Aquinas: Philosophical Theology
In addition to his moral philosophy, Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) is well-known for his theological writings. He is arguably the most eminent philosophical theologian ever to have lived. To this day, it is difficult to find someone whose work rivals Aquinas’ in breadth and influence. Although his work is not limited to illuminating Christian doctrine, virtually all of what he wrote is shaped by his theology. Therefore it seems appropriate to consider some of the theological themes and ideas that figure prominently in his thought.
The volume and depth of Aquinas’ work resists easy synopsis. Nevertheless, an abridged description of his work may help us appreciate his philosophical skill in exploring God’s nature and defending Christian teaching. Although Aquinas does not think that philosophical reasoning can provide an exhaustive account of the divine nature, it is (he insists) both a source of divine truth and an aid in exonerating the intellectual credibility of those doctrines at the heart of the Christian faith. From this perspective, philosophical reasoning can be (to use a common phrase) a tool in the service of theology.
An adequate understanding of Aquinas’ philosophical theology requires that we first consider the twofold manner whereby we come to know God: reason and sacred teaching. Our discussion of what reason reveals about God will naturally include an account of philosophy’s putative success in demonstrating both God’s existence and certain facts about God’s nature. Yet because Aquinas also thinks that sacred teaching contains the most comprehensive account of God’s nature, we must also consider his account of faith—the virtue whereby we believe well with respect to what sacred teaching reveals about God. Finally, we will consider how Aquinas employs philosophical reasoning when explaining and defending two central Christian doctrines: the Incarnation and the Trinity.
Table of Contents
- Preliminary Matters: How Can We Know Divine Truth?
- Natural Theology
- Christian Doctrine
- References and Further Reading
How can we know realities of a divine nature? Aquinas posits a “twofold mode of truth concerning what we profess about God” (SCG 1.3.2). First, we may come to know things about God through rational demonstration. By demonstration Aquinas means a form of reasoning that yields conclusions that are necessary and certain for those who know the truth of the demonstration’s premises. Reasoning of this sort will enable us to know, for example, that God exists. It can also demonstrate many of God’s essential attributes, such as his oneness, immateriality, eternality, and so forth (SCG 1.3.3). Aquinas is not claiming that our demonstrative efforts will give us complete knowledge of God’s nature. He does think, however, that human reasoning can illuminate some of what the Christian faith professes (SCG 1.2.4; 1.7). Those aspects of the divine life which reason can demonstrate comprise what is called natural theology, a subject we will address in section 2.
Obviously, some truths about God surpass what reason can demonstrate. Our knowledge of them will therefore require a different source of divine truth, namely, sacred teaching. According to Aquinas, sacred teaching contains the most complete and reliable account of what we profess about God (SCG I.5.3). Of course, whether sacred teaching is authoritative vis-à-vis divine realties depends on whether what it says about God is true. How, then, can we be confident that sacred teaching is, in fact, a reliable source of divine knowledge? An extended treatment of this matter requires that we consider the role faith plays in endorsing what sacred teaching proposes for belief. This issue is addressed in section 3.
Generally speaking, natural theology (NT) is a discipline that seeks to demonstrate God’s existence or aspects of his nature by means of human reason and experience. The conclusions of NT do not rely on supernaturally revealed truths; its point of departure is that which can be ascertained by means of the senses or rational methods of investigation. So understood, NT is primarily a philosophical enterprise. As one commentator explains, NT “amounts to forgoing appeals to any putative revelation and religious experience as evidence for the truth of propositions, and accepting as data only those few naturally evident considerations that traditionally constitute data acceptable for philosophy generally. That’s what makes it natural theology” (Kretzmann, 1997: 2).
A caveat: It is a mistake to construe NT as an autonomous branch of inquiry, at least in Aquinas’ case. In fact, partitioning NT from divine revelation does a disservice to the theological nature of Aquinas’ overall project (for an extended defense of this position, see Hibbs, 1995 and 1998; Stump, 2003: 26-32). For Aquinas is not content with simply demonstrating the fact of God’s existence. The first article of ST makes this clear. There, he asks whether knowledge of God requires something more than what philosophical investigation is able to tell us (ST Ia 1.1). His answer is yes: although natural human reason can tell us quite a bit about God, it cannot give us salvific knowledge. He writes: “it was necessary for the salvation of man that certain truths which exceed human reason should be made known to him by divine revelation” (Ibid.). In discussing truths that human reason can demonstrate, then, we should keep in mind that they comprise an overture to a more enriched and explicitly theological account of God’s nature.
Aquinas thinks there are a variety of ways to demonstrate God’s existence. But before he turns to them, he addresses several objections to making God an object of demonstration. This essay will consider two of those objections. According to the first objection, God’s existence is self-evident. Therefore, any effort to demonstrate God’s existence is, at best, unnecessary (ST Ia 2.1 ad 1; SCG 1.10.1). For Aquinas, this objection rests on a confusion about what it means for a statement to be self-evident. He explains: a statement is self-evident if its predicate is contained in the essence of the subject (ST Ia 2.1). For example, the statement a triangle is a 3-sided planar figure is self-evident because the predicate-term (3-sided planar figure) is a part of the subject-term’s (triangle) nature. Anyone who knows what a triangle is will see that this statement is axiomatic; it needs no demonstration. On the other hand, this statement will not appear self-evident to those who do not know what a triangle is. To employ Aquinas’ parlance, the statement is self-evident in itself (per se notum secundum se) but not self-evident to us (per se notum quod nos) (ST IaIIae 94.2; Cf. ST Ia 2.1). For a statement is self-evident in itself so long as it accurately predicates of the subject-term the essential characteristics it has. Whether a statement is self-evident to us, however, will depend on whether we understand the subject-term to have those characteristics.
The aforementioned distinction (per se notum secundum se/per se notum quod nos) is helpful when responding to the claim that God’s existence is self-evident. For Aquinas, the statement God exists is self-evident in itself since existence is a part of God’s essence or nature (that is, God is his existence—a claim to which we’ll turn below). Yet the statement is not self-evident to us because God’s essence is not something we can comprehend fully. Indeed, it is unlikely that even those acquainted with the idea of God will, upon reflecting on the idea, understand that existence is something that God has necessarily. Although Aquinas does not deny that knowledge of God is naturally implanted in us, such knowledge is, at best, inchoate and imprecise; it does not convey absolutely that God exists (ST Ia 2.1 ad 1). We acquire definitive knowledge of God’s existence in the same way we come to understand other natural causes, namely by identifying certain facts about the world—observable effects whose obviousness makes them better known to us—and then attempting to demonstrate their pre-existing cause (ST Ia 2.2). In other words, knowledge of God’s existence must be acquired through a posteriori demonstrations. We will consider one of these demonstrations below. At this point, we simply are trying to show that since God’s existence is not (to us) self-evident, the use of theistic demonstrations will not be a pointless exercise.
