Thomas Reid: Philosophy of Mind

Thomas ReidThis article focuses on the philosophy of mind of Thomas Reid (1710-1796), as presented in An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (1764) and Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785). Reid’s action theory and his views on what makes humans morally worthy agents, although connected to philosophy of mind, are not explored here.

Reid is best known as the father of common sense philosophy. He contends that going back to the principles of common sense will help deal with the problems engendered by the so-called “skeptical views" of his predecessors: Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. He argues that “the way of ideas” generates undue uncertainty in the theory of knowledge. If the only things that can be known directly and immediately are the contents of one’s mind, there can be no certainty in the knowledge geared toward the external world. Reid believes this goes against the common-sense view that humans do acquire certain knowledge through empirical observation of the external world, and are therefore not confined to know only the contents of their minds.

In philosophy of mind, Reid is most celebrated today for the arguments he gave in support of the position known as direct realism, which, at its most basic, states that the primary objects of sense perception are physical objects, not ideas in human minds. However, Reid’s philosophy of mind neither begins nor ends with perception. In addition to arguing for direct realism and, consequently, against “the way of ideas,” he undertook the task of establishing the equal status of the faculties of the mind, and of explaining the relationships that exist among them. He is a worthy successor of Locke, in that he believes that the mind is to be characterized in terms of a faculty psychology. He is a worthy successor of Newton, in that he believes that the scientific method is the right way of investigating the nature of mind. Reid characterized the scientific method mainly by trial and error, and by setting up experiments and drawing general conclusions from them.

One of the starting points of Reid’s philosophy of mind is a traditional distinction between the “powers of the understanding” and the “powers of the will.” Reid believes this distinction is not entirely correct because the mind is active whenever the powers of the understanding are exercised, and a certain degree of understanding is needed for any act of will. However, he uses it to classify the faculties of the mind into intellectual, on the one hand, and active, on the other.  The distinction is used in the titles of his two mature published works: Essays on the Intellectual Power of Man (1785) and Essays on the Active Powers of Man (1788), which he envisioned as two sides of the same coin. Reid thought that any theory of the mind should comprise an investigation into both types of mental operations.

Table of Contents

  1. Sensation
  2. Perception
    1. Original Perception
    2. Acquired Perception
  3. Memory
    1. General Considerations on Memory
    2. Memory and Personal Identity
  4. Intellectual Powers (Proper)
    1. Conception
      1. Bare Conception
      2. Imagination
    2. Judgment and Reasoning
      1. The Fundamental Characteristics of Judgment
      2. Common Sense
      3. First Principles of Common Sense
      4. Reasoning
  5. Taste
    1. Why This Faculty Is Called “Internal Taste”
    2. An Objectivist Account of Beauty
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Sensation

Reid argues that sensation is an original and simple operation of the mind, which for him means not only that certain beings (namely sentient ones) are born with an ability to sense, but also that this operation of the mind cannot be logically defined. All natural operations of the mind are simple and, in some sense, primitive, so that no reductive definition can be offered. This does not mean, however, that one cannot pay attention to the specific role played by this operation. In doing so, one will discover its most important features.

Although careful introspective observation will reveal that sensations do not usually occur on their own, but are almost always accompanied by perceptions, Reid is pointing out that a clear-cut distinction between sensation and perception exists and should be accounted for. This distinction has to do primarily with the specific roles sensations and perceptions play in the knowledge of the external world. Sensations are of limited use, in this sense; they only give information of what goes on in the sentient being. Perceptions, on the other hand, contribute to basic repository knowledge. In sensing a smell or tasting a taste, for instance, a sentient being will take notice of how its mind is affected, but, as Reid points out, such sensations bear no resemblance to any of the qualities of the external objects that cause these sensations to occur in the sentient being. Here Reid differs from his predecessors: according to John Locke, for instance, at least some sensations (those derived from the primary qualities of objects) do resemble the external objects which occasion the formation of such simple ideas in sentient beings such as humans (Locke, Essay II. viii. 15). To make the distinction with perception more vivid, Reid discusses an example: in seeing a flower or touching a sugar cube—which involves perceiving and having contentful thoughts about these objects, as is elaborated in the next section—humans gain knowledge about what these external objects really are. There still is no resemblance thesis advanced, to be sure; the mind is simply projected outside itself and, in doing so, it objectifies the things in its environment. In this, Reid is very forward-thinking: he is the first philosopher to draw a distinction between sensation and perception, which is extensively employed in contemporary philosophy of mind and psychology (as J. J. Gibson rightfully noticed).

This distinction between sensation and perception rests primarily on a peculiarity of the faculty of sensation: Reid believes that this is the only operation of the mind that “hath no object distinct from the act itself” (EIP I. 1, 36). He acknowledges the fact that human language is misleading in this respect: for instance, for both sensation and perception, people use “the same mode of expression” (IHM 6.20, 167). This mode of expression involves an active verb and an object: one can say both that “I feel a pain” and that “I see a tree” (IHM 6.20, 167). But, Reid contends, in the former case the object itself is grammatical only, and not also real, whereas in the latter the object is a real thing, allegedly existing outside the perceiver’s mind.

It is less clear what Reid means when he says that the object is not real, but grammatical only, in the case of the construction expressing a sensation that one may feel. There are two ways of interpreting this claim, and this ambiguity tracks two distinct positions in the secondary literature on Reid. On the one hand, sensations, for Reid, can be understood to not have objects at all: as such, this mental operation is distinct from all others. If we understand sensation to have no object, to be about nothing, it cannot ever be wrong. This would mark sensation as a very special faculty among the faculties of the human mind; perception or memory are not like this: someone can misperceive a tree just as well as he can misremember having seen a tree. But a person can never be mistaken about a feeling that particular person has: whenever someone has a headache, that ache is real and it is that person’s and it is exactly as that person is feeling it. On the other hand, that passage has been read as saying that sensations take themselves as objects; Reid, in this interpretation, would subscribe to a reflexive view of sensations. Just like perceptions and memories, sensations are constituted by two other ingredients: a conception of the object, and a belief that the object exists, except, in the case of sensation, this object is the sensation itself, not an external object like trees, frogs, or human beings.

A consequence of understanding Reid as saying that sensations do not have any kind of objects is to think that he is a precursor of “adverbial” theories of sensation. In this account, a sentient being is not said to have a sensation of a red object, but to sense in a certain way whenever stimulated in the right manner. Sensations inform the sentient being of various ways of feeling: there is a particular way of feeling redly, as opposed to a particular way of feeling yellowly, and there is yet another way of feeling headachely (see also Sense-Data). Understanding that sensations provide us with a qualitative feel and making sense of what exactly this means has become very important in early 21st century discussions on the nature of mind and consciousness. According to some authors, such as David Chalmers, Frank Jackson, Joseph Levine, and Thomas Nagel, qualia offer sufficient proof that a complete reduction of all mental processes to purely physical processes (as described by a physicalist interpretation of brain processes) is impossible (for more, see Qualia). So, understanding Reid’s position in this manner will place him squarely in the same tradition as one of the most important debates in contemporary philosophy of mind.

The last attribute of sensations worth mentioning is their role as signs of external objects. Usually, sensations pass unnoticed (unless the sentient being carefully attends to them) to other things that they signify. This feature of sensations allows Reid to argue that they are never to be associated to Lockean ideas (Locke, Essay II. viii. 8): they are not the objects of perception, and, moreover, they are not mental intermediaries between the mind and the world. Perception of external objects turns out to be immediate, in Reid’s view (Reid on sensations as signs: IHM 2. 10, 43; IHM 4. 1, 49; IHM 6. 21, 177). To properly understand the role of sensations as signs of external objects, according to Reid, an analysis of perception should be given, a task undertaken in the next section.

