Open Theism

Open Theism

Open Theism is the thesis that, because God loves us and desires that we freely choose to reciprocate His love, He has made His knowledge of, and plans for, the future conditional upon our actions. Though omniscient, God does not know what we will freely do in the future. Though omnipotent, He has chosen to invite us to freely collaborate with Him in governing and developing His creation, thereby also allowing us the freedom to thwart His hopes for us. God desires that each of us freely enter into a loving and dynamic personal relationship with Him, and He has therefore left it open to us to choose for or against His will.

While Open Theists affirm that God knows all the truths that can be known, they claim that there simply are not yet truths about what will occur in the “open,” undetermined future. Alternatively, there are such contingent truths, but these truths cannot be known by anyone, including God.

Even though God is all-powerful, allowing Him to do everything that can be done, He cannot create round squares or make 2 +2 = 5 or do anything that is logically impossible. Omniscience is understood in a similar manner. God is all-knowing and can know all that can be known, but He cannot know the contingent future, since that too, is impossible. God knows all the possible ways the world might go at any point in time, but He does not know the one way the world will go, so long as some part of what will happen in the future is contingent. So, Open Theists oppose the claim of the sixteenth century Jesuit theologian, Luis de Molina, that God has "middle knowledge."

Open Theists believe that Scripture teaches that God wanted to give us the freedom to choose to love or reject Him. In order for each of us to genuinely have a choice for which we are morally responsible, we must have the ability to do otherwise than we do. This is the distinctive necessary condition of what has come to be called libertarian freedom. God may intervene in the created world at any time, and He may determine that we act in ways of His choosing. But He cannot both respect our libertarian freedom and guarantee that we will do specific things freely. Thus, Open Theists believe that God has created a world in which He takes the risk that many of us will reject Him and act in ways opposed to Him, in order to give us the opportunity to freely choose to love and obey Him.

Table of Contents

  1. History of Open Theism
  2. The Biblical Witness
  3. Philosophical Considerations
  4. Theological Implications
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. For Open Theism
    2. Against Open Theism
    3. Multiple Views

1. History of Open Theism

Open Theism has been a significant topic in philosophy of religion and in evangelical Christian circles since the 1994 publication of The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God by Clark Pinnock, Richard Rice, John Sanders, William Hasker, and David Basinger. Philosophers of religion such as A. N. Prior, J. R. Lucas, Peter Geach, Richard Swinburne, and Richard Purtill had advocated Open Theism in their writings prior to this date, though not under that name, and Rice had published a work initially entitled The Openness of God in 1980. (It was later republished as God’s Foreknowledge and Man’s Free Will.) But the 1994 book’s attempt to systematically explicate the relational view of God that its authors labeled the open view clearly marks the beginning of increased discussion and debate over Open Theism’s tenets.

Since the publication of The Openness of God, there has been significant debate about not only the philosophical and theological merits of Open Theism, but also its orthodoxy. In 2003, The Evangelical Theological Society considered whether to remove Clark Pinnock and John Sanders from its membership for implicitly disavowing the inerrancy of Scripture in their writings by suggesting that some Biblical passages traditionally understood to be prophecies have remained and may continue to remain unfulfilled. While Pinnock agreed to revise the most objectionable passage in his book Most Moved Mover, Sanders continued to maintain that God does not infallibly predict or prophesy what will contingently occur in the future, and he maintained that Biblical passages may initially appear to predicate divine foreknowledge and/or unconditional prophecies by God of what will contingently occur but these passages must be interpreted differently (more below). The charges against Pinnock and Sanders were not sustained, but this was just barely the case for Sanders.