The second objection to the demonstrability of God’s existence is straightforward: that which is of faith cannot be demonstrated. Since God’s existence is an article of faith, it is not something we can demonstrate (ST Ia 2.2 obj. 1). Aquinas’ response to this argument denies that God’s existence is an article of faith. That is, he denies that God’s existence is a supernaturally revealed truth. Instead, God’s existence is a demonstrable fact which supernaturally revealed truths presuppose. The assent of faith involves embracing doctrinal teachings about God, whose existence is already assumed. For this reason, Aquinas describes God’s existence not as an article of faith but as a preamble to the articles. As such, God’s existence can be the subject of demonstration.
Aquinas concedes that, for some people, God’s existence will be a matter of faith. After all, not everyone will be able to grasp the proofs for God’s existence. Thus for some people it is perfectly appropriate to accept on the basis of sacred teaching that which others attempt to demonstrate by means of reason (ST Ia 2.2 ad 1).
In the Summa Theologiae Ia 2.3, Aquinas offers five demonstrations for God’s existence (these are famously referred to as the “five ways”). Each demonstration proceeds roughly as follows: Aquinas identifies some observable phenomenon and then attempts to show that, necessarily, the cause of that phenomenon is none other than God. The phenomena Aquinas cites in these demonstrations include: 1) motion; 2) the existence of efficient causes; 3) the reality of contingency; 4) the different grades of perfection in the natural order; and 5) the end-directed activity of natural objects. We should note that these demonstrations are highly abridged versions of arguments he addresses at length elsewhere (most notably, SCG I.13). Constraints of space do not permit an explication of each argument. But it will be helpful to consider at least one argument in order to see how these demonstrations typically proceed.
Aquinas’ argument from efficient causes—also known as “the second way”—is straightforward and does not lend itself to many interpretative disputes. The argument is as follows:
In the world of sense we find there is an order of efficient causes. There is no case known (neither is it, indeed, possible) in which a thing is found to be the efficient cause of itself; for then it would be prior to itself, which is impossible. Now in efficient causes it is not possible to go on to infinity, because in all efficient causes following in order, the first is the cause of the intermediate cause, and the intermediate [cause] is the cause of the ultimate cause, whether the intermediate cause be several, or only one. Now to take away the cause is to take away the effect. Therefore, if there be no first cause among efficient causes, there will be no ultimate, nor any intermediate cause. But if in efficient causes it is possible to go on to infinity, there will be no first efficient cause, neither will there be an ultimate effect, nor any intermediate efficient causes; all of which is plainly false. Therefore it is necessary to admit a first efficient cause, to which everyone gives the name of God (ST Ia 2.3).
For our purposes, it might be helpful to present Aquinas’ argument in a more formal way:
- The world contains instances of efficient causation (given).
- Nothing can be the efficient cause of itself.
- So, every efficient cause seems to have a prior cause.
- But we cannot have an infinite regress of efficient causes.
- So there must be a first efficient cause “to which everyone gives the name God.”
First premise. Like all of Aquinas’ theistic demonstrations, this one begins by citing an observable fact about the world, namely, that there are causal forces that produce various effects. Aquinas does not say what these effects are, but according to John Wippel, we can assume that these effects would include “substantial changes (generation and corruption of substances) as well as various instances of motion … that is, alteration, local motion, increase, and decrease” (2006: Wippel, 58). Note here that there is no need to prove this premise. Its truth is manifestly obvious, and thus Aquinas employs it as an argumentative point of departure.
Second premise. Aquinas then claims that it is impossible for any being to be the efficient cause of itself. Why is self-causation impossible? For the sake of ease, consider what it would mean for something to be the cause of its own existence (although this is not the only form of self-causation Aquinas has in mind). In order to bring about the existence of anything, one needs a certain amount of causal power. Yet a thing cannot have causal power unless it exists. But if something were to be the cause of itself—that is, if it were to bring about its own existence—it would have to exist prior to itself, which is impossible (ST Ia 2.3). Hence the third premise: every efficient cause must have a prior cause.
Aquinas’ argument in the first way—which is structurally similar to the argument from efficient causality—employs a parallel line of reasoning. There, he says that to be in motion is to move from potentiality to actuality. When something moves, it goes from having the ability to move to the activity of moving. Yet something cannot be the source of its own movement. Everything that moves does so in virtue of being moved by something that is already actual or “in act.” In short, “whatever is in motion must be put in motion by another” (ST Ia 2.3).
Aquinas’ aim here is not to explain discrete or isolated instances of causation. His interest, rather, is the existence of a causal order—one consisting of substances whose existence and activity depend on prior causes of that same order (Wippel, 59). Yet this attempt to clarify Aquinas’ aim introduces an obvious problem. If every constituent member of that order is causally dependent on something prior to itself, then it appears that the order in question must consist of an infinite chain of causes. Yet Aquinas denies this implication (fourth premise): if the causal order is infinite, then (obviously) there could be no first cause. But without a first cause, then (necessarily) there could be no subsequent effects—including the intermediate efficient causes and ultimate effect (ST Ia 2.3). In other words, the absence of a first cause would imply an absence of the causal order we observe. But since this implication is manifestly false, he says, there must be a first cause, “to which everyone gives the name God” (Ibid.).
A few clarifications about this argument are in order. First, commentators stress that this argument does not purport to show that the world is constituted by a temporal succession of causes that necessarily had a beginning (see for example Copleston, 1955: 122-123). Interestingly, Aquinas himself denies that the argument from efficient causality contradicts the eternality of the world (ST Ia 46.2 ad 1). Whether the world began to exist can only be resolved, he thinks, by appealing to sacred teaching. Thus he says that “by faith alone do we hold, and by no demonstration can it be proved, that the world did not always exist” (ST Ia 46.2). With respect to the second way, then, Aquinas’ aim is simply to demonstrate that the order of observable causes and effects cannot be a self-existing reality.