2. Perception

Perception is the main faculty that has the role to give beings endowed with this faculty brute knowledge about the external world: the knowledge is brute because no reasoning enters perception; and the result is knowledge, even though sometimes when the perceiver believes that something is being perceived, something is actually being either perceptually illusioned or hallucinated. However, even when a perceptual state results in a false outcome, the state itself should be characterized as perception (for more on how and why perception can be non-veridical, see EIP II. 22, 241–252). So, this is how sensations, as signs of external things, work to connect minds with external things. Reid argues that:

[A] requisite to our knowing things by signs is, that the appearance of the sign to the mind, be followed by the conception and belief of the thing signified. Without this the sign is not understood or interpreted; and therefore is no sign to us. […] Now, there are three ways in which the mind passes from the appearance of a natural sign to the conception and belief of the thing signified; by original principles of our constitution, by custom, and by reasoning. (IHM 6. 21, 177)

This passage is important in several respects: (i) it gives Reid’s “official” characterization of perception, and (ii) it lays the foundation for an important distinction at the level of perception. These two aspects are discussed in turn.

First, Reid argues that “the appearance of the sign” is followed by a conception and belief of the thing signified. When Reid gives his official characterization of perception he states that this faculty involves several others: the occurrence of a sensation suggests a conception and a belief of the existence of the thing perceived. Moreover, this existential belief is immediate, and not the product of reasoning (EIP II. 6, 96). If it were the product of reasoning, “the greatest part of men would be destitute of [the information had of external objects]; for the greater part of men hardly ever learn to reason; and in infancy and childhood no man can reason” (EIP II. 6, 101). Perception, therefore, must be able to occur independently from any act of reasoning.

The second feature of perception that the passage quoted above refers to is the distinction Reid draws between original perception and acquired perception: in the case of original perception, a natural sign (that is, a sensation) suggests a conception and a belief “by original principles of our constitution.” In the case of acquired perception, by contrast, the natural sign in question suggests a conception and a belief “by custom,” which most probably means “habit” and/or “experience.” Let us take a closer look at this distinction by pinning down some of the essential features of original perception, and by emphasizing some of the points of departures from this model, in the case of acquired perception.

a. Original Perception

According to Reid (IHM 6. 20, 171 and EIP II. 21), only two of the senses give beings endowed with them original perceptions, namely those of touch and sight. The sense of sight is somewhat problematic in this respect, though, since vision does not provide creatures endowed with it with original visual perceptions of some things, for instance depth, but only with acquired ones. In original tactile perception, the sensation had of the so-called “primary qualities of bodies” immediately suggests a conception and belief of the existence of these qualities, and of substances in which such qualities inhere. In original visual perception, the sensations of colors suggest conceptions and beliefs of the existence of the so-called “secondary quality” of color as existing outside of minds, in an external object. The perception of visible figure is also supposed to be original, according to Reid and, according to the standard interpretation of Reid, it is not accompanied by any type of visual sensation whatsoever. Why does Reid think that only two of the senses—touch and vision—can give beings that have them original perceptions?  Why cannot smell, taste, and hearing provide such beings with original perceptions? Can this have anything to do with the distinction between primary and secondary qualities of objects?  This is a good place to offer some details on Reid’s view of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities of objects. As previously mentioned, Reid thinks that Locke was wrong to believe that there is some resemblance between primary qualities of objects and the ideas or sensations sentient beings have of them. However, Reid himself draws a distinction between these two types of properties of objects:

There appears to be a real foundation for the distinction, and it is this: That our senses give us a direct and distinct notion of the primary qualities, and inform us what they are in themselves: But of the secondary qualities, our senses give us only a relative and obscure notion. They inform us only, that they are qualities that affect us in a certain manner, that is, produce in us a certain sensation; but as to what they are in themselves, our senses leave us in the dark. ([emphasis added]; EIP II. 17, 201)

Reid argues that knowledge of primary qualities—like squareness, or hardness, or motion—is direct: it captures everything there is to know about such a quality. Squareness, hardness, motion, and all the other mathematical qualities of bodies are known intrinsically. The conception human beings have of secondary qualities, like color, for instance, is not like this; hence it does not constitute knowledge. All there is to know about a secondary quality is that sentient beings are constituted in such a way that whenever a normal being is in contact with the color red, under normal conditions, that being gets a sensation, which is different in what it feels like to that being from the sensation that same being gets whenever it is stimulated with the color yellow, under normal conditions. Other examples of primary qualities of bodies include shape, size, and solidity. Besides color, other examples of secondary qualities are heat, cold, smell, and taste..

This distinction is important for understanding Reid’s view of original perception, since one way of drawing this distinction is by reference to what kinds of things can be originally perceived, as opposed to what kinds of things can be perceived only in an acquired manner. It might seem that the distinction between original and acquired perception is essentially linked with the more traditional one between primary and secondary qualities of bodies. This is indeed what several scholars have argued, citing as main evidence for this interpretation the fact that human beings have direct conceptions only of primary qualities. Based on this type of conception, human beings gain knowledge only of primary qualities and, if perception is supposed to give perceivers knowledge, as Reid thinks, it seems clear that perceivers can perceive only primary qualities of bodies, since perceivers do not gain any knowledge, by their senses, of secondary qualities. This argument seems correct, but it has a severe uphill battle because Reid specifically and consistently places color, a secondary quality, on the list of things that can be originally perceived (IHM 6. 20 p. 171; EIP II. 21, p. 236). So, if we are to listen to Reid, the distinction between primary and secondary qualities, on the one hand, and the distinction between original and acquired perception, on the other, do not carve the world in the same way. The distinction between original and acquired perception, therefore, must be clarified in a different way.

b. Acquired Perception

Acquired perception is distinguished from original perception primarily by the role of learning and experience. There is no need for any type of experience, according to Reid, for human beings to be able to perceive the primary qualities of bodies and the bodies themselves by touching them, for instance. However, one must learn to associate a certain sign that conjures up an original perception or a sensation only, with a certain external object. There is a controversy in the literature concerning what exactly this learning involves: according to some authors (for example, Van Cleve (2004)), it initially involves inference or reasoning, thus excluding anything that we acquire in this way from the list of things that we actually perceive, since perception, for Reid is a faculty that does not rest on the perceiver’s reasoning powers, as indicated in the previous section (EIP II. 6, 101). According to other authors (such as Copenhaver (2010)), however, acquired perception never involves any type of reasoning. Rather, Reid intended acquired perception to be understood as a distinctively perceptual ability: with the passage of time, normal perceivers acquire more perceptual sensitivity to properties not represented in original perception. Here is Reid explaining how this happens in the case of perception of depth and three-dimensional figure by sight:

It is experience that teaches me that the variation of colour is an effect of spherical convexity […]. But so rapid is the progress of the thought, from the effect to the cause, that we attend only to the last, and can hardly be persuaded that we do not immediately see the three dimensions of the sphere. (EIP II.21, 236)

The fact that this type of ability is called “acquired” should not suggest that it is less natural than the original variety. Beings endowed with the ability to develop acquired perception do not develop this ability consciously or only because they decide to acquire certain perceptions. Here is what Reid says concerning this:

In acquired perception, the signs are either sensations, or things which we perceive by means of sensations. The connection between the sign and the thing signified, is established by nature: and we discover this connection by experience; but not without the aid of our original perceptions, or of those which we have already acquired. After this connection is discovered, the sign, in like manner as in original perception, always suggests the thing signified, and creates the belief of it. (IHM 6. 24, 191)

Acquired perception thus builds upon the original abilities of sensing and originally perceiving things in nature that human beings have. In acquired perception, in contrast to original perception, the conventional associations between signs and things signified are introduced by a combination between nature and experience. In original perception, these conventions are the result of nature alone: this is the way humans are constituted. Reid believes that acquired perceptions are far more numerous than original perceptions (EIP XXI. 21, 235).

