Leibniz is wrong, Reid would contend, to think that the libertarian must revert to an infinite series of reasons. The agent knows which motive he should follow. Deliberation ends with a consideration of which course of action is most valuable. And whether the agent follows the one that is best or not will not depend on yet another reason or motive. Indeed, what other reason could he offer? Evaluations of what one ought to do, about prudence or moral duty, are evaluations about ends, according to Reid. And an end is something that requires no further justification or reason. Therefore, once a person recognizes the end, and which course of action will instantiate the end, no further reason needs to be offered. Now, whether or not the agent in fact acts according to such an end is a question of weakness of will, or of lack of self-government; it is not an issue of providing yet further motives for choosing between higher-order motives (Kroeker 2007).

In the late 20th and early 21st century, several Reid scholars have argued that yet another kind of regress looms for Reid: an infinite regress of exertions of active power. Reid writes that “in order to the production of any effect, there must be in the cause, not only power, but the exertion of power; for power that is not exerted produces no effect” (EAP, 203). The regress arises when we consider the nature of the exertion of active power. Is the exertion an event? If so, then it must have a cause since Reid writes that every event must have an efficient cause. Efficient causes, for Reid, are agents, and when an agent acts freely, that agent is the cause of his or her own action. But if exertions are effects, does this mean that the agent causes the exertion of power? If so, then the agent would have to exert his active power in order to exert his active power. But if this former exertion is also an event caused by the agent, then it requires another previous exertion of active power, and so on.

Reid does not explicitly address the problem of regress of exertions of active power, and scholars disagree about which response he would adopt. Since this problem is well known, it is worth mentioning some suggested responses. One possible answer is simply to accept the regress, and to defend its coherence (Chisholm 1979). Another possible strategy is to argue that some acts of will are acts of mind that are uncaused. William Rowe, for instance, argues that the exertion of active power is an event but it is logically or conceptually impossible for such an event to be the effect of the exertion of active power of any agent (Rowe 1991b). For Rowe exertions are acts by which agents agent-cause their choices and actions. But agents do not cause the exertion itself, Rowe argues.

Another Reidian response to the problem of regress of exertions is that there can be events that an agent causes without bringing about any other event as a means of producing them. Paul Hoffman, for instance, suggests that exertions of power are events. But they are the kind of events that do not require a previous exertion of active power (this solution was first considered, but not ultimately defended, by Rowe (1987)). Hoffman argues that exertions of active power are events, but events which are exempted of being caused by an exertion of active power. These events “do not require a prior activating of a power” (Hoffman 2006, 445).

A further suggested solution is to reject the view that exertions of active power are events. Timothy O’Connor, for instance, argues that exertions are better understood as relations that hold between agents and their effects. Agents bring about their volitions, but not by some further action. They bring about their effects directly. And this irreducible relation is the exertion of active power. Exertions of active power are relations between causes (agents) and effects (the agents’ volitions and actions), and as relations they are not caused, and hence are not events (O’Connor 1994, 621).

A solution to the regress of exertions problem, Gideon Yaffe alternatively suggests, may be found if we consider what is involved in trying to act. For Yaffe, when an agent tries to do something and succeeds, there is just one action. If someone tries to commit a murder and succeeds in committing the murder, for example, we do not think the person performed two different things: trying and killing. The only action performed here is killing. The trying is not a separate action, but it is somehow part of the action of killing. Hence, Yaffe writes that “if the trying is anywhere in cases of success it is ‘in’ the successful action (Yaff 2004, 157). Now, Yaffe continues, if exerting power is just like trying, then in cases of success, the exertion is in the action. In cases of failure, on the other hand, the only thing the agent does is try. Trying in cases of failure is an action or event. We might say that in cases of failure the agent exerts his power to try. Moreover, since trying is a successful action, there is no further action of trying to try which would require a further exertion of active power. Hence, when we understand the exertion of power as trying (regardless of whether the trying succeeds and the agent acts, or the agent fails and the agent only tries to act) it is false to say that such exertions lead to a regress of exertions. Yaffe concludes, therefore, that since the relation agent-action in cases of success is direct and non-reducible, Reid’s account is best characterized as an agent-causal view of action.