An illustration may help clarify the sort of argument Aquinas wishes to present. The proper growth of, say, plant life depends on the presence of sunlight and water. The presence of sunlight and water depends on ideal atmospheric activities. And those atmospheric activities are themselves governed by more fundamental causes, and so forth. In this example, the events described proceed not sequentially, but concurrently. Even so, they constitute an arrangement in which each event depends for its occurrence on causally prior events or phenomena. According to Copleston, illustrations of this sort capture the kind of causal ordering that interests Aquinas. For “when Aquinas talks about an ‘order’ of efficient causes he is not talking of a series stretching back into the past, but of a hierarchy of causes, in which a subordinate member is here and now dependent on the causal activity of a higher member” (Copleston, 1955: 122). Thus we might explain the sort of ordering that interests Aquinas as a metaphysical (as opposed to a temporal) ordering of causes. And it is this sort of order that requires a first member, that is, “a cause which does not depend on the causal activity of a higher cause” (Ibid., 123). For, as we have already seen, the absence of a first cause would imply the absence of subsequent causes and effects. Unless we invoke a cause that itself transcends the ordering of dependent causes, we would find it difficult to account for the causal activities we presently observe. Aquinas therefore states there must be “a first efficient, and completely non-dependent cause,” whereby “the word ‘first’ does not mean first in the temporal order but supreme or first in the ontological order” (Ibid.: 123; For valuable commentaries on these points, see Copleston, 122-124; Wippel, 2006: 59; Reichenbach, 2008).
Second, it may appear that Aquinas is unjustified in describing the first efficient cause as God, as least if by “God” one has in mind a person possessing the characteristics Christian theologians and philosophers attribute to him (for example, omniscience, omnipotence, omnipresence, love, goodness, and so forth.). Yet Aquinas does not attempt to show through the previous argument that the demonstrated cause has any of the qualities traditionally predicated of the divine essence. He says: “When the existence of a cause is demonstrated from an effect, this effect takes the place of the definition of the cause in proof of the cause’s existence” (ST Ia 2.2 ad 2). In other words, the term God—at least as it appears in ST Ia 2.2—refers only to that which produces the observed effect. In the case of the second way, God is synonymous with the first efficient cause; it does not denote anything of theological substance. We might think of the term “God” as a purely nominal concept Aquinas intends to investigate further (Te Velde, 2006: 44; Wippel, 2006: 46). For the study of what God is must be subsequent to demonstrating that he is. A complete account of the divine nature requires a more extensive examination, which he undertakes in the subsequent articles of ST.
Once Aquinas completes his discussion of the theistic demonstrations, he proceeds to investigate God’s nature. Such an investigation poses unique challenges. Although Aquinas thinks that we can demonstrate God’s existence, our demonstrative efforts cannot tell us everything about what God is like. As we noted before, God’s nature—that is, what God is in himself—surpasses what the human intellect is able to grasp (SCG I.14.2). Aquinas therefore does not presume to say explicitly or directly what God is. Instead, he investigates divine nature by determining what God is not. He does this by denying of God those properties that are conceptually at odds with what is already concluded by means of the five ways (ST Ia 3 prologue; Cf. SCG I.14.2 and 3).
Aquinas acknowledges a potential worry for his view. If the method by which we investigate God is one of strict remotion, then no divine predicate can describe what God is really like. As one objection states: “it seems that no name can be applied to God substantially. For Damascene says … ‘Everything said of God signifies not his substance, but rather exemplifies what he is not; or expresses some relation, or something following his nature or operation” (ST Ia 13.2 ad 1). In other words, the terms we attribute to God either function negatively (for example, to say God is immaterial is to say he is “not material”) or describe qualities that God causes his creatures to have. To illustrate this second alternative: consider what we mean when we say “God is good” or “God is wise.” According to the aforementioned objection, to say that God is good or wise is just to say that God is the cause of goodness and wisdom in creatures; the predicates in question here do not tell us anything about God’s nature (Ibid.).
For Aquinas, however, the terms we predicate of God can function positively, even if they cannot capture perfectly or make explicit the divine nature. Here’s how. As we have discussed, natural knowledge of God is mediated by our knowledge of the created order. The observable facts of that order reveal an efficient cause that is itself uncaused—a self-subsisting first mover that is uncreated and is not subject to any change. According to Aquinas, this means that God, from whom everything else is created, “contains within Himself the whole perfection of being” (ST Ia 4.2). But as the ultimate cause of our own existence, God is said to have all the perfections of his creatures (ST Ia 13.2). Whatever perfections reside in us must be deficient likenesses of what exists perfectly in God. Consequently, Aquinas thinks that terms such as good and wise can refer back to God. Of course, those terms are predicated of God imperfectly just as God’s creatures are imperfect likenesses of him. “So when we say, ‘God is good,’ the meaning is not, ‘God is the cause of goodness,’ or ‘God is not evil’; but the meaning is, ‘Whatever good we attribute to creatures, pre-exists in God,’ and in a more excellent and higher way” (Ibid.).
Moreover, denying certain properties of God can, in fact, give us a corresponding (albeit incomplete) understanding of what God is like. In other words, the process of articulating what God is not does not yield an account of the divine that is wholly negative. Here is a rough description of the way Aquinas’ reasoning proceeds: we reason from theistic arguments (particularly the first and second ways) that God is the first cause; that is, God is the first being in the order of efficient causality. If this is so, there can be no potency or unrealized potential in God. For if something has the potential or latent capacity to act, then its activity must be precipitated by some prior actuality. But in this line of reasoning, there is no actuality prior to God. It must follow, then, that God is pure actuality, and this in virtue of being the first cause (ST Ia 3.1). So although this process denies God those traits that are contrary to what we know about him, those denials invariably yield a fairly substantive account of the divine life
Other truths necessarily follow from the idea that God is pure actuality. For example, we know that God cannot be a body. For a characteristic feature of bodies is that they are subject to being moved by something other than themselves. And because God is not a body, he cannot be a composite of material parts (ST Ia 3.7). Not only does Aquinas think that God is not a material composite, he also insists that God is not a metaphysical composite (Vallencia, 2005). In other words, God is not an amalgam of attributes, nor is he a being whose nature or essence can be distinguished from his existence. He is, rather, a simple being.