3. Memory

a. General Considerations on Memory

Memory, for Reid, is the perfect counterpart to perception: it is an original faculty of minds, which is meant to give beings endowed with it immediate access to the past. He argues that it is a first principle of common sense “[t]hat those things did really happen which I distinctly remember” ([emphasis added]; EIP VI. 5, p. 474) and that the knowledge that memory gives is “immediate knowledge of things past” (EIP II. 1, p. 253). No mental entities, such as ideas, mediate a being’s access to the external world in memory, just like no such entities mediate such a being’s access to the world in perception. There are three things involved in perception, and, similarly, there are three things involved in memory: a mind, a faculty, and an external object, which the mind gains knowledge of via the faculty in question. For Reid, “[m]emory implies a conception and belief of past duration” (EIP III. 1, p. 254). This formulation mirrors the one that he gave to further explain how perception operates, although both in the case of memory and of perception, these explanations are not definitions, since both these faculties are simple, and hence cannot be reductively defined by analyzing their components. The external object, in the case of perception, is (allegedly) presently existing; the external object, in the case of memory, was (allegedly) existing in the past of the mind having the memory in question. Beings endowed with perception can be said to mis-perceive things—which are either different than they appear to be or do not exist altogether; and beings endowed with memory can be said to mis-remember things—which were either different than they appeared to such beings or did not exist altogether. To present his own views on memory, Reid starts by first criticizing his precursors, primarily Locke and Hume, for operating with a so-called “store-house” model of memory. Contrary to what he takes Locke and Hume to be saying, memory is not a repository for ideas, which can be revived, whenever the person who had those ideas needs them again (for example, Locke, Essay II.xx.2). The main problem here, according to Reid, is that if an idea could indeed be revived in this way, that idea would be perceived again, and not actually remembered. This is because, as Reid understands them, Locke and Hume argue that ideas are the immediate objects of perception. So, whenever an idea is present to the mind—whether for the first time or when it is revived—the mind should be said to perceive it. What does memory contribute here, Reid asks?  Even though Reid is not the most charitable interpreter of Locke or of Hume, some of the criticisms he raises are cogent. There is a threat of circularity in the account of memory offered by both Locke and Hume, as Reid understands them. Both Locke and Hume’s accounts of memory seem to presuppose memory, rather than explain it: the ability to understand that a certain idea that is now present to the mind is exactly the same, qualitatively, and not numerically (since both Locke and Hume believe that ideas are fleeting), as an idea that was present to the mind at a previous moment of time, needs memory. The problem is that no idea contains any information, qualitative or representational, that could be used to identify that idea as being about the past.

So, what is Reid’s positive account of memory?  Here is what he says at the beginning of the Essay on memory:

Things remembered must be things formerly perceived or known. I remember the transit of Venus over the sun in the year 1769. I must therefore have perceived it at the time it happened, otherwise I could not now remember it. Our first acquaintance with any object of thought cannot be by remembrance. Memory can only produce continuance or renewal of a former acquaintance with the thing remembered. (EIP III. 1, p. 253-55)

This suggests that Reid is operating with a precursor of a distinction used in the psychological literature of the twentieth century, as advanced primarily by Tulving (1983). According to Tulving (1983) there are two main types of long-term memory: procedural—whereby one remembers how to perform certain actions (for instance, one remembers how to ride a bike or how to bake a cake), and declarative. This latter type is itself divided into episodic memory—whereby one remembers an experience that one underwent or an event one witnessed (for example, somebody remembers running in her first 5K race); and semantic memory—whereby one remembers that so-and-so is the case, where the fact remembered may be something that happened before one’s time (such as when one remembers that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo). Semantic memory is further distinguished from the episodic kind by the so-called “previous awareness condition” on episodic memory, which requires for someone to have been there in a capacity of witness or agent of an event, for that event to be episodically remembered. Reid thinks that something like the previous awareness condition on episodic memory must be satisfied in cases like the one quoted above: for someone to remember something, that person must have perceived that thing at an earlier moment of time.

There is a debate among Reid scholars concerning this very issue: did Reid think that all memory should be understood as episodic, or did he have room in his theory for semantic memory as well?  Some authors believe that, for Reid, all memory is episodic (for instance, Van Woudenberg (1999)); others believe that Reid was concerned with both semantic and episodic memory (such as Copenhaver (2009)). The consensus in the literature is, however, that Reid had nothing very interesting to say about procedural memory. This is important since it shows Reid to be very forward-thinking in his treatment of memory: he believes that episodic memory is fundamental for a being’s immediate knowledge of its past.

So, how does memory connect a being endowed with such a faculty with past events?  According to Reid, memory does not offer a being endowed with this faculty a present connection with an event experienced in the past. The access to past events is not by re-acquaintance, as Locke or Hume would say. The past acquaintance of the event itself is preserved through the conception and belief deployed in a memorial experience. This is because, according to Reid, apprehension, when employed by another faculty, such as perception and consciousness, is strictly related to the present moment:

It is by memory that we have an immediate knowledge of things past: The senses give us information of things only as they exist in the present moment; and this information, if it were not preserved by memory, would vanish instantly, and leave us as ignorant as if it had never been. (EIP III. 1, p. 253)

b. Memory and Personal Identity

Reid is famous for his criticism of Locke’s theory of personal identity. The success of this criticism depends on the explanation of the relationship that perception and consciousness, on the one hand, and memory, on the other, have with time. Perception and consciousness give a being endowed with such faculties immediate knowledge of presently existing things: of how the external world is, and of how the mental operations of the minds of such beings succeed one another, respectively. Memory, on the other hand, gives beings endowed with this faculty immediate knowledge of things past; and these things can be, in turn, external or internal. Someone can remember, for instance, having a certain nauseating sensation upon encountering some rotten food. That person will not only remember the state of the food, in this case, but also his having a certain unpleasant sensation.

Reid finds Locke’s theory of personal identity lacking on two counts: (i) first, Locke suggests that consciousness can extend to the past (Essay II.xxvii.9); (ii) second, Reid thinks that Locke is claiming that personal identity consists in memory—sometimes this theory of personal identity is called “the memory theory of personal identity.” The two issues are related, and the first one might very well be terminological: what Locke meant by “consciousness,” in this context, Reid means by “memory”:

Mr Locke attributes to consciousness the conviction we have of our past actions, as if a man may now be conscious of what he did twenty years ago. It is impossible to understand the meaning of this, unless by consciousness is meant memory, the only faculty by which we have an immediate knowledge of our past actions. (EIP III. 6, p. 277)

The second issue is more serious. The problem has to do with the fact that Locke seems to require sameness of memory for sameness of person. The type of memory involved here is episodic memory, and this might be why Locke thinks that consciousness is something that is needed here: in order to remember something about oneself episodically, a person must remember the event “from the inside.” For instance, if someone remembers, episodically, having run a 5K race this past Sunday, that person cannot be mistaken regarding who was the agent of the act of running in the race. That particular person also could not be mistaken about what it felt like to run a 5K this past Sunday. These are all characteristics of episodic memory. Furthermore, if that particular person cannot be mistaken with regard to who was the agent of this act of running (namely that person himself), then that particular person must have existed this past Sunday, at the time of the race. In thinking that memory is necessary for personal identity, Locke doesn’t seem to commit a grave error of reasoning.

Reid, however, argues that this account is absurd, because it leads to absurd consequences. To show that he is right, Reid discusses the now famous case of the brave officer:

Suppose a brave officer to have been flogged when a boy at school, for robbing an orchard, to have taken a standard from the enemy in his first campaign, and to have been made a general in advanced life: Suppose also, which must be admitted to be possible, that when made a general he was conscious of his taking the standard, but had absolutely lost the consciousness of his flogging.