Proponents of Open Theism allow that their view is at odds with the great majority of the Christian tradition in rejecting both meticulous providence and divine foreknowledge of what will contingently occur. However, they argue that the tradition, guided by neo-Platonic philosophy in its formation, had difficulty reconciling beliefs about the implications of God’s perfection with the Biblical witness to a God that cares deeply about His people and how they respond to Him. Many of the early Church Fathers affirmed elements of the Open Theists’ relational view of God, in tension with their beliefs in divine impossibility. Then Saint Augustine, whose Confessions tell us that his faith partially resulted from a careful study of neo-Platonism, forcefully argued for an emphasis on God’s perfection and otherness from His creation that precluded genuine responsiveness on God’s part to our actions. The (Western) Christian tradition subsequently became largely identified with an Augustinian understanding of providence. The early Church Fathers’ idea that God’s foreknowledge is conditioned by human actions did not receive significant consideration again until Jacob Arminius in the sixteenth century and John Wesley in the eighteenth. And it is only recently, in light of philosophical considerations of the nature of freedom, that the full reciprocal relationality of Open Theism has been affirmed, with its concordant denial that God knows what will contingently occur.

Open Theists suggest that when the testimony of Scripture is considered together with philosophical reflection on the conditions necessary for free and morally responsible action, the view that results is theirs. An emphasis on God’s conditioned relationship to His creation is clearly present in the early Church, in the Eastern Church, and in developments during and in response to the Protestant Reformation. This emphasis is largely absent from the theology of the Middle Ages, but the giants of theology from Augustine to Aquinas were clearly attempting to understand God and His relationship to the world in light of the best secular philosophy available to them. While Open Theists acknowledge that their view is in important respects at odds with the Christian tradition, they also maintain that their view is not as dissonant from that tradition as might be thought; it is just that the emphasis on God as a perfect being who does not change in any respect, which is neither clearly taught by Scripture nor obviously compatible with God’s loving relationality, must be rethought.

2. The Biblical Witness

Open Theists suggest that there is a strong Biblical case to be made for affirming a God who respects our moral responsibility while inviting us into a loving relationship with Him. They argue that the most plausible reading of the Bible reveals a personal God who genuinely interacts with human persons and accepts that His desires and projects are dependent on that interaction. As discussed below, Open Theists read the Bible as showing that God desires to be in relationship with the people He has created, that He sometimes changes His mind as a result of dialogue with His people, and that He seeks to accomplish His goals for the world in concert with human agents. They also point to passages that attribute to God the learning of information as evidence that God’s knowledge is not settled, and does not include foreknowledge of the occurrence of contingent events.

Critics of Open Theism offer alternative interpretations of the passages frequently cited by Open Theists, and bring forward their own proof texts that the Biblical God is one whose sovereignty over creation includes exhaustive foreknowledge and ultimate control over each and every aspect of His creation. In any consideration of how well Open Theism accords with the teachings of Scripture, it is important to note that one’s philosophical understandings of freedom and moral responsibility necessarily inform one’s hermeneutic. One cannot fully appreciate the Biblical cases made for or against Open Theism without also appreciating the philosophical considerations to be considered in the subsequent section. Open Theism is most plausible if the dignity and responsibility of an agent require the freedom to do otherwise; if this is so, then texts that attribute responsibility to persons seem to clearly require that God does not also determine the humans’ actions. If foreknowledge is also incompatible with the ability to do otherwise, then neither can God know what we will do. But if our responsibility is consistent with either or both of divine foreknowledge and God’s sovereign determination, then the force of these passages is not nearly as great, and there is no need to seek a more nuanced reading of passages that on their face seem to attribute to God unconditioned knowledge of contingent events in the future.