The doctrine of divine simplicity is complicated and controversial—even among those who admire Aquinas’ philosophical theology. But the following account should provide the reader with a rough sketch of what this doctrine involves. Consider the example human being. A person is a human being in virtue of her humanity, where “humanity” denotes a species-defining characteristic. That is, humanity is an essence or “formal constituent” that makes its possessor a human being and not something else (ST Ia 3.3). Of course, a human being is also material being. In virtue of materiality, she possesses numerous individuating accidents. These would include various physical modifications such as her height or weight, her particular skin pigmentation, her set of bones, and so forth. According to Aquinas, none of these accidental traits are included in her humanity (indeed, she could lose these traits, acquire others, and remain a human being). They do, however, constitute the particular human being she is. In other words, her individuating accidents do not make her human, but they do make her a particular exemplification of humanity. This is why it would be incorrect to say that this person is identical to her humanity; instead, the individuating accidents she has make her one of many instances thereof.
But what about substances that are not composed of matter? Such things cannot have multiple instantiations since there is no matter to individuate them into discrete instances of a specific nature or essence. An immaterial substance then will not instantiate its nature. Instead, the substance will be identical to its nature. This is why Aquinas insists that there can be no distinction between (1) God and (2) that by which he is God. “He must be his own Godhead, His own life, and thus whatever else is predicated of him” (ST Ia 3.3). For example, we often say that God is supremely good. But it would be a mistake on Aquinas’ view to think that goodness is a property that God has, as if goodness is a property independent of God himself. For “in God, being good is not anything distinct from him; he is his goodness” (SCG I.3.8). Presumably we can say the same about his knowledge, perfection, wisdom, and other essential attributes routinely predicated of him.
So far we’ve considered the way God, as non-physical being, is simple. What he is (God) is indistinguishable from that by which he is (his divine essence). Presumably other immaterial beings would be simple in precisely this way in virtue of their immateriality. Consider, for example, the notion of angels. That there is no matter with which to individuate angelic beings implies that there will not be multiple instantiations of an angelic nature. Like Aquinas’ notion of God, each angelic being will be identical to its specific essence or nature (ST Ia 3.3). But God is obviously unlike angelic beings in an important way. Not only is God the same as his essence; he is also the same as his existence (ST Ia 3.4; Cf. 50.2 ad 3). In order to see what this means, consider the conclusions from section 2.2b. There, we noted that the constituent members of the causal order cannot be the cause of their own existence and activity. For “it is impossible for a thing’s existence to be caused by its essential constituent principles, for nothing can be the sufficient cause of its own existence, if its existence is caused” (Ibid.). Thus the constituent members of the causal order must exist in virtue of some other, exterior principle of causality.
We are now in a position to see why, according to Aquinas, God and the principle by which he exists must be the same. Unlike the constituent members of the causal order, all of whom receive their existence from some exterior principle, God is an uncaused cause. In other words, God’s existence is not something bequeathed by some exterior principle or agent. If it was, then God and the principle by which he exists would be different. Yet the idea that God is the first efficient cause who does not acquire existence from something else implies that God is his own existence (Ibid). Brain Davies explains this implication of the causal argument in the following way:
The conclusion Aquinas draws [from the five ways] is that God is his own existence. He is Ipsum Esse Subsitens. “Existence Itself” or “underived … Existence.” To put it another way, God is not a creature. Creatures, Aquinas thinks, “have” existence, for their natures (what they are) do not suffice to guarantee their existence (that they are). But with God this is not so. He does not “have” existence; his existence is not received or derived from another. He is his own existence and is the reason other things have it (Davies, 1992: 55).
For additional discussion of Aquinas’ argument for God’s existence, see Scriptural Roots and Aquinas’s Fifth Way.
So far, this article has shown how and to what extent human reason can lead to knowledge about God and his nature. Aquinas clearly thinks that our demonstrative efforts can tell us quite a bit about the divine life. Yet he also insists that it was necessary for God to reveal to us other truths by means of sacred teaching. Unlike the knowledge we acquire by our own natural aptitudes, Aquinas contends that revealed knowledge gives us a desire for goods and rewards that exceed this present life (SCG I.5.2). Also, revealed knowledge may tell us more about God than what our demonstrative efforts actually show. Although our investigative efforts may confirm that God exists, they are unable to prove (for example) that God is fully present in three divine persons, or that it is the Christian God in whom we find complete happiness (ST Ia 1.1; SCG I.5.3). Revealed knowledge also curbs the presumptuous tendency to think that our cognitive aptitudes are sufficient when trying to determine (more generally) what is true (SCG I.5.4).
Moreover, Aquinas contends that it was fitting for God to make known through divine revelation even those truths that are accessible to human reason. For if such knowledge depended strictly on the difficult and time-intensive nature of human investigation, then few people would actually possess it. Also, our cognitive limitations may result in a good deal of error when trying to contrive successful demonstrations of divine realities. Given our proneness to mistakes, relying on natural aptitude alone may seem particularly hazardous, especially when our salvation is at stake (Ibid.; Cf. SCG I.4.3-5). For this reason, Aquinas insists that having “unshakable certitude and pure truth” with respect to the divine life requires that we avail ourselves of truths revealed by God and held by faith (Ibid., I.4.6).
But what is “faith”? Popular accounts of religion sometimes construe faith as a blind, uncritical acceptance of myopic doctrine. According to Richard Dawkins, “faith is a state of mind that leads people to believe something—it doesn’t matter what—in the total absence of supporting evidence. If there were good supporting evidence then faith would be superfluous, for the evidence would compel us to believe it anyway” (Dawkins, 1989: 330). Such a view of faith might resonate with contemporary skeptics of religion. But as we shall see, this view is not remotely like the one Aquinas—or historic Christianity for that matter—endorses.
To begin with, Aquinas takes faith to be an intellectual virtue or habit, the object of which is God (ST IIaIIae 1.1; 4.2). There are other things that fall under the purview of faith, such as the doctrine of the Trinity and the Incarnation. But we do not affirm these specific doctrines unless they have some relation to God. According to Aquinas, these doctrines serve to explicate God’s nature and provide us with a richer understanding of the one in whom our perfect happiness consists (Ibid.). And although faith is an intellectual virtue, it would be a mistake to construe the act of faith as something that is purely cognitive in nature, such as the belief that 2 + 2 = 4, or that Venus is a planet, or that red is a primary color. These beliefs are not (so it seems) things over which we have much voluntary control. Perhaps this is because their truth is manifestly obvious or because they are based on claims that are themselves self-evident. In either case, it doesn’t appear that we choose to believe these things.