Finally, James Van Cleve suggests, in response to the infinite regress of exertions objection, that in causing an action, the agent causes his own causing of the action. An agent’s causing some action has a reflexive component: in causing an action, the agent thereby causes the causing of the action. And we need not worry about the further complexity that in causing the causing the action I also cause the causing of the causing of the action, because this further complexity “is matched by no corresponding complexity in the fact described” (Van Cleve, 2015: 432). In causing an action, Van Cleve argues, the agent causes his own causing of the action—the causing of the action is not a further causing of this causing but is the agent himself.

d. First Argument for Moral Liberty

In the fourth essay of the Essays on the Active Powers, Reid focuses on three arguments for the conclusion that adult human beings have active power over their will. According to Reid’s account, moral liberty is the freedom an agent has to choose and to act (see sections 1.b and 4.a). What Reid calls the ‘first argument’ for moral liberty is based on the fact that the belief that we are free and the belief that every event must have a cause which had power to produce it are natural beliefs. For Reid some beliefs are natural beliefs, and natural beliefs are legitimate. They are legitimate in that it is reasonable to hold these beliefs unless proof is brought against them. Reid will show that there is, in fact, no good proof brought against such beliefs, and hence that it is legitimate to hold that humans possess moral liberty.

Natural beliefs are held by all adult human beings who are not under the influence of madness, of drugs, or of circumstances which might diminish their rational and active capacities. They are generated by our innate natural faculties, and, for Reid, we have no good reason to distrust our natural faculties. They all stand on the same footing, and hence we have no reason to trust one faculty and not another, Reid argues. Moreover, he shows that we cannot distrust all of them since we would be using our faculties to offer reasons for distrusting all of them—a position that is self-defeating and untenable (EAP, 229).

Another characteristic of natural beliefs is that they appear very early in the mind of humans even though they are neither a result of induction nor of deduction. Children, for instance, believe very early that they have a degree of active power over their actions, and that every event must have an efficient cause. Human beings do not first form these beliefs by observing external objects. In nature we only perceive events constantly conjoined to others, Reid points out, and not the connection between them (EAP, 229). The notion of power (and of efficient causation), therefore, cannot be formed by observation of external objects (see section 1.a on our ideas of active power; and 4.b.i for more on natural principles). Moreover, as adults we are not directly conscious of our own power (only of the exertions of our power), but yet we are convinced that we do have power when we choose and act. For Reid we only will to perform actions which we believe to be in our power. Hence, in exerting our power (in acting), we also believe that the action is in our power, and hence that we have the power over our willings and external actions.

Furthermore, Reid continues, the conviction that we have power over our choices and actions is implied in all our deliberations. When we deliberate about which action we should perform, according to Reid, we are convinced that the action we are considering performing is in our power. And once we finish deliberating, our resolutions and purposes imply a conviction that we have power to execute what we have resolved to do (EAP, 230). Reid adds that our acts of promising also imply the belief that we have the power to carry out what we have promised, and the human activity of blaming also presupposes a belief that the person acted wrongly. Blame, Reid writes, presupposes a wrongful use of power, as it is absurd to blame a person for yielding to necessity. Finally, the belief that humans often do have power over their will is assumed in the regulations of tribunals.

Some of these examples, however, show that humans believe that they have power over their actions, but they do not imply the conclusion Reid is seeking: that we do have power over our volitions. Reid’s view, in response, is that unless reflection, good philosophy, good science or compelling evidence may be given to distrust the propositions that sane adult human beings believe naturally, we are justified in holding them. Natural beliefs are legitimate; they express what is the case. To accept a proposition as a natural principle (as a first-principle), it is not enough to simply assert that we all believe it. Reid argues, rather, that there are “ways of reasoning about them, by which those that are just and solid may be confirmed, and those that are false may be detected” (EIP 463). One must show, for instance, that the belief is acquired without the need of inductive or deductive reasoning, that it is common to the learned and the unlearned, that giving up the conviction would lead to absurdities, that it enjoys the same kind and level of evidence as other similar beliefs which we admit as first principles, and that it appears early in the mind of children (EIP, VI.4). Reid, in his first argument for moral liberty, contends that we have power over our will because it is a proposition that is believed, naturally, and because it meets the requirements for being a first principle. The burden of proof, therefore, falls on the side of those who defend the doctrine of necessity (EAP, 235). This epistemological point, coupled with Reid’s belief that there are no convincing arguments to show that the belief must be rejected, lead Reid to conclude that we have moral liberty.

One might object that many might profess that they do not, in fact, believe that they have power over their will. Reid, in response, argues that what people profess or state is not always in line with what they actually believe. To know what people believe, Reid points out, it is not always best to ask them. It is better to look at their actions and practices. Hence a man might claim that he is not afraid of the dark, and yet refuse to sleep alone and to turn the light off. His actions betray his fear, Reid points out (EAP, 232). The same holds for our beliefs of power over our will and actions. Everyday practices are evidence that we believe we have power not only over our actions but also over our will.

e. Second Argument for Moral Liberty

Reid also argues for moral liberty from the fact that humans are moral and accountable beings. For Reid there can be no “moral obligation and accountableness, praise and blame, merit and demerit, justice and injustice, reward and punishment, wisdom and folly, virtue and vice” if human beings do not have active power (EAP, 240). In civil government, in religion, and in all moral discourse, the obligation that human beings have to do what is right is taken as given. Humans, it is universally recognized, are moral and accountable beings.