Open Theists argue that the God revealed in the Bible clearly desires to be in relationship with the people He has created. From the beginning, we have been created in God’s image and given responsibility to care for His creation (Gen. 1:26). God’s relationship to His creation is clear throughout the narrative of the Old Testament. Both Abraham and Moses, among others, speak, and indeed argue, directly with God. Abraham questions God about how His promises will be fulfilled (Gen. 15), and prevails upon Him to spare Sodom if only ten righteous people can be found living there (Gen. 18). Immediately after Abraham shows himself faithful to God by his willingness to obey God even to the point of sacrificing his son Isaac, God states that it is because of Abraham’s obedience that He will maintain His promise to bless Abraham and his descendants (Gen. 22:15-18). Abraham questions God, dialogues with God, affects God’s decisions, and his actions of obedience are credited by God as at least partly responsible for Him fulfilling the promise of blessings that He has revealed to Abraham. Moses speaks with God, and because He lacks confidence to speak to his fellow Israelites, God appoints Aaron to speak for Him (Ex. 4: 1-18). God reveals His law to Moses, and when the Israelites turn their backs on their Deliverer, Moses reminds God of His promises and asks Him to relent from His anger and spare His people (Ex. 32: 9-14). It is clear throughout the Pentateuch that God speaks to chosen leaders of His chosen people, and that He not only commands them, but also listens to their concerns, often adjusting His original plans in light of His dialogue with them.

In both the Old and New Testaments, God presents Himself as working with human agents, and as being disappointed in His hopes for them, rather than as compelling them to act in prescribed ways. This is clear throughout the narrative of Israel, and in passages such as Is. 65:1-2, in which the Lord bemoans the stubbornness of those who will not call on Him, despite His many revelations to them. The Bible teaches us that we can thwart God’s desire that we freely return His love. This is suggested by passages such as Mark 6:5-6, in which we are told that Jesus could not perform many miracles in his hometown because of the lack of faith of its people, and it is explicit in Luke 7:30, in which we are told that the Pharisees rejected God’s purpose. God asks us to follow and obey Him; He does not compel obedience. Nor should every calamitous event be assumed to be divine punishment for disobedience (Job, Lk. 13:1-5, Jn. 9:1-3).

The above passages suggest that God desires to be in relationship with His created people in a manner that respects their freedom to respond to Him in various ways, and that He is genuinely responsive to our concerns. There are also passages in Scripture that more directly suggest that the future is open, and that not even God has foreknowledge of what will contingently happen. Genesis 22:12 records God as stating, “Now I know that you fear God, because you have not withheld from me your son, your only son.” The emphasis on “now” knowing “because” of Abraham’s action clearly points to this being a genuine test of Abraham’s faith, where even God could not be sure of Abraham’s response to the test. Jeremiah 3:7 and 19-20 quote God as saying that He thought Israel would return to faith in Him, but that she had not. Mark 6:6 emphasizes Jesus’ amazement at the lack of faith of those in His hometown, a reaction that only makes sense if He had had an expectation of greater faith. These passages suggest that God can genuinely learn new information.

Of course, the above is meant only to be suggestive of the kinds of considerations that Open Theists emphasize in reading the Bible. These several texts are among those that suggest that God desires to be in a relationship that respects our freedom to respond to God in a variety of ways, and that He has thus left the future open to determination through our actions, at least in part. But critics of Open Theism interpret the same data differently. For instance, Classical Theists may suggest that an incarnational theology’s emphasis on the revelation of God in Christ is misguided if it does not give sufficient weight to the idea that God veiled His glory in becoming human (see Jn. 17:5). And they cite other texts that are arguably more suggestive of the traditional view of God as providentially in control of all that happens, such as Isaiah 40-48, Romans 9, and Ephesians 1:11.

Any reading of the Bible must seek a consistent hermeneutic, and must acknowledge that certain texts must be given readings that are not initially obvious. “Prophetic” texts are read by Open Theists as either decrees of what God has decided to do, conditional predictions about what will happen if certain conditions (such as repentance) are not met, or forecasts based upon God’s exhaustive knowledge of the past and present. None of these interpretations require God to have exhaustive foreknowledge of future events, but responsible readers of the Bible may well disagree about the plausibility of these interpretations as applied to specific passages. Open Theists also argue that plausible readings that accord with Open Theism can be given of “pancausality” texts such as those alluded to in the previous paragraph, and that this is preferable to dismissing as merely anthropomorphic the overwhelming sense of the Bible that God is in dynamic relationship with His creation.