By contrast, the assent of faith is voluntary. To employ Aquinas’ terminology, the assent of faith involves not just the intellect but the will (ST IIaIIae 1.2). By will Aquinas means a native desire or love for what we think contributes to our happiness. How is the will involved in the assent of faith? Aquinas appears to have something like this in mind: suppose a person, upon hearing a homily or a convincing argument, becomes persuaded that ultimate human happiness consists in union with God. For Aquinas, the mere acknowledgment of this truth does not denote faith—or at least a commendable form of faith that is distinct from believing certain propositions about God. After all, the demons believe many truths about God, but they are compelled to believe due to the obviousness of those truths. Their belief is not shaped by an affection for God and thus not praiseworthy (ST IIaIIae 5.2 ad 1 and 2). Thus we can imagine that a person who is convinced of certain sacred truths may (for any number of reasons) choose not to consider or endorse what she now believes. Alternatively, she may, out of love for God, actively seek God as her proper end. According to Aquinas, this love for God is what distinguishes faith from the mere acknowledgement that certain theological statements are true. For faith involves an appetitive aspect whereby the will—a love or desire for goodness—moves us to God as the source of ultimate happiness (ST IIaIIae 2.9 ad 2; IIaIIae 4.2; cf. Stump, 1991: 191). We’ll say more about the relationship between love and faith in the following sub-section.
But what prompts the will to desire God? After all, Christianity teaches that our wills have been corrupted by the Fall. As a result of that corruption, Christian doctrine purports that we invariably love the wrong things and are inclined to ends contrary to God’s purposes. The only way we would be motivated to seek God is if our wills were somehow changed; that is, we must undergo some interior transformation whereby we come to love God. According to Aquinas, that transformation comes by way of grace. We will say more about grace in the following subsection of this article. For now, we can construe grace as Aquinas does: a good-making habit that inclines us to seek God and makes us worthy of eternal life (QDV 27.1). According to Aquinas, if a person seeks God as the supreme source of human happiness, it can only be because God moves her will by conferring grace upon her. That is why Aquinas insists that faith involves a “[voluntary] assent to the Divine truth at the command of the will moved by the grace of God” (ST IIaIIae 2.9; Cf. 2.2). Of course, just what it means for one’s will to be both voluntary and moved by God’s grace is a subject about which there is contentious debate. How can the act of faith be voluntary if the act itself is a result of God generating a change in the human will? This is the problem to which we’ll now turn.
We may think that voluntary actions are the products of one’s free decisions and not compelled or generated by causal forces outside of one’s own will. According to Aquinas, however, the act of faith is precipitated by grace, whereby God draws the will to himself (ST IaIIae 109.7). Does the infusion of grace contravene the sort of voluntariness that Aquinas insists is a component of faith? Limitations of space prohibit an extensive treatment of this subject. For this reason, a brief presentation of Aquinas’ view will follow.
The act of faith has a twofold cause: one is external, the other is internal. First, Aquinas says that faith requires an “external inducement, such as seeing a miracle, or being persuaded by someone” by means of reason or argument (ST IIaIIae 6.1; Cf. 2.9 ad 3). Observing a supernatural act or hearing a persuasive sermon or argument may corroborate the truth of sacred teaching and, in turn, encourage belief. These inducements, however, are not sufficient for producing faith since not everyone who witnesses or hears them finds them compelling. As Aquinas observes, of “those who see the same miracle, or who hear the same sermon, some believe, and some do not” (Ibid.). We must therefore posit an internal cause whereby God moves the will to embrace that which is proposed for belief. But how is it that God moves the will? In other words, what does God do to the will that makes the assent of faith possible? And how does God’s effort to dispose our will in a certain way not contravene its putative freedom? None of the proposed answers to this question are uncontroversial, but what follows appears to be faithful to the view Aquinas favored (for some competing interpretations of Aquinas’ account, see Jenkins, 1998; Ross, 1985; Penelhum, 1977; and Stump, 1991 and 2003).
As indicated in the previous sub-section, charity, or the love of God, moves a person to faith (ST IIaIIae 4.3). Aquinas states “charity is the form of faith” because the person who places her faith in God does so because of her love for God. Thus we might think of the inward cause of faith to be a kind of infused affection or, better yet, moral inclination whereby the will is directed to God (Ibid.; 23.8). As a result of this moral posturing, a person will be able to view Christian teaching more favorably than she would were it not for the infusion of charity. John Jenkins endorses a similar account. He suggests that pride, excessive passion, and other vicious habits generate within us certain prejudices that prevent us from responding positively to sacred teaching (Jenkins, 1998: 207-208). A will that is properly directed to God, however, does not refuse a fair and charitable evaluation of Scripture’s claims. Jenkins writes: “a good will [and by this he means a will that has been moved by God’s grace]…permits us to see clearly and impartially that truths which are beyond our understanding…nevertheless have been revealed by God and are to be believed.” (Ibid., 208). In other words, faith formed by charity transforms the will by allaying the strength of those appetitive obstacles that forestall love of God. In turn, faith directs us to God and motivates us to embrace sacred teaching (ST IIaIIae 2.9 ad 3).
On this view of faith, the person who subordinates herself to God does so not as a result of divine coercion but by virtue of an infused disposition whereby she loves God. In fact, we might argue that God’s grace makes a genuinely free response possible. For grace curtails pride and enables us to grasp and fairly assess what the Christian faith proposes for belief (Jenkins, 209). In doing so, it permits us to freely endorse those things that we in our sinful state would never be able—or want—to understand and embrace. According to this view, God’s grace does not contravene the voluntary nature of our will.
It is clear from the preceding account of faith that Aquinas staunchly supports the use of argument in exonerating those claims that are proposed for belief. Indeed, the arguments offered in support of Christian claims often provide us with the motivation we sometimes need in order to embrace them. But does the use of reasons or argument compromise the merit of faith? Aquinas expresses the objection this way: “faith is necessary [in order to assent to] divine things…. Therefore in this subject it is not permitted to investigate the truth [of divinely revealed realities] by reasoning” (De trinitate, 2.1 obj. 3). He also quotes St. Gregory’s objection: “ ‘Faith has no merit where human reason supplies proof.’ But it is wrong to do away with the merit of faith. Therefore it is not right to investigate matters of faith by reason” (Ibid., obj. 5). In short, human investigation into sacred doctrine threatens to render faith superfluous. For if one were to offer a good argument for the truth of what God reveals, then there would be no need for us to exercise faith in regard to that truth.