These things being supposed, it follows, from Mr. LOCKE’s doctrine, that he who was flogged at school is the same person who took the standard, and that he who took the standard is the same person who was made a general. When it follows, if there be any truth in logic, that the general is the same person with him who was flogged at school. But the general’s consciousness does not reach so far back as his flogging, therefore, according to Mr. LOCKE’s doctrine, he is not the person who was flogged. Therefore the general is, and at the same time is not the same person as him who was flogged at school. (EIP III. 6, p. 276)

This case, which builds upon an objection raised by Joseph Butler (1736), is supposed to show that personal identity, understood as consisting in memory, is not a consistent notion. Here is why: due to the transitivity of numerical identity, the old general should be numerically identical with the kid who was flogged for robbing an orchard. This should follow, on the assumption that the kid who was flogged is numerically the same as the brave officer, who, in turn, is supposed to be numerically the same as the old general. Memory ensures that the boy who was flogged is the same as the brave officer, since the brave officer remembers that incident from his childhood. It ensures, moreover, that the general is the same as the brave officer, since the general remembers (episodically) that event from his youth. But, on Locke’s theory of identity, Reid claims, the general is not the same person as the kid robbing the orchard, since the general does not remember (episodically) that event from his childhood. There are two possibilities: (i) either to explain personal identity without making recourse to numerical identity, since transitivity holds for numerical identity, but this example shows that transitivity fails for personal identity. Or, (ii) to give up Locke’s theory of personal identity, since any theory that does not respect the rules of logic is irremediably flawed.

Reid chooses (ii) and argues that memory is neither necessary nor sufficient for personal identity. Memory is not a necessary condition for personhood, since during their lives, human beings witness or are the agents of many events of which they have no recollection at later moments of time. However, it would be absurd to claim that just because someone doesn’t remember something having happened, that person wasn’t actually there. Here is what Reid says on the issue: “I may have other good evidence of things which befell me, and which I do not remember: I know who bare me, and suckled me, but I do not remember these events” (EIP III. 4, p. 264). Neither is memory a sufficient condition for personal identity, according to Reid, since even though someone may be able to remember episodically that he was the agent or the witness of an event, it is not his remembering the event that makes it the case that he himself is the same person he was then. “It may here be observed […] that it is not my remembering any action of mine that makes me to be the person who did it. This remembrance makes me to know assuredly that I did it; but I might have done it, though I did not remember it” (EIP III. 4, p. 265). Memory gives someone immediate knowledge of a past event that person was the witness to or agent of, but it does not ensure that that person was actually there at the time of the event.

Reid’s theory of personal identity is deflationary: he argues that this notion is primitive. The only way to understand more about this relation is by contrast to other relations: “I can say that diversity is a contrary notion, and that similitude and dissimilitude are another couple of contrary relations, which every man easily distinguishes in his conception from identity and diversity” (EIP III. 4, p. 263). Just like Locke before him, Reid acknowledges that identity, in general (thus including the special case of personal identity), presupposes “an uninterrupted continuance of existence” (EIP III. 4, p. 263). Due to this feature of identity, there is no way to think that mental states and processes remain identical over time:

Hence we may infer, that identity cannot, in its proper sense, be applied to our pains, our pleasures, our thoughts, or any operation of our minds. The pain felt this day is not the same individual pain which I felt yesterday, though they may be similar in kind and degree, and have the same cause. The same may be said of every feeling, and of every operation of the mind: They are all successive in their nature like time itself, no two moments of which can be the same moment. (EIP III. 4, p. 263)

Thus, Reid thinks that persons should not be identified with their thoughts or feelings, but with the subject of such thoughts and feelings, which remains the same over time. This subject is an immaterial substance, a soul, which is best understood by reference to Leibniz’s notion of a monad (EIP III. 4, p. 264).

4. Intellectual Powers (Proper)

a. Conception

The fourth Essay is dedicated to conception, whose primary role is to be an ingredient (or concomitant) in all other operations of the mind. In this picture, conception is being used as part of the endeavor to gain knowledge of the external world (when it is employed by the senses), of the internal world (when it is employed by consciousness), and also to analyze the complex relationships that exist among the objects of the world, among numbers in mathematics, and among rules of reasoning in logic. As such, conception is a faculty that acts as a bridge, connecting the information gathered by the senses with the intellectual processing powers of judgment and reasoning.

Since conception is a simple operation of the mind, it cannot be subjected to a reductive definition any more than the other operations can be. However, as always, Reid argues that it has certain features which are useful to know in order to better understand how it functions, both when it is an ingredient or concomitant of other operations, and when it is employed on its own, as “bare conception.”

Reid argues that conception is an ingredient in all of the other operations of the human mind:

Our senses cannot give us the belief of any object, without giving some conception of it at the same time: No man can either remember or reason about things of which he hath no conception: When we will to exert any of our active powers, there must be some conception what we will to do: There can be no desire or aversion, love nor hatred, without some conception of the object: We cannot feel pain without conceiving it, though we can conceive it without feeling it. These things are self-evident. (EIP IV. 1, 296)

As already pointed out, the argument that sensations must be intentional, and hence take themselves as objects, is based on this idea that every operation of the mind has conception as an ingredient. The passage quoted above can indeed be read as saying that one must conceive of the pain one is feeling at a given moment of time in order to actually be able to feel it. However, it is controversial in Reid scholarship what exactly “conception” is supposed to mean in this context, despite its name. The issue concerns the fact that Reid believes that human beings share most of their perceptual and sensory abilities with lower-level animals and with human infants, who do not have a well-developed conceptual framework; thus, some authors argue that “conception” should not be taken to mean that unless one is able to have and deploy fully formed concepts, one will not be able to feel pain, for instance. In this interpretation, conception should be understood as the operation that allows beings endowed with this faculty to get acquainted with an object, be that object something that exists in the present, existed in the past, or will never exist.

On the other side of this controversy are those authors who point out that it is rather counter-intuitive to believe that conception does not operate via concepts—after all, the name might be indicative of something here. The role of conception, as an ingredient in all the other operations of the human mind, is to allow humans to secure a mental grip on something. Such a mental grip is secured by deploying a singular concept, understood to be something like a uniquely identifying definite description. In this interpretation, a being would not be able to have a sensation, a perception, or a memory unless it was able to deploy a singular concept, a uniquely identifying definite description isolating that thing in the world.

i. Bare Conception

Reid calls conception, as employed on its own, and not as an ingredient in any of the other operations of the human mind, “bare conception.” This suggests that when employed on its own, conception has a different role than when employed by a faculty of the mind in which it enters as an ingredient: “yet it may be found naked, detached from all others, and then it is called simple apprehension, or the bare conception of a thing” (EIP IV. 1, p. 286).

One of the most interesting features of bare conception is its ability to be used to think about objects without any heed being paid to their existence or non-existence, and also about propositions, without any judgment of their truth or falsity.

In bare conception there can neither be truth nor falsehood, because it neither affirms nor denies. Every judgment, and every proposition by which judgment is expressed, must be true or false; and the qualities of true and false, in their proper sense, can belong to nothing but to judgments, or to propositions which express judgment. In the bare conception of a thing there is no judgment, opinion, or belief included, and therefore it cannot be either true or false. (EIP IV. 1, p. 296)

Conception, in this sense, is that faculty allowing human beings to grasp the meaning of a proposition, which is the prerequisite for being able to judge a certain proposition as true or false: “it is one thing to conceive the meaning of a proposition; it is another to judge it to be true or false” (EIP I. 1, p. 25). Things are being conceived by beings endowed with this faculty in the following manner: an object is brought before the mind, with the help of conception: “I conceive an Egyptian pyramid. […] the thing conceived may be no proposition, but a simple term only, as a pyramid, an obelisk” (EIP I. 1, p. 25). Bare conception seems to require the mind of the conceiver to use certain concepts—simple terms—to bring forth objects to the mind in a way in which conception, when employed as an ingredient in other operations of the human mind, does not. This should not be surprising, though: once someone is able to think about something, even when he is not perceiving or remembering it, his mind will have established a certain grasp of that thing, classified and analyzed it, such that he will be able to think about it without using any of his other faculties. How this comes about will be better understood once Reid’s accounts of abstraction, judgment, and reasoning are presented, but it is already worth noting that it is not conception that supplies the mind with the most simple and exact notions the mind has of external things; these are acquired by using the mind’s superior reasoning powers (EIP IV. 1, p. 309).