3. Philosophical Considerations

Many theologians in the Christian tradition have maintained both that we are free to choose how we act, and that God foresees our choices. Many lay Christians likewise think that this is the obvious way to reconcile our freedom with God’s omniscience. So long as God does not pre-determine that we act in the ways that we do, but only “sees” what we do, what is the problem? Why does Open Theism insist that the future is open in such a way that God’s foreknowledge of contingent events must be denied?

There are two primary ways of understanding the nature of human freedom. The “compatibilist” view of freedom is that so long as one is acting in a manner that accords with one’s desires or can be otherwise identified with one’s character, one acts freely. Our freedom is compatible with our actions being determined, so long as we are acting in the way we want. We are free so long as were we to desire otherwise, we could act otherwise, and this is so even if we could not desire otherwise. If this is the right view of our freedom, then God might predetermine all of our actions while they are yet free, so long as they are consistent with our character.

The alternative account of the nature of freedom is “libertarian.” This account maintains that unless one is genuinely able to do otherwise than one does, one is not free. So, if one’s character is formed in such a way that one will certainly act in a particular way, and if one has no control over one’s character, then one is not really free, since one cannot act in a manner otherwise than one does. Importantly, one may remain morally responsible for one's action if one's character has become thus through one's earlier free decisions. (Alternatively, one might be said to be free in a derivative sense if one's character was freely chosen in the past.) If as a result of our sinful nature we cannot choose to do good, then we are not genuinely free to do otherwise than sin. We must really be able to either accept God’s invitation to love Him or to reject it, if we are free with respect to this choice. And if we are not and have never been libertarianly free with respect to this choice , then we are not morally responsible for our choice of whether or not to love God.

Open Theists affirm a libertarian view of freedom. From almost the beginning of Western philosophy, philosophers have been concerned with whether such freedom is compatible with prior truths about what one will do. Aristotle famously argued in his De Interpretatione (book 9) that prior truth is incompatible with future contingency. His argument there may be represented as follows:

  1. It is true that it will be white.
  2. If it is true that it will be white, then it has always been true that it will be white.
  3. If it has always been true that it will be white, then it is impossible that it will not be white.
  4. If it is impossible that it will not be white, then it is necessary that it will be white.
  5. It is necessary that it will be white.

An obvious implication of this argument is that if it is now true that one will act in a particular way, then it is necessary that one will act thusly. But it is not immediately clear why one should accept premise 3. Why should one think that something’s always having been the case entails the impossibility of its ever being otherwise?

One plausible reason for thinking this is based on the idea that one cannot change the past. If a proposition was once true, can one now act in such a way that it is no longer true? If not, then the prior truth of a proposition about what one will do seems enough to rule out one’s doing otherwise, and thus rule out one’s being libertarianly free with respect to that action. The same type of consideration applies to God’s prior knowledge of what one will do. Consider the following argument given by William Hasker in The Openness of God:

  1. It is now true that Clarence will have a cheese omelet for breakfast tomorrow. (Premise)
  2. It is impossible that God should at any time believe what is false, or fail to believe anything that is true. (Premise: divine omniscience)
  3. God has always believed that Clarence will have a cheese omelet tomorrow. (From 1, 2)
  4. If God has always believed a certain thing, it is not in anyone’s power to bring it about that God has not always believed that thing. (Premise: the unalterability of the past)
  5. Therefore, it is not in Clarence’s power to bring it about that God has not always believed that he would have a cheese omelet for breakfast. (From 3, 4)
  6. It is not possible for it to be true both that God has always believed that Clarence would have a cheese omelet for breakfast, and that he does not in fact have one. (from 2)
  7. Therefore, it is not in Clarence’s power to refrain from having a cheese omelet for breakfast tomorrow. (From 5, 6) So Clarence’s eating the omelet tomorrow is not an act of free choice. (From the definition of free will.)

If premise 4 is true and if we have libertarian freedom, then it is not possible for God to know what we will freely do before we do it.