Yet Aquinas insists that Christianity’s doctrinal truths—truths we are to embrace by faith—are often confirmed by “fitting arguments” (SCG I.6.1), and that faith can be strengthened by the use of reason (De trinitate, 2.1). What sort of reasoning or argumentation does Aquinas have in mind? He makes a distinction between demonstrative reasoning and persuasive reasoning. As we saw earlier, demonstrative reasoning yields a conclusion that is undeniable for anyone who grasps the truth of the demonstration’s premises. In these cases, believing the demonstration’s conclusion is not a voluntary affair. If I know that the sum of all rectangles’ interior angles equals 360º and that a square is a rectangle, then I cannot help but believe that the sum of a square’s interior angles equals 360º. In cases of demonstrative reasoning, knowledge of a demonstration’s premises is sufficient to guarantee assent to the demonstration’s conclusions (De trinitate 2.1 ad 5). Were a person to grasp the truth of sacred doctrine by means of this sort of reasoning, belief would be necessitated and the merit of faith destroyed (Ibid.).
Persuasive reasoning, on the other hand, does no such thing. We might think of persuasive reasoning as playing an apologetic role vis-à-vis theological claims (Stump suggests something along these lines. See 1991: 197). In his own gloss on Aquinas, Jenkins suggests that “persuasive reasoning” consists of “credibility arguments” that corroborate the truth of what sacred scripture teaches but are ultimately unable “to move one to assent to the articles of faith” (Jenkins, 1997: 185-186). In other words, the arguments in which persuasive reasoning consists may provide reasons for accepting certain doctrines, but they cannot compel acceptance of those doctrines. One still needs the grace of faith in order to embrace them. Whatever merits persuasive reasoning confers on sacred teaching, “it is the interior movement of grace and the Holy Spirit which is primary in bringing one to see that these truths have been divinely revealed and are to be believed” (Ibid., 196). This is why Aquinas insists that human investigation into matters of faith does not render faith superfluous or “deprive faith of its merit” (De trinitate 2.1 ad 5).
For more discussion, see the article Faith and Reason.
A closer look at some central Christian doctrines is now in order. The term “Christian doctrine” refers to the specific, developed teachings that are at the heart of Christian faith and practice. And although there are many doctrines that constitute sacred teaching, at least two are foundational to Christianity and subject to thorough analysis by Aquinas. These include the Incarnation and the Trinity. Aquinas takes both of these doctrines to be essential to Christian teaching and necessary to believe in order to receive salvation (see ST IIaIIae 2.7 and 8, respectively). For this reason it will be beneficial to explore what these doctrines assert.
The doctrine of the Incarnation teaches that God literally and in history became human in the person of Jesus Christ. The doctrine of the Incarnation further teaches that Christ is the complete and perfect union of two natures, human and divine. The idea here is not that Jesus is some strange hybrid, a chimera of human and divine parts. The idea rather is that in Christ there is a merger of two natures into one hypostasis—a subsisting individual composed of two discrete but complete essences (ST III 2.3). In short, Christ is a single person who is fully human and fully divine; he is God and man. Aquinas’ efforts to explicate and defend this doctrine are ingenious but may prove frustrating without a more advanced understanding of the metaphysical framework he employs (see Stump 2003 for a treatment of this subject). Rather than pursue the complexities of that framework, we will instead address a different matter to which the Incarnation is intricately connected.
According to Christian teaching, human beings are estranged from God. That estrangement is the result of original sin—a “heritable stain” we contract from our first parent, Adam (Catholic Encyclopedia, “Original Sin”; Cf. ST IaIIae 81.1). So understood, sin refers not to a specific immoral act but a spiritual wounding that diminishes the good of human nature (ST IaIIae 85.1 and 3). Sin’s stain undermines our ability to deliberate well about practical matters; it hardens our wills toward evil; and it exacerbates the impetuosity of passion, thereby making virtuous activity more difficult (ST IaIIae 85.3). Further, Christian doctrine states that we become progressively more corrupt as we yield to sinful tendencies over time. Sinful choices produce corresponding habits, or vices, that reinforce hostility towards God and put beatitude further beyond our reach. No amount of human effort can remedy this problem. The damage wrought by sin prevents us from meriting divine favor or even wanting the sort of goods that which makes union with God possible.
The Incarnation makes reconciliation with God possible. To understand this claim, we must consider another doctrine to which the Incarnation is inextricably tied, namely, the doctrine of the Atonement. According to the doctrine of Atonement, God reconciles himself to human beings through Christ, whose suffering and death compensates for our transgressions (ST III 48.1). In short, reconciliation with God is accomplished by means of Christ’s satisfaction for sin. Yet this satisfaction does not consist in making reparations for past transgressions. Rather it consists in God healing our wounded natures and making union with him possible. The most fitting way to accomplish this task was through the Incarnation (ST III 1.2). From this perspective, satisfaction is more restorative than retributive. As Eleonore Stump notes: “the function of satisfaction for Aquinas is not to placate a wrathful God … [but] to restore a sinner to a state of harmony with God by repairing or restoring in the sinner what sin has damaged” (Stump, 2003: 432). Aquinas emphasizes the restorative nature of satisfaction by detailing the many blessings Christ’s Incarnation and atoning work afford. A partial list is as follows: the incarnation provides human beings with a tangible manifestation of God himself, thereby inspiring faith; it prompts in us hope for salvation; it demonstrates God’s love for human beings, and in turn kindles within us a love for God; correlatively, it produces in us sorrow for past sins and a desire to turn from them; it provides us a template of humility, constancy, obedience, and justice, all of which are required for salvation; and it merits “justifying grace” for human beings (ST III 1.2; 46.3; Cf. 90.4).