In order to be a moral being, Reid argues, a being must know the law and must have the power to obey it. Brute animals, Reid observes, are not moral and accountable beings, because they do not have the capacity to understand the moral law. Human beings, however, if they are not insane or incapacitated, are, according to Reid, capable of recognizing a moral law (what they ought to do). Human beings also have the power to do what they are responsible for (EAP, 237). Reid points out that it is self-evident to all human beings that one cannot “be under an obligation to do what it is impossible for him to do” (Ibid.). A person may be responsible for a previous action, like cutting off his finger, but he cannot then be held responsible for not being able to use his fingers for a particular action that requires dexterity. The fact that humans are held responsible for some of their actions, therefore, implies that they are capable of knowing the moral law, and that they can have the power to act accordingly.

The doctrine of necessity, Reid, argues, is not coherent with the moral accountableness of human agents. According to the doctrine of necessity, Reid writes, a man is not free to will or to choose. But if this is the case, then it is impossible for a person to will otherwise than how he in fact wills. But this means that it is impossible for a person who is determined to will to refrain from willing. And hence, according to Reid, the doctrine of necessity implies that persons should not be held responsible, because it is absurd to hold someone responsible for what he could not refrain from choosing. But we do continue to hold humans accountable for their choices and actions. Again, therefore, the burden of proof falls on those who hold that our everyday practices and beliefs are wrong, according to Reid.

f. Third Argument for Moral Liberty

In his third argument for moral liberty Reid argues that human beings have power over their actions and their volitions because they are able of conceiving plans and of carrying them out, which implies they possess moral liberty. A regular plan of conduct, Reid contends, cannot be contrived without understanding, and cannot be carried into execution without power (EAP, 240).

Reid assumes, from the start, that some persons lay down a plan of conduct, and resolve to pursue that plan. Reid also assumes we will all agree that some have in fact pursued such plans or ends by adopting and performing the proper means.

For Reid, these assumptions imply that the person who carries out the plan has wisdom and understanding. But, he argues, they also demonstrate that the person has a degree of power over his voluntary determinations. For Reid, “understanding without power may project, but it can execute nothing” (EAP, 240). A regular plan of action cannot be contrived without understanding, and it cannot be executed without power.

The question, now, is ‘where is this understanding and power?’ In other words: ‘who is the true cause of the plan?’ If wisdom and understanding is in fact in the person who carried out the plan, Reid writes, then we have the very same evidence that the power which executed it is also in that person.

For Reid’s opponent, the true cause of the plan lies in the motives of the agent, and not in the agent who exerts his active power. But, Reid points out, motives do not have understanding and power. These qualities are characteristics of agents, but only agents have understanding and power over their wills and actions. So, is there an agent other than the person who carried out the plan who in fact arranged the motives (and was the true cause of the plan)? If the cause is an agent other than the person who carried out the plan, Reid writes, then we cannot say the person had a hand in the execution of the plan; it is not even his plan, and, further, we have no evidence that the person is a thinking being. After all, many animals carry out plans such as building bee hives or spinning webs. But we do not think of the plans as the effects of intelligence in the animal. The plans here are effects of another agent, of another efficient cause. But in the case of human beings, the plans they carry out really are their plans. And we think of humans as exerting the intelligence required to lay out and pursue their plans of action. Hence, Reid concludes, if the intelligence is really in the person who carried out the plan and whose plan it is, then the power must be in that person as well.

What evidence do we have that our fellow human beings think and reason? For Reid, the evidence that persons who carry out intelligent plans have wisdom and understanding is provided by the persons’ speech and actions. The behavior of human beings, their language, and their bodily movements and expressions are all signs of intelligence (for more on natural signs of mental states, see EAP, 116 and 141). The understanding therefore truly lies in the person who carried out the plan. However, to carry out a plan, one must have power to execute it. Hence, “if the actions and speeches of other men give us sufficient evidence that they are reasonable beings, they give us the same evidence, and the same degree of evidence, that they are free agents” (EAP, 242). Pursuing plans, step by step, therefore, is a sign of both wisdom and active power.