Ideas as acts of the mind. Bare conception can be understood by analogy with painting, Reid argues, but he warns us that analogous thinking can take us only so far. Conception should be distinguished from painting, since “[t]he action of painting is one thing, the picture produced is another thing. The first is the cause, the second is the effect” (EIP IV. 1, p. 300). Reid’s worry is that that conception will be thought to work in the same way, to produce images of things in the mind, or ideas. Reid denies that this is the case, and puts forward a theory of ideas as acts of minds rather than objects of such mental operations: “Let this therefore be always remembered, that what is commonly called the image of a thing in the mind, is no more than the act or operation of the mind in conceiving it” (EIP, IV. 1, p. 300). To unpack this further, let us think about the elements involved in conceiving that the sun is yellow, for instance. Reid argues that in this act of conception, there are the following three elements: a mind, an act of conception that the sun is yellow, and the thing itself—the sun—external to the mind in question. Furthermore, he argues that there is something missing: an image in the mind, an additional representation, that has the explicit content of a yellow sun. He is willing to assert that this is just a verbal dispute, if everyone else is willing to agree with him that these images in the mind, or ideas, are nothing more than acts of conceiving—a moot point, given that everyone else was dead at the point when he was writing, and no one could have agreed with him. But, in effect, this is a serious conceptual point.

The analogy with painting should help classify conceptions into three classes, according to Reid. Just like a painter paints by using his imagination, by copying from other paintings, or by painting live subjects, there are conceptions which can be called “creatures of fancy”—like Don Quixote or Pegasus; conceptions of universals—which are analogous to paintings which copy other paintings; and conceptions of individual (existing) things—which are like paintings of live subjects.

Our conceptions, therefore, appear to be of three kinds: They are either the conceptions of individual things, the creatures of God; or they are conceptions of the meaning of general words; or they are the creatures of our own imagination. (EIP IV. 1, p. 305)

There are two issues worthy of attention in this classification: (i) Reid argues that people can name the creatures of fancy they invent, “conceive them distinctly, and reason consequentially concerning them, though they never had an existence” (EIP IV. 1, p. 301-2). And (ii) conceiving universals—like kinds and species of things—means nothing more nor less than to conceive the “meaning which other men who understand the language affix to the same words” (EIP IV. 1, p. 302). The first of these issues shows Reid to think that it is possible for fictional names to be used in the same way as regular names, even though the former category will be used to name nonexistents.

Reid’s Meinongeanism. Based on Reid’s idea that people can think and “reason consequentially” about fictional characters and objects, Nichols (2002) argued that Reid is a precursor of Meinong. Reid’s rejection of the way of ideas and his dedication to common sense philosophy are thought to amount to a rejection of the position according to which conceiving the nonexistent means nothing more than conceiving images or any other types of mental intermediaries. Centaurs, not centaur-inspired images or ideas, are the objects of such centaur thoughts. The only exception is constituted by a thought which is explicitly about a painting of a centaur, in which case it should be obvious to everyone that what is being conceived is an image, and not a mythological animal.

This one object which I conceive [a centaur], is not the image of an animal, it is an animal. I know what it is to conceive an image of an animal, and what it is to conceive an animal; and I can distinguish the one of these from the other without any danger of mistake. (EIP, IV. 2, p. 321)

Reid does not talk about different levels of existence; there is no doubt that centaurs do not exist as flesh-and-blood animals. It is important, however, to note that Reid ascribes intentionality to all the operations of the human mind, and this intentionality is to be resolved by understanding how conception works.

ii. Imagination

At the beginning of the EIP, when Reid is defining the terms he is going to use throughout the book, and at the beginning of the fourth Essay, where he lays down his views on conception, he claims that “conception” and “imagination” are synonymous words, and, moreover, that no reductive definition of these notions can be given, since they are supposed to denote simple operations of the mind. However, in the course of his analysis of conception, it becomes clear that imagination is not exactly the same thing as conception.

Reid argues that “imagination,” when used with its proper meaning, denotes a type of conception that is concerned primarily with the objects of sight (EIP IV. 3, p. 326). This restriction to sight probably has more to do with etymology than with the proper meaning of “imagination.” Imagination is supposed to apply to other senses, although Reid thinks that such uses are not altogether proper (EIP V. 6, p. 394). Any conception is of the imaginative kind when it is lively and about possible objects of sense. One consequence is that people can never be said to imagine universals, or propositions; neither are people supposed to think that anyone is imagining objects of sense, when they are actually perceiving them. A different kind of conception is responsible for the proper workings of perception.

Reid’s distinction between conception proper and imagination is one of the first instances in philosophy of mind in which imagination is presented as a faculty of the human mind related most closely to perception. Reid’s main breakthrough is his arguing that conception proper is used for understanding and acquiring general and abstract concepts, while imagination is used to think about things that might have existed, and, as such, might have presented beings endowed with such a faculty or system with perceptual stimuli.

b. Judgment and Reasoning

Reid dedicates two essays to the mental powers of judgment and reasoning with which he believes human beings to be endowed by nature. Essay VI, the one dedicated to judgment, presents the main elements of what Reid takes to be the philosophy of common sense. After a general introduction, in which he describes the fundamental characteristics of judgment, Reid argues that certain principles should be taken for granted as true. These are the first principles of common sense, which describe how the external and internal worlds work. These principles are self-evident and as such their truth cannot be demonstrated through any kind of reasoning. In the following essay, dedicated to reasoning, Reid argues that it is the purview of this faculty to produce judgments, or to combine and analyze them, in two main ways: deductively or probably. In what follows, these issues are discussed in turn, by first explaining what Reid thought about judgment, and then providing a schematic account of how deductive reasoning is supposed to be applied to the class of necessary truths, while probable reasoning is supposed to be applied to the class of contingent truths.

i. The Fundamental Characteristics of Judgment

Reid talks about judging in terms of offering mental assent or dissent to the issues represented by any particular judgment. Reid thinks that if human beings were not endowed with such an operation, they would not be able to reason abstractly. Without analyzing, abstracting, and judging when they reached correct conclusions, human beings would have been given reasoning in vain:

[S]ome exercise of judgment is necessary in the formation of all abstract and general conceptions, whether more simple or more complex; in dividing, in defining, and in general, in forming all clear and distinct conceptions of things, which are the only fit materials of reasoning. (EIP VI. 1, p. 413)

Some authors argue that judging should not be understood as involving just mental affirming or denial of its content, since that would not distinguish judging from believing. Although Reid’s official characterization of judgment is meant to clarify how this mental operation accompanies all others, belief already implies a mental assent/dissent given to its content. In the picture Reid is putting forward, there seems to be no way to explain why somebody would assent (dissent) to something without that person’s already having a belief that it is true (or false). Judgment, therefore, seems to presuppose belief. Judgment, then, would simply be superfluous, while belief would be ubiquitous, either as a concomitant or an ingredient in all other operations of the human mind (Rysiew (2004): 65). This, however, contradicts Reid’s official characterization of judgment:

[A] man who feels pain, judges and believes that he is really pained. The man who perceives an object, believes that it exists, and is what he distinctly perceives it to be; nor is it in his power to avoid such judgment. And the like may be said of memory, and of consciousness. Whether judgment ought to be called a necessary concomitant of these operations, or rather a part or ingredient of them, I do not dispute. But it is certain, that all of them are accompanied with a determination that something is true or false, and a consequent belief. If this determination be not judgment, it is an operation that has got no name; for it is not simple apprehension, neither is it reasoning; it is a mental affirmation or negation; it may be expressed by a proposition affirmative or negative, and it is accompanied with the firmest belief. (EIP VI. 1, p. 409)

To save Reid from this inconsistency, some have argued that the distinctive character of judgment emerges not from his official characterization of this mental operation, but rather from his comparing it to an external, real-life tribunal. This analogy is not perfect, and per Reid’s instructions (EIP I. 4, p. 55), people should not be lulled into a sense of confidence that they really know what they are talking about when they invoke analogous thinking, especially with regard to analogies concerning the body—or all things external—and mind—or all things internal. However, people are entitled to use the same name—“judgment”—to refer to both the process that results in an assenting/dissenting opinion in a court of law, and to the one that results in an assenting/dissenting belief in the internal tribunal, in virtue of the process involving reasoned reflection and deliberation. The fundamental characteristic of judgment in Reid’s system is its deliberative/reflective character, and not its relation to assent or dissent, which is, in turn, reserved for belief (Rysiew (2004): 67).

ii. Common Sense

Reid argues that sense and judgment are intrinsically related, such that sense always implies judgment: “A man of sense is a man of judgment” (EIP VI. 2, p. 424). He believes this to hold true both for what he calls “the external senses” (for instance, touch, taste, sight) and for the so-called “internal senses” (for instance, moral sense and internal taste). Since Reid believes (mistakenly, as it was discussed above) that judgment is the operation of the mind that helps people determine, “concerning any thing that might be expressed by a proposition, whether it be true or false” (EIP VI. 3, p. 435), and since he talks about common sense in the Essay dedicated to illuminating the nature of judgment, it should be obvious that he thinks that common sense is a specialized kind of judgment, understood as a faculty of the human mind. To wit, Reid thinks that common sense is that minimal degree of understanding that every adult human being possesses (or should possess), such that he can function well in this world. Common sense is concerned only with propositions that express self-evident truths (or falsehoods); judgment, more generally, is concerned with propositions that express any other kinds of truths or falsehoods.

Reid believes that self-evident principles are at the foundation of any kind of knowledge and that common sense is the mental operation that discovers such principles for human beings:

All knowledge, and all science, must be built upon principles that are self-evident; and of such principles, every man who has common sense is a competent judge, when he conceives them distinctly. Hence it is, that disputes often terminate in an appeal to common sense. (EIP VI. 2, p. 426)

This suggests that Reid thinks that human beings are all endowed with a mental operation—common sense—that is meant to discover the first principles upon which any kind of science is built. These first principles, when considered distinctly, namely in isolation from anything else, will be immediately found to be true, just as anything parading as a first principle, when considered distinctly, will be found to be false. No one undergoes a complicated reasoning procedure to discover the truth (or falsehood) of such principles; everyone just knows this, because, in being self-evident, these principles wear their truths conspicuously. In other words, what results from exercising the faculty of common sense is intuitive knowledge. Reid explains that reason and common sense do not conflict, because common sense is part of reason, just as judging does not oppose reason:

We ascribe to reason two offices, or two degrees. The first is to judge of things self-evident; the second to draw conclusions that are not self-evident from those that are. The first of these is the province, and the sole province of common sense; and therefore it coincides with reason in its whole extent, and is only another name for one branch or one degree of reasoning. (EIP VI. 2, p. 433)

Deduction from true principles can never contradict common sense, since “truth will always be consistent with itself” (EIP VI. 2, p. 433).

iii. First Principles of Common Sense

Reid thus believes that human beings are endowed with a faculty that gives them immediate knowledge of self-evident principles. He calls this faculty “common sense,” but it is more common to refer to the results of employing this faculty by the name of “intuitive knowledge.” The main idea here is that such knowledge of first principles is widespread: for instance, people are said to intuit axioms in mathematics and in logic; they also are thought to intuit first principles in morals, just as they intuit first principles regarding the expression of beauty in the arts, Reid believes. This knowledge is not innate; after all, as an Empiricist, Reid thinks that all knowledge is acquired. The faculty of common sense, just like all the other original faculties, is innate, in the sense that they are part of the mental architecture of a human being. The sense in which this intuitive knowledge is immediate, without it being innate is the following: once reasoning and the ability to process a human language are sufficiently developed, a human being will be able to know, non-inferentially, that certain propositions, when considered distinctly, are true.

Reid calls such propositions first principles, and he argues that they can be divided into two classes: first principles of contingent truths, on the one hand, and first principles of necessary truth, on the other. As Van Cleve (1999) points out, just because the former type of principles have contingent truths as their contents, this does not mean that the principles themselves are, in any way, less necessary than those of necessary truths. It is the truths themselves that are either necessary or contingent:

The truths that fall within the compass of human knowledge, whether they be self-evident, or deduced from those that are self-evident, may be reduced to two classes. They are either necessary and immutable truths, whose contrary is impossible, or they are contingent and mutable, depending upon some effect of will and power, which had a beginning, and may have an end. (EIP VI. 5, p. 468)

Since this article is concerned with the main tenets of Reid’s philosophy of mind, first principles are interesting for this purpose only in as much as they are discovered by a faculty—common sense—with which every human being is supposed to be endowed, and they will not be discussed in more detail.

iv. Reasoning

If the first principles of common sense are discovered by employing the operation of intuitive judging, reasoning proper is to be employed to discover whatever conclusions follow from self-evident principles. Since there are two classes of first principles, Reid argues that there are two types of reasoning. Demonstrative reasoning is employed to draw conclusions that follow from the first principles of necessary truths, whereas probable reasoning is employed to draw conclusions that follow from the first principles of contingent truths (EIP VII. 3, p. 556).

The strength of demonstrative reasoning, which is commonly employed in mathematics and logic, is such that for showing that a conclusion follows from some axioms (or first principles) nothing else needs to be done other than offering one demonstration. Reid thinks that it would be superfluous to try to give several different demonstrations to prove one conclusion, while employing demonstrative reasoning, even though a variety of proofs may be available in practice:

To add more demonstrations of the same conclusion, would be a kind of tautology in reasoning; because one demonstration, clearly comprehended, gives all the evidence we are capable of receiving. (EIP VII. 3, p. 556)

It is not so with probable reasoning:

The strength of probable reasoning …depends not upon any one argument, but upon many, which unite their force, and lead to the same conclusion. Any one of them by itself would be insufficient to convince; but the whole taken together may have a force that is irresistible, so that to desire more evidence would be absurd. (EIP VII. 3, p. 556)

Probable reasoning is the method of choice for all the natural sciences, whose true propositions are contingent. According to Reid, probable reasoning comes in degrees, whereas demonstrative reasoning does not admit degrees; it is absolute.

In every step of demonstrative reasoning, the inference is necessary, and we perceive it to be impossible that the conclusion should not follow from the premises. In probable reasoning, the connection between the premises and the conclusion is not necessary, nor do we perceive it to be impossible that the first should be true while the last is false. (EIP VII. 1, p. 544-45)

Although Reid argues that probable reasoning is of a different kind than demonstrative reasoning (EIP VII. 3, p. 557), according to Lehrer (1989: 174), probable reasoning can lead to conclusions that are certain. Reid thinks that the vulgar is mistaken when contrasting probable reasoning with certainty. Probable reasoning, according to Reid, has degrees of evidence, “from the very least to the greatest which we call certainty” (EIP VII. 3, p. 557).