This last benefit requires explanation. As we saw in the previous section, our natures are corrupted by sin, resulting in a weakened inclination to act virtuously and obey God’s commandments. Only a supernatural transformation of our recalcitrant wills can heal our corrupt nature and make us people who steadily trust, hope in, and love God as the source of our beatitude. In short, Christian doctrine purports that we need God’s grace—a divinely infused quality that inclines us toward God. This brief description of grace might suggest that it is an infused virtue much like faith, hope, and charity. According to Aquinas, however, grace is not a virtue. Rather, it is the infused virtues’ “principle and root”—a disposition that is antecedently necessary in order to practice the virtues themselves (ST IaIIae 110.3; 110 ad 3). We might be inclined to think of God’s grace as a transformative quality that enables us to desire our supernatural end, fulfill God’s commandments, and avoid sin (ST IaIIae 109.2, 4, and 8).
This account helps explain why grace is said to justify sinners. Justification consists not only in the remittance of sins, but in a transmutation whereby our wills are supernaturally directed away from morally deficient ends and towards God. In short, justification produces within us a certain “rectitude of order” whereby our passions are subordinate to reason and reason is subordinate to God as our proper end (ST IaIIae 113.1; 113.1 ad 2). In this way God, by means of his grace, heals our fallen nature, pardons sin, and makes us worthy of eternal life.
Now, remission of sin and moral renovation cannot occur apart from the work God himself accomplishes through Christ. According to Aquinas, forgiveness and righteousness are made possible through Christ’s passion, or the love and obedience he exemplified through his suffering and death (ST III 48.2). Thus he describes Christ’s suffering and death as instruments of God’s grace; for through them we are freed from sin and reconciled to God (ST IaIIae 112.1 ad 1; ST III 48.1; 49.1-4). But how exactly does Christ’s suffering and death merit the remission of sin and unify us with God? Briefly: Christ’s loving obedience and willingness to suffer for justice’s sake merited God’s favor. Yet such favor was not limited to Christ. For “by suffering out of love and obedience, Christ gave more to God than what was required to compensate for the offense of the whole human race” (ST III 48.2; Cf. 48.4). That is to say, so great was his love and obedience that he accrued a degree of merit that was sufficient to atone for everyone’s sin (Ibid.). On this account, God accepts Christ’s perfect expression of love and obedience as a more than adequate satisfaction for sin, thereby discharging us from the debt of punishment incurred by our unfaithfulness and lack of love. But again, the aim of satisfaction is not to appease God through acts of restitution but to renovate our wills and make possible a right relationship with him (Stump, 432). After all, satisfaction for sin does us little good if Christ’s actions do not serve to change us by transforming the vicious inclinations that alienate us from God. Thus we ought not to look at Christ simply as an instrument by which our sins are wiped clean, but as one whose sacrificial efforts produce in us a genuine love for God and make possible the very union we desire (ST III 49.1; 49.3 ad 3).
The preceding survey of the Incarnation and the Atonement will undoubtedly raise further questions that we cannot possibly address here. For example, one issue this article has not addressed is the role of Christian sacraments in conferring grace and facilitating the believer’s incorporation into God’s life (see, for example, ST III 48.2 ad 2; 62.1 and 2. For a careful treatment of this issue, see Stump: 2003, chapter 15). Instead, this brief survey attempts only a provisional account of how the Incarnation makes atonement for sin and reconciliation with God possible.
This section will focus on the doctrine of the Trinity (with all the typical caveats implied, of course). Aquinas’ definition of the Trinity is in full accord with the orthodox account of what Christians traditionally believe about God. According to that account, God is one. That is, his essence is one of supreme unity and simplicity. Yet the doctrine also states that there are three distinct persons: Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. By distinct, Aquinas means that the persons of the Trinity are real individuals and not, say, the same individual understood under different descriptions. Moreover, each of the three persons is identical to the divine essence. That is, each person of the Trinity is equally to God. The doctrine is admittedly confounding. But if it is true, then it should be internally coherent. In fact, Aquinas insists that, although we cannot prove the doctrine through our own demonstrative efforts, we can nevertheless show that this and other doctrines known through the light of faith are not contradictory (de Trinitate, 1.1 ad 5; 1.3).
Aquinas’ exposition of the Trinity endeavors to avoid two notable heresies: Arianism and Sabellianism. In short, Arianism denies Christ’s full divinity. It teaches that Christ was created by God at a point in time and therefore not co-eternal with him. Although Arianism insists that Christ is divine, his creaturely dependence on God implies that he does not share God’s essence. In short, God and Christ are distinct substances. What follows from this teaching is that Christ is “a second, or inferior God, standing midway between the First Cause and creatures; as Himself made out of nothing, yet as making all things else; as existing before the worlds of the ages; and as arrayed in all divine perfections except the one which was their stay and foundation” (Catholic Encyclopedia, “Arianism”). The other heresy, Sabellianism, attempts to preserve divine unity by denying any real distinction in God. According to this doctrine, the names “Father,” “Son,” and “Holy Spirit” refer not to discrete persons but different manifestations of the same divine being. Aquinas’ account attempts to avoid these heresies by affirming that the persons of the Trinity are distinct without denying the complete unity of the divine essence.
How does Aquinas go about defending the traditional doctrine? The challenge, of course, is to show that the claim
(1) the persons of the God-head are really distinct
is consistent with the claim that
(2) God is one
In an effort to reconcile (1) and (2), Aquinas argues that there are relations in God. For example, we find in God the relational notion of paternity (which implies fatherhood) and filiation (which implies sonship) (ST Ia 28.1 sed contra). Paternity and filiation imply different things. And while I may be both a father and a son, these terms connote a real relation between distinct persons (me, my son, and my father). Thus if there is paternity and filiation in God, then there must be a real distinction of persons that the divine essence comprises (ST Ia 28.3). We should note here that Aquinas avoids using the terms “diversity” and “difference” in this context because such terms contravene the doctrine of simplicity (ST Ia 31.2). The notion of distinction, however, does not contravene the doctrine of simplicity because (according to Aquinas) we can have a distinction of persons while maintaining divine unity.
This last claim is obviously the troubling one. How can we have real distinction within a being that is perfectly one? The answer to this question requires we look a bit more closely at what Aquinas means by relation. The idea of relation goes back at least as far as Aristotle (for a good survey of medieval analyses of relations, see Brower, 2005). For Aristotle and his commentators, the term relation refers to a property that allies the thing that has it with something else. Thus he speaks of a relation as that which makes something of, than, or to some other thing (Aristotle, Categories, Book 7, 6b1). For example, what is larger is larger than something else; to have knowledge is to have knowledge of something; to incline is to incline toward something; and so forth (Ibid. 6b5).