In conclusion, Reid recognizes that although many questions remain to be answered, one thing is clear: in everyday activities and concerns of the present life of human beings, no person is very much affected by the doctrine of necessity (EAP, 269). Even though some vehemently defend necessity and others zealously guard liberty, we see no great difference between them in their everyday conducts. The fatalist, despite his claims, “deliberates, resolves, and plights his faith. He lays down a plan of conduct, and prosecutes it with vigour and industry…” (EAP, 269) He exhorts, commands, blames and praises. In all cases “he sees that it would be absurd not to act and to judge as those ought to do who believe themselves and other men to be free agents” (Ibid.). In everyday life, Reid concludes, all men act in a way that is consistent with his theory of liberty, and inconsistent with the doctrine of necessity. All humans believe, in the everyday, that they possess active power over some of their actions. And what all humans believe is a sign of what is, according to Reid, unless one may offer good arguments to show that the belief is false. In the absence of such good arguments, Reid thinks that the most reasonable position it to claim that humans have moral liberty. And what is most important, according to Reid, is for us “to manage these powers, by proposing to ourselves the best ends, planning the most proper system of conduct that is in our power, and executing it with industry and zeal. This is true wisdom; this is the very intention of our being” (EAP, 5). Powers to act, to direct our actions, to plan, to decide, are all useful powers for Reid, and using them well, for good ends, is the noblest human mission.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Collins, Anthony (1976) ‘A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty’ in Determinism and Free Will, ed. J.O’Higgins SJ. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1648) ‘Of Liberty and Necessity’ in The English Works of Thomas Hobbes, iv, accessed November 24, 2015,
  • Hume, David (1998) An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (EPM), Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hume, David (2007a) A Treatise of Human Nature: A Critical Edition (T), David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried (1985) Theodicy. LaSalle, Il: Open Court.
  • Locke, John (1979) An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Priestley, Joseph (1782) Doctrine of Philosophical Necessity Illustrated; being an Appendix to the Disquisitions relating to Matter and Spirit. London.
  • Reid, Thomas (1997) An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (I), Derek R. Brookes (ed.). Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press. (Original work published in 1764.)
  • Reid, Thomas (2001) ‘Of Power’, The Philosophical Quarterly 51.202: 3-12 (Original work unpublished manuscript, 1772).
  • Reid, Thomas (2002) Essays on the Intellectual Powers of ManA Critical Edition (EIP), Derek R. Brookes (ed.). Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press. (Original work published in 1785.)
  • Reid, Thomas (2010) Essays on the Active Powers of ManA Critical Edition (EAP), Knud Haakonssen and James A. Harris (eds.). Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press. (Original work published in 1788.)
  • Spinoza, Baruch (1985) Ethics, in The Collected Works of Spinoza, vol. 1, transl. E. Curley. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alvarez, Maria (2010) ‘Thomas Reid’, in A companion to the Philosophy of Action, Timothy O’Connor & Constantine Sandis (eds.). UK: Wiley-Blackwell: 505-512.
    • Argues that Reid’s endorsement of the thesis that we cause changes by causing volitions gives rise to serious problems.
  • Chisholm, Roderick M. (1979) ‘Objects and Persons: Revisions and Replies’, in Essays on the Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm, Ernest Sosa (ed.). Amsterdam, Rodopi: 317-388.
    • Recognizes that his account implies an infinite regress but denies that the regress is vicious.
  • Hatcher, Michael (2013) ‘Reid’s Third Argument for Moral Liberty’, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 21.4: 688-710.
    • Argues that the argument from design is one of the premises in Reid’s third argument for moral liberty.
  • Harris, James (2003) ‘On Reid’s “Inconsistency Triad”: A Reply to McDermid’, British Journal of the History of Philosophy 11.1: 121-127.
    • Defends Reid against the charge that Reid’s attempt to offer arguments for moral liberty is inconsistent with his view that the proposition that we have power over our wills is a first principle, and hence cannot be proved.
  • Hoffman, Paul (2006) ‘Thomas Reid’s Notion of Exertion’, Journal of the History of Philosophy 44.3: 431-447.
    • Offers a Reidian answer to the infinite regress of exertions problem by showing that exertions of power are events which are exempted of being caused by prior exertions.
  • Jaffro, Laurent (2011) ‘Reid on powers of the mind and the person behind the curtain’, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 41.sup1: 197-213.