Hume, in the Treatise, argues that all knowledge should be reduced to probability, because human beings are fallible creatures, endowed with fallible faculties. Reid’s understanding of probable reasoning as a type of reasoning that leads to certain conclusions constitutes a direct refutation of Hume’s argument. The problem, Reid points out, is that requiring a proof of the reliability of the human faculties would be circular, because it could be given only by using those reasoning powers themselves, “and is therefore that kind of sophism which Logicians call petitio principii” (or “begging the question”) (EIP VII. 4, p. 571). Hume writes that “[n]ature, by an absolute and uncontrollable necessity, has determined us to judge, as to breathe and feel” (Hume, Treatise I.iv.1, p. 183). Reid agrees with Hume in part: probable reasoning concerning cause and effect, for instance, is the result of an innate principle of human constitution. Such a principle is known to be true, by intuition, and by exercising the faculty of common sense. But Reid also disagrees with Hume, and points out that probable reasoning concerning cause and effect is not merely a matter of custom. The relevant first principle of contingent truth allows human beings to be certain that effect follows its cause, not because they reason that it is so, but because they judge (intuitively) that it is so.

5. Taste

Reid considers the principles of the so-called “internal taste” in Essay VIII, the last of the EIP. Contemporary philosophy of mind is mostly silent concerning the way human beings interact and appreciate works of art; the widespread belief seems to be that such issues belong to value theory rather than to the philosophy of mind proper. Reid, however, is part of a different tradition, which sought to explain the interest humans have in art and its artifacts, and consequently the interactions humans seek with said artifacts starting by observing human psychology. As such, he, just like some of his predecessors (for example, Hume, Hutcheson, and Shaftesbury), thinks that adult human beings are endowed with a special faculty, taste, which is supposed to help them appreciate beautiful or aesthetically relevant things, and disapprove those that are found to be lacking the sought-after qualities. Reid is thus mostly describing and analyzing the aesthetic experience, rather than addressing issues that are relevant from the point of view of the philosophy of art. In the course of doing this, however, he is interested in questions pertaining to art and artworks. Reid has an expression theory of art, in that he is interested in how art can express emotion, or, better still, how artists can and do express emotions through an artistic medium. If art is a sort of language, the faculty of taste, as applied to the aesthetic qualities of artworks, is the way to be made privy to this language: by employing this faculty, human beings become sensitive to the signs and decode their meaning. However, this is not the only way people employ their internal sense: by using this faculty they also become sensitive to the aesthetic qualities of the world. Reid’s idea is that just like a painter is expressing an emotion in his works, God is expressing certain emotions in his works. One cannot gain complete knowledge of the external world, in this picture, unless one understands and appreciates the beauty of the world.

a. Why This Faculty Is Called “Internal Taste”

This name indicates that the faculty itself is of the same kin as the other type of taste, but in what sense is it “internal”?  To better understand this, consider the distinction that Reid draws between things internal and things external to the mind at the beginning of the EIP:

When…we speak of things in the mind, we understand by this, things of which the mind is the subject. Excepting the mind itself, and things in the mind, all other things are said to be external. (EIP I. 1, p. 22)

This distinction is as elucidating as it is confusing: since both types of taste are operations of the mind, they both are, in a sense, internal. However, Reid’s idea is that the “external taste” is supposed to help those beings that have it register information about certain pleasing and displeasing qualities of food and drink. The objects that can be food and drink are external to the mind—they are physical things to be found in the world. So, by analogy, it should probably be thought that “the internal taste” is supposed to help those beings that are endowed with it register information about certain pleasing and displeasing qualities of internal objects—namely, minds and their qualities.

Reid does not argue that other minds can be directly perceived, but he takes it to be a first principle of common sense that other minds exist (the 8th first principle of contingent truths, EIP VI. 5, p. 482-483), and that people learn of their existence by correctly deciphering certain signs. This interpretation of natural signs is innate, since, Reid claims, even small children respond in the correct (that is, expected) way in the presence of an angry parent, for instance. In this picture, the internal sense of taste is meant to discern the quality of excellence that other minds possess, in addition to enhancing the knowledge people have of “the existence of life and intelligence in our fellow-men.” To do so, however, the internal taste orients itself to material objects (since it cannot directly interact with other minds), and identifies that which is beautiful, in nature and in the fine arts (EIP VIII. 1, p. 573).