Aquinas’ attempt to make sense of the Trinity involves use of (or perhaps, as Brower notes, a significant departure from) Aristotle’s idea of relation (Brower, 2005). On the one hand, Aquinas’ understanding of relation as it applies to creatures mirrors Aristotle’s view: a relation is an accidental property that signifies a connection to something else (ST Ia 28.1). On the other hand, the notion of relation need not denote a property that allies different substances. It can also refer to distinctions that are internal to a substance. This second construal is the way Aquinas understands the notion of relation as it applies to God. For there is within God a relation of persons, each of which enjoys a characteristic the others do not have. As we noted before, God the Father has the characteristic of paternity, God the Son has the characteristic of filiation, and so on. These characteristics are unique to each person, thus creating a kind of opposition that connotes real distinction (ST Ia 28.3).
Care is required before proceeding here. Each of the aforementioned relations not only inhere in the divine essence, they are identical to it in the sense that each member of the Trinity is identical to God (ST Ia 28.2 and 29.4). From this abbreviated account we see that relation as it exists in God is not, as it is for creatures, an accidental property. For the relation, being identical to God, does not add to or modify the divine substance in any way. Aquinas says: “whatever has an accidental existence in creatures, when considered as transferred to God, has a substantial existence; for there is no accident in God; since all in Him is His essence. So, in so far as relation has an accidental existence in creatures, relation really existing in God has the existence of the divine essence in no way distinct therefrom” (ST Ia 28.2). Seen this way, it is somewhat misleading to say that relation is something that “inheres in” God; for the relation is identical to God himself (Emery, 2007: 94).
This woefully truncated account of Aquinas’ position presents a more detailed articulation of the very claim he needs to explain. One can still ask: how can God be a perfect unity and still comprise a plurality of distinct persons? Aquinas is aware of the worry. For “if in God there exists a number of persons, then there must be whole and part in God, which is inconsistent with the divine simplicity” (ST Ia 30.1 obj. 4; cf. ST Ia 39.1 obj. 1). Aquinas recognizes that most people will find it difficult to imagine how something can have within itself multiple relations and at the same time be an unqualified unity.
In order to show how one might have a plurality while preserving unity, consider the following analogy. Using Aristotle’s account of material constitution as a point of departure, Jeffery Brower and Michael Rea suggest that a bronze statue is constituted by two discrete substances: a lump of bronze and a statue. Although the lump of bronze and the statue are distinct things, “they are numerically one material object. Likewise, the persons of the Trinity are three distinct persons but numerically one God” (Brower and Rea, 2005: 69). Although the authors do not have Aquinas’ account of divine relations in mind when using this analogy, we may cautiously avail ourselves of their insights. If we can think of the lump of bronze and the configuration by which the bronze is a statue as a relation of two things, then we can see that relation does not concern anything that is not identical to the object (the bronze statue). Such an account is similar to the one Aquinas has in mind when attempting reconcile (1) and (2). For although each person of the Trinity is distinct from each other, each person is not distinct from God (ST Ia 28.2; cf. 39.1).
Some readers might object to the use of such analogies. In the present case, the relations that inhere in God are persons, not formally discrete features of an artifact. Moreover, the analogy does not adequately capture the precise nature of the relations as they exist in God. For Aquinas, the divine relations are relations of procession. Here Aquinas takes himself to be affirming sacred teaching, which tells us that Jesus “proceeded and came forth” from the Father (John 8:42) and that the Holy Spirit proceeds from both the Father and the Son (according to the Catholic expression of the Nicene Creed). Aquinas is careful not to suggest that the form of procession mentioned here does not consist in the production of separate beings. Jesus does not, as Arius taught, proceed from God as a created being. Nor does the Holy Spirit proceed from Father and Son as a creature of both. Were this the case, neither the Son nor the Holy Spirit would be truly God (ST Ia 27.1). Instead, the procession to which Aquinas refers does not denote an outward act at all; procession is internal to God and not distinct from him.
In order to make sense of this idea, Aquinas employs the analogy of understanding, which consists in an interior process, namely, the conceptualization of an object understood and signified by speech (Ibid.). He refers to this process as intelligible emanation. Intelligible concepts proceed but are not distinct from the agent who conceives them. This notion is central to Aquinas’ account of how Father and Son relate to each other. For the Son does not proceed from the Father as a separate being but as an intelligible conception of God himself. Thus Aquinas describes the Son as the “supreme perfection of God, the divine Word [who] is of necessity perfectly one with the source from which he proceeds” (ST Ia 27.1 ad 2; Cf. 27.2). To put the matter another way, the divine Word is the likeness of God himself—a concept emanating from God’s own self-understanding. These words may sound cryptic to the casual reader, but Davies helps render them comprehensible. He suggests that the Son’s relationship to God is not unlike our self-conception’s relationship to ourselves. For “there is similarity between me and my [self-image] insofar as my concept of myself really corresponds to what I am” (Davies, 196). Similarly, Aquinas thinks of the Son “as the concept in the mind of the one conceiving of himself. In God’s case this means that the Father brings forth the Son, who is like him insofar as he is properly understood, and who shares the divine nature since God and his understanding are the same” (Ibid.).
Aquinas’ attempt to render the doctrine of the Trinity coherent is controversial and involves complexities not addressed here. Yet I imagine Aquinas himself would not be surprised by the consternation some readers might express in response to his attempts to illuminate and defend this and other sacred teachings. After all, Aquinas contends that knowledge of the divine nature will, if acquired by our own investigative efforts, be quite feeble (SCG IV.1.4; ST IIaIIae 2.3). And this is why God, in his goodness, must reveal to us things that transcend human reason. But even once these things are revealed, our understanding of them will not be total or immediate. What is required is a form of intellectual training whereby we gradually come to comprehend that which is difficult to grasp in an untutored state (Jenkins: 219). And even those who reach a proper state of intellectual maturation will not be able to comprehend these mysteries fully, which may explain why attempts to clarify and defend these doctrines can produce so much debate. Yet Aquinas expresses the hope that what we cannot understand completely now will be apprehended more perfectly after this life, when, according to Christian doctrine, we will see God face to face (SCG IV.1.4-5).
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- Stump, Eleonore. 2003. Aquinas. New York: Routledge. The chapter on the Atonement was especially helpful in writing section 4a of this article.
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Last updated: July 7, 2010 | Originally published: July 7, 2010
Categories: Medieval Philosophy