Whether one finds Open Theism plausible largely depends on whether one finds the intuition underlying premise 4 plausible. Philosophers have debated whether all of the past is comprised of “hard” facts fixed in this way, or whether there are “soft” facts that might be conditional upon our future actions. Proponents of the compatibility of human libertarian freedom with divine foreknowledge have argued that facts about God’s prior knowledge of our future actions are conditional on our subsequent choices. To use Clarence as an example, were he to choose to have a bagel tomorrow, it always would have been true that God knew that he would so choose, rather than that he would choose to eat an omelet. Since there is no reason to think that Clarence’s choice is determined by prior causes, divine or otherwise, one may affirm that he is free to have an omelet or not even while maintaining that God knows he will have an omelet. Clarence has what has been termed “counterfactual power” over the past: the power to act in such a way that were he to so act, the past always would have been different than it in fact is. Proponents of counterfactual power over the past can thus agree that Clarence does not have the power to change, or alter, the past, since were he to eat a bagel, it never would have been true that he would eat an omelet tomorrow.

Philosophers have not come to an agreement over whether one might have counterfactual power over the past, or whether the past is instead fixed in a manner that rules out this power. On this topic, basic intuitions about freedom and the fixity of the past differ from person to person, and largely determine how they view the compatibility of divine foreknowledge with human freedom, and thus how they view the plausibility of Open Theism.

It is important to note that even if foreknowledge and freedom are compatible, it is not clear that simple foreknowledge -- foreknowledge that is not based on middle knowledge (see below) -- could be of any aid to God in providentially ordering His creation. If God knows what will actually happen, He cannot also use this information to arrange for something else to happen, for then the contents of what He “knows” would not comprise knowledge. Foreknowledge is of the actual occurrence of future events; once the occurrence of these events is known, it is “too late” to prevent them (or to bring them about). Doing so is incompatible with their occurrence being infallibly known by God. Simple foreknowledge, if God has it, allows Him to know what will occur without having to wait for the future occurrence of events, as He must for contingent events according to Open Theism. But His knowledge is no less conditioned by the occurrence of the events; He has no greater control over their occurrence based on foreknowledge than He does if Open Theism is true.

Once it is realized that simple foreknowledge does not offer any providential advantage to God, one may wonder what reason there is to affirm it, aside from an assumption that it is more perfect for God to have such knowledge than not. One might think that foreknowledge would provide an explanation for the accuracy of prophecy. But it does not. If God has “at once” complete foreknowledge of all that happens, He “sees” what will happen including whether or not He instructs persons to prophesy that events will happen. Given knowledge of what will occur, God is not free to do otherwise than He foresees He will do. Perhaps God could “look” at a little bit of the future at a time, make decisions about how He will react to the events He foresees, and then “look” a little further to see how His creation reacts to these actions. But this would offer no greater help for predicting future events. Suppose that God foresees the course of the world until the end of 1935. Could He then decide to warn persons on January 1st of 1936 that the holocaust is about to occur? Not in any infallible way. For assuming that the holocaust was still avoidable in 1935, and assuming that God has not yet “looked” beyond 1935, He does not yet know what will occur in the next ten years. He can decide to make probably accurate but possibly mistaken predictions on January 1, 1936, based on the tendencies present at that point, but this is no more than He can do given Open Theism.

Simple foreknowledge has no utility for God’s providential governance of the world, nor can it ground infallible predictions of future events. (It should also be reiterated that Open Theists believe that there are less instances of such predictions in the Bible than is thought by those who affirm a traditional meticulous view of providence.) If one wants to affirm that we have libertarian freedom and still maintain a traditional view of providence according to which God directs the course of the world rather than merely witnessing how it unfolds, then affirming foreknowledge is not enough.