b. An Objectivist Account of Beauty

Putting everything together, here is the picture that emerges: Reid believes that beauty is a property both of objects and of minds. Moreover, he thinks that beauty itself is both a primary and a secondary quality of objects. Reid’s claim that beauty is a real property of objects directly opposes the idea that beauty is just a feeling in an agent’s mind, advanced by Hume and Hutcheson. As in morals, in the domain of aesthetic value, Reid is an objectivist (at least, according to Benbaji (1999)). The aesthetic (or internal) taste has the dual role of discovering what material objects are beautiful, and, indirectly, what minds, which created those beautiful objects, are inherently beautiful. Beauty, in this picture, is not a feeling in one’s mind, but something external to one’s mind. The internal taste is used to reach aesthetic judgments by evaluating material objects, which express the mental attributes of the artist. Without excellence in the mind, no product of that mind can be perceived as beautiful. Beauty is thus a property of the artist’s mind, and is displayed by the artifacts he creates only in a derivative sense. The internal taste functions very much like perception of external objects: certain signs of aesthetic qualities function to trigger a conception and belief in the existence of the aesthetic quality in question. The internal taste is thus assimilated to the external sense of taste, since both senses are supposed to contribute to the perception of specific qualities of objects.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Hume, D. (2007). A Treatise of Human Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press. (Original work published in 1739-40.)
    • The standard edition of Hume’s Treatise.
  • Hume, D. (1874-75). “Of the Standard of Taste,” in vol. 3 of The Philosophical Works of David Hume. Edited by T. H. Green and T. H. Grose. 4 volumes, London: Longman, Green.
    • Hume considers whether there can be any objective standard of taste.
  • Hutcheson, F. (2004). An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Edited by W. Leidhold. Indianapolis: Liberty Fund. (Original work published in 1726.)
    • This presents Hutcheson’s sentimentalist understanding of beauty.
  • Locke, J. (1979). An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Oxford: Clarendon Press. (Original work published in 1700.)
    • This is the standard edition of Locke’s Essay.
  • Reid, T. (1997) An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense. Edited by Derek R. Brookes. Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press. (Original work published in 1764.)
    • This is the standard edition of Reid’s Inquiry. Cited in text as IHM, chapter, section, page number. Cited in text as Essay, book, chapter, section number.
  • Reid, T. (2002) Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man—A Critical Edition. Edited by Derek R. Brookes. Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press. (Original work published in 1785.)
    • This is the standard edition of Reid’s work on the intellectual powers. Cited in text as EIP, essay, chapter, page number.
  • Reid, T. (2010) Essays on the Active Powers of Man—A Critical Edition. Edited by Knud Haakonssen and James A. Harris. Edinburgh, UK: Edinburgh University Press. (Original work published in 1788.)
    • This is the standard edition of Reid’s published work on action theory.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alston, W. P. (1989). “Reid on Perception and Conception.” In M. Dalgarno, & E. Matthews (Eds.) The Philosophy of Thomas Reid, (pp. 35–47). Dordrecht: Kluwer.
    • Argues that conception, despite its name, does not involve the use of any concepts.
  • Benbaji, H. (1999). “Reid’s View of Aesthetic and Secondary Qualities.” Reid Studies 2, 31-46.
  • Buras, T. (2005). “The Nature of Sensations in Reid.” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 22(3), 221–238.
    • Interprets Reid as saying that sensations are reflexive acts of the mind, taking themselves as objects.
  • Buras, T. (2008). “Three Grades of Immediate Perception: Thomas Reid’s Distinctions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 76(3), 603–632.
    • Explains that there are three senses of “immediacy,” in Reid, making clear the connection between immediacy and original perception, and acquired perception.
  • Buras, T. (2009). “The Function of Sensations in Reid.” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 47(3), 329–353.
    • Explains what function sensations perform: primarily, they give sentient beings information about how they react to the environment.
  • Copenhaver, R. (2000). “Thomas Reid’s Direct Realism.” Reid Studies, 4(1), 17–34.
    • Explains Reid’s account of perception, classifying it as direct realism.
  • Copenhaver, R. (2004). “A Realism for Reid: Mediated but Direct.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 12(1), 61–74.
    • Explains the intermediary role of sensations in the chain of perception.
  • Copenhaver, R. (2010). “Thomas Reid on Acquired Perception.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 91(3), 285–312.
    • Offers a compelling argument to show that acquired perception is indeed a form of perception, and not reasoning.
  • Copenhaver, R. (2006a). “Thomas Reid’s Philosophy of Mind: Consciousness and Intentionality.” Philosophy Compass, 1(3), 279–289.
    • Offers a comprehensive explanation of Reid’s philosophy of mind, centered on the concept of intentionality.
  • Copenhaver, R. (2006b). “Thomas Reid’s Theory of Memory.” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23(2), 171–187.
    • Discusses the ways in which memory gives people direct knowledge of the past, according to Reid.
  • Copenhaver, R. (2009). “Reid on Memory and Personal Identity.” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Offers a comprehensive account of Reid’s theory of memory.
  • Falkenstein, L. (2004). “Nativism and the Nature of Thought in Reid’s Account of Our Knowledge of the External World”. In T. Cuneo, & R. Van Woudenberg (Eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Reid, (pp. 156–179). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Explains Reid’s brand of nativism, which allows him to keep fixed certain principles which are dear to the British Empiricists.
  • Falkenstein, L. and Giovanni Grandi (2003). “The Role of Material Impressions in Reid’s Theory of Vision: A Critique of Gideon Yaffe’s ‘Reid on the Perception of the Visible Figure.’’’ Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 1(2), 117-133.
    • Argue that no sensations are involved in the perception of visible figure.
  • Folescu, M. (2015). “Perceiving Bodies Immediately: Thomas Reid’s Insight.” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 32(1), 19–36.
    • Argues that bodies are objects of original perception, despite perceivers’ gaining only relative (that is, not direct) notions of them by the use of their senses.
  • Folescu, M. (2015). “Perceptual and Imaginative Conception.” In Todd Buras and Rebecca Copenhaver (eds.), Mind, Knowledge and Action: Essays in Honor of Reid's Tercentenary, (pp. 52–74). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that Reid should have been sensitive to the fact that conception is not employed in the same manner by the perceptual and by the imaginative systems, respectively.
  • Folescu, M.  “Thinking About Different Nonexistents Of The Same Kind.” Published online first in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. DOI: 10.1111/phpr.12196
    • Argues that Reid’s account provides the tools for entertaining singular imaginings of different fantastical creatures of the same kind.
  • Gallie, R. (1997). “Reid: Conception, Representation and Innate Ideas.” Hume Studies, 23(2), 315-35.
    • Argues that conception requires linguistic representation.
  • Ganson, T. (2008). “Reid’s Rejection of Intentionalism.” Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 4, 245–263.
    • Argues that sensation is not intentional: it is not about any objects, be those objects the sensations themselves.
  • Kivy, P. (2004). “Reid’s Philosophy of Art.” In T. Cuneo, & R. Van Woudenberg (Eds.) The Cambridge Companion to Reid, (pp. 267–312). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Argues that Reid is one of the first philosophers interested in philosophy of art, rather than aesthetics, in general.
  • Kivy, P. (1978). “Thomas Reid and the Expression Theory of Art.” The Monist, 61(2), 167–183.
    • Argues that Reid has, primarily, an expression theory of the arts: artworks express the emotions of their creators.
  • Kroeker, E. R. (2010). “Reid on Natural Signs, Taste and Moral Perception.” In S. Roeser (Ed.), Reid on Ethics: Philosophers in Depth, (pp. 46–66). Palgrave Macmillan.
    • Argues that original beauty and other aesthetic qualities are intrinsic qualities of minds.
  • Lehrer, K. (1978). “Reid on Primary and Secondary Qualities.” The Monist, 61(2), 184–191.
    • Presents and defends the distinction between these two types of properties of objects.
  • Lehrer, K. (1989). Thomas Reid. London and New York: Routledge.
    • Offers a comprehensive exposition of Reid’s philosophy.
  • Manns, J. W. (1988). “Beauty and Objectivity in Thomas Reid.” British Journal of Aesthetics, 28, 119–131.
    • Argues that beauty is objective, for Reid, on the principles of common sense, but not objective, on the correct philosophical principles.
  • Nauckhoff, J. C. (1994). “Objectivity and Expression in Thomas Reid’s Aesthetics.” Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 52, 183–191.
    • Argues that minds are excellent, hence beautiful, and that any other object deemed beautiful has that quality in virtue of being a sign of some excellence.
  • Nichols, R. (2002). “Reid on Fictional Objects and The Way of Ideas.” The Philosophical Quarterly, 52(209), 582–601.
    • Argues that Reid’s rejection of the “way of ideas” leads him to adopt a form of moderate Meinongeanism, before Meinong.
  • Nichols, R. (2007). Thomas Reid’s Theory of Perception. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Analyzes the major tenets of Reid’s theory of perception.
  • Pappas, G. S. (1989). “Sensation and Perception in Reid.” Noûs, 23(2), 155–167.
    • Defends the distinction between sensation and perception in Reid; a classic piece in Reid studies.
  • Rysiew, P. (1999). “Reid’s [Mis]charaterization of Judgment.” Reid Studies 3(1), 63–68.
    • Argues that, despite his official characterization, “judgment,” for Reid, should be understood to mean reflection.
  • Tulving, E. (1983). Elements of Episodic Memory. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Explains what types of memory there are, and why episodic memory is fundamental.
  • Van Cleve, J. (1999). “Reid on the First Principles of Contingent Truths.” Reid Studies 3, 3–30.
    • Argues that the first principles of contingent truths allow Reid to be a reliabilist with regard to the cognitive faculties of human beings, without any kind of circularity.
  • Van Cleve, J. (2004). “Reid’s Theory of Perception.” In T. Cuneo, & R. Van Woudenberg (Eds.) The Cambridge Companion to Reid, (pp. 101–133). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A comprehensive account of Reid’s theory of perception, with special care given to identifying Reid’s type of realism: direct or indirect. This is the best starting point for anyone interested in getting a better understanding of Reid’s theory of perception.
  • Van Woudenberg, R. (1999). “Thomas Reid on Memory.” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 37(1), 117–133.
    • Discusses the elements of Reid’s theory of memory.
  • Van Woudenberg, R. (2004). “Reid on Memory and the Identity of Persons.” In T. Cuneo, & R. Van Woudenberg (Eds.) The Cambridge Companion to Thomas Reid, (pp. 204–221). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Discusses the role of memory in personal identity.
  • Wolterstorff, N. (2001). Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Explains Reid’s terminology and way of thinking such that contemporary epistemologists can see Reid as an exponent and precursor of some of the issues discussed today.
  • Yaffe, G. (2003a). “The Office of an Introspectible Sensation: A Reply to Falkenstein and Grandi.” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 1(2), 135–140.
    • Responds to the criticisms raised by Falkenstein and Grandi to the idea that all kinds of perceptions, including the perception of visible figure, involve sensations.
  • Yaffe, G. (2003b). “Reid on the Perception of Visible Figure.” Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 1(2), 103–115.
    • Argues that perceiving the visible figure of objects, for Reid, involves having sensations of color.


Author Information

Marina Folescu
University of Missouri
U. S. A.