    • Examines Reid’s claim that there is no inert activity; the operations of the understanding involve some degree of activity.
  • Kroeker, Esther (2007) ‘Explaining our Choices: Reid on Motives, Character and Effort’, The Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 5 (2) 2007, 187–212.
    • Offers a Reidian answer to the objection that Reid’s account or moral liberty leads to an infinite regress of reasons and motives, and examines Reid’s criticism of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.
  • Kroeker, Esther (2011) ‘Reid’s Moral Psychology: animal motives as guides to virtue’, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 41.sup1: 122-141.
    • Examines Reid’s understanding of the animal motives and argues that uncorrupted animal motives are, for Reid, guides to virtue.
  • Lindsay, Chris (2005) ‘Reid on Scepticism about Agency and the Self’, Journal of Scottish Philosophy 3.1: 19-33
    • Defends Reid’s possible response to Alvarez’s objection that Reid’s theory gives rise to a skeptical worry concerning awareness of one’s actions, and suggests there are still tensions originating from Reid’s dualist metaphysics.
  • Madden, Edward (1983) ‘Commonsense and Agency Theory’, Review of Metaphysics 36.2: 319-341.
    • Presents an overview of Reid’s views on agency and causality, and discusses problems related to Reid’s claim that reasons for action are not causes.
  • McDermid, Douglas (1999) ‘Thomas Reid on Moral Liberty and Common Sense’, British Journal for the History of Philosophy 7.2: 275-303.
    • Presents the essential features of Reid’s theory of liberty, shows how his arguments depend on common sense epistemology, and discusses limitations of Reid’s account.
  • McDermid, Douglas (2010) ‘A Second Look at Reid’s First Argument for Moral Liberty’, in Reid on Ethics, Sabine Roeser (ed.). Great Britain: Palgrave Macmillan: 143-163.
    • Discusses the Reidian claim that the principle that we have moral liberty (that we have some degree of power over our actions and determinations of our will) is a principle of common sense.
  • O’Connor, Timothy (1994) ‘Thomas Reid on Free Agency’, Journal of the History of Philosophy 32.4: 605-622.
    • Argues that the Reidian response to the problem of infinite regress of exertions of power is that it is best to understand exertions as relations that hold between agents and their actions, and that such relations, as opposed to events, are uncaused.
  • Rowe, William (1987) ‘Two Concepts of Freedom’, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 61: 43-64.
    • Presents a Reidian response to the objection that Reid’s moral theory leads to an infinite regress of exertions of power by arguing that exertions are the kind of events that do not require a previous exertion of power.
  • Rowe, William (1991a) ‘Responsibility, Agent-Causation, and Freedom’, Ethics 101: 237-257.
    • Argues that agent-causation, for Reid, is the concept that plays a central role in the logical connection between moral responsibility and freedom.
  • Rowe, William (1991b) Thomas Reid on Freedom and Morality. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • Presents and evaluates Reid’s theory of freedom.
  • Stalley, R.F. (1998) ‘Hume and Reid on the Nature of Action’, Reid Studies, 12: 33-48.
    • Discusses Reid’s response and criticism of Hume’s claim that we have no clear idea of power or cause.
  • Stecker, Robert (1992) ‘Thomas Reid’s Philosophy of Action’, Philosophical Studies 66: 197-208.
    • Argues that Reid’s theory of causality leads to a regress problem, and if it does not it is still uninformative and mysterious.
  • Van Cleve, James (2015) Problems from Reid. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Examines Reid’s arguments related to a wide range of topics such as perception, sensation, skepticism, conception, epistemology and first principles, as well as action theory.
  • Van Woudenberg, René (2010) ‘Thomas Reid on Determinism,’ in Reid on Ethics, Sabine Roeser (ed.). Great Britain: Palgrave Macmillan: 123-142.
    • Argues that Reid understood ‘determinism’ differently from how it is currently understood, and discusses Reid’s criticism of determinism as he understood it.
  • Weinstock, Jerome (1975) ‘Reid’s Definition of Freedom’, the Journal of the History of Philosophy, 13.3: 335-345.
    • Examines Reid’s attempt to include power over one’s will in the definition of freedom, and argues that power over the will has to do with possession of reason and a faculty of judgment that enables us to govern ourselves.
  • Yaffe, Gideon (2007), ‘Promises, Social Acts, and Reid’s First Argument for Moral Liberty.’ Journal of the History of Philosophy 45. 2: 267-289.
    • Presents Reid’s philosophical views about the act of promising, and showing that, for Reid, it is because promising is a social act that he thinks it presupposes active power.
  • Yaffe, Gideon (2004), Manifest Activity. Thomas Reids Theory of Action, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Offers a critical examination and reconstruction of Reid’s arguments in favor of his doctrine of moral liberty.


Author Information

Esther Engels Kroeker
University of Antwerp