The most plausible view of how human libertarian freedom might be compatible with a traditional view of providence, and thus the greatest competitor to Open Theism, is a view called “Molinism,” named after a sixteenth century Jesuit theologian, Luis de Molina. Molina predicated “middle knowledge” to God and explained God’s providential determination of what will occur in terms of this knowledge. Middle knowledge is knowledge that lies between (in an explanatory sense, not a temporal sense) God’s “natural” knowledge of all the possible ways the world might go and His “free” knowledge of the one way the world will go based upon His creative decree. Natural knowledge is pre-volitional knowledge of necessary truths, including all the possibilities for creation. Free knowledge is post-volitional knowledge of contingent truths, including all future contingent truths. And middle knowledge is pre-volitional knowledge of contingent subjunctive conditional truths of the form: if such and such were the case, then so and so would be the case. God’s middle knowledge includes all the facts about how the world would go given various antecedent conditions. These facts, because they are known before God wills anything, are outside of His control.

Through middle knowledge, God might have known that were he to place Adam and Eve in the Garden of Eden in just the way He did, then they would sin by eating of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil. And He might have known that if they did this and He subsequently kicked them out of the garden, events would unfold in a certain way. God’s middle knowledge would include all the true subjunctive conditionals about how the persons He might create would act in the various circumstances He might place them. These subjunctive conditionals have come to be called “counterfactuals of creaturely freedom.” Based on this exhaustive middle knowledge, God would have known how events would unfold given any creative action He might decide to perform. And on the assumption that libertarian freedom is consistent with knowledge of how one would act in various circumstances, our freedom would remain intact. Molinism promises to uphold both our libertarian freedom and God’s ability to providentially decide exactly what occurs in His creation.

There are two primary objections to Molinism that Open Theists have advanced. If the argument that foreknowledge is incompatible with libertarian freedom is valid, then a similar argument can be made against the compatibility of middle knowledge with libertarian freedom. If it has always been true and known by God that I would act in such and such a way if I were in such and such circumstances, then do I have the power to bring it about that this fact has never been true, or never been known by God? Do I have counterfactual power over this past truth and God’s past knowledge of it? I must, in order to be libertarianly free. The same intuitions about the fixity of the past are brought into play. The other objection to Molinism given by Open Theists, termed the “grounding objection,” is based on the status of the counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. These are truths that, though contingent, are not under God’s control. God “finds Himself” faced with these truths, similarly to the manner in which He “finds Himself” faced with the fact that 2+2=4. But why are certain subjunctives true and certain ones not? The grounding objection is that there seems to be no reason that some particular counterfactuals of creaturely freedom are true rather than others. There is no ground for their truth or falsity. If one believes that all truths, or all contingent truths, must have some underlying ground or “truth-maker,” then one will reject the idea that there are counterfactuals of creaturely freedom available to God prior to creation.

The most important philosophical argument for Open Theism is based on the idea that God’s foreknowledge of one’s actions is incompatible with those actions being free because one does not have the power to bring it about that God has never known something that He does in fact know. But it is important to note that foreknowledge alone is of no help to God in providentially directing the course of His creation. The real competitor to Open Theism as an account of God’s providence is Molinism. Open Theists object to Molinism because they view as implausible the counterfactual power over the past that Molinism requires, and because they believe that there are insufficient grounds for the contingent truth of the counterfactuals of creaturely freedom that Molinists believe God knows via His middle knowledge.

4. Theological Implications

In considering any theology, it is important not only to evaluate the Scriptural and philosophical arguments for and against the view, but also to consider how it might be incorporated into one’s lived faith. So, this article ends with a consideration of the practical implications of Open Theism – for how one views evil, for prayer, and for how one understands the responsibility for salvation.

The traditional view of divine providence holds that each and every event occurs according to God’s will. The implication that the most horrendous evils are thus intended by God has troubled many persons. One of the advantages of Open Theism (and any other view that denies meticulous providence) is that the responsibility for evil is much more clearly removed from God and placed upon our free choices. Because God desires that we freely choose to love Him, he has given us the freedom to reject Him as well, and our acts of rejection take all kinds of horrible forms. The responsibility for the evil that we freely perform is fundamentally ours. While God gave us the ability to do evil things, He does not in any sense intend that we do them. Rather, He grieves with and comforts the victims of our sins.

If God’s will for the world is inviolable, then we must have faith that each instance of evil serves some greater good that God has purposed. On the other hand, if much of the evil in the world is due to our free choices, then there is significant gratuitous evil that serves no further purpose. To those who believe that much of the evil in the world is indeed gratuitous, Open Theism provides an understanding of God’s general project that explains why He allows us to exercise our freedom in ways that sadden Him. He does this because He must do so in order to also allow us the freedom to reciprocate His unfailing love for us.

Not everyone finds this kind of free will defense against the problem of evil comforting. If Open Theism is true, then there is no guarantee that everything will work out as God wants in the end. Open Theists may trust and hope in God’s wisdom and power, but they recognize that there are limitations on what God can effect if we stubbornly refuse to aid Him. Some persons find it easier to have faith in an inscrutable secret will of God that is furthered by the evil we witness. This response to evil also has the advantage of applying to natural evil as well as evil events that result from our actions. While Open Theists may point out that much of the “natural” evil in the world is exacerbated by our poor stewardship of the earth, they must also seek additional explanations for God’s allowance of the devastation and suffering brought about by natural disasters.

Just as one’s views of freedom and of whether the past is fixed in such a way to rule out counterfactual power over it are good predictors of whether one finds Open Theism plausible, one’s reaction to evil is also a reliable indicator of how one thinks of Open Theism. If one cannot imagine that a good and loving God would intend that genocide, torture, rape, and other horrendous evils occur for some inscrutable good, then one is likely to find a free will theodicy, and Open Theism, comforting. If instead one cannot imagine that God would allow us to perform such horrible acts, or allow the massive suffering caused by natural disasters, without there being some very great good that they serve, then one is likely to put one’s faith in the mysterious but certain goodness of God’s meticulous governance of creation.

One of the advantages of Open Theism against any theology that affirms divine foreknowledge or foreordination is that prayer can genuinely influence God’s decisions. Because the future is open and not yet determined, we may pray that God will exercise His influence in ways we desire. We may ask that He will aid ourselves or others. We may easily make sense of James’ assertion that “You do not have, because you do not ask God.” (Ja. 4:2b) In contrast, if God determines the occurrence of each and every event, then He also determines whether and how we pray. On a traditional view of God that affirms His meticulous sovereignty, our prayer is ultimately brought about by God; it cannot persuade God. And even if God merely foreknows our prayers as part of His exhaustive foreknowledge, rather than bringing those prayers about, He also foreknows His response to those prayers, so that there is no greater room for our prayers to influence God’s decisions. Only if the future is open does prayer that God will act in certain ways make sense. Since we often pray in this way, this is an important consideration in favor of Open Theism.

However, proponents of more traditional views of sovereignty can attempt to minimize the purported advantage that Open Theism has for understanding prayer by asking what essential role prayer plays in God’s decision-making, even if Open Theism is true. Since God knows everything about the past and present, and the probabilities of what might occur in the future, can prayer really inform God of anything? He already knows our every thought and desire, and whether our wants are likely to be good for us. Given this, should we think of God as waiting for us to pray to take whatever action seems best for those for whom we pray? Perhaps. It may be that the action of making a request is important – perhaps we do not really understand what it is we would ask, until we bring ourselves to ask it. It also may be that God sometimes grants requests that we make, even though He believes that they are ill-advised, because He believes that we will learn important lessons from pursuing the course of action we desire. Open Theists may respond to the above line of criticism in various ways, but it should be clear that the advantage that Open Theists have for understanding prayer as a means of influencing God is not as great as it initially appears.

The critical questions about how our prayers might influence the actions God chooses to take in the world do not apply in the same way to prayers for divine guidance. Here too, Open Theists have the advantage of a view that allows God to genuinely guide and advise His followers, because the future is not determinate. We may pray that God would guide us in important choices that we must make, trusting in His greater knowledge of the possible and probable effects of these choices. This too is an important kind of prayer that we often exercise, and so the advantage of being able to understand how God might genuinely guide us in response to prayers that He do so is an important benefit of affirming Open Theism. Molinists may say that God chooses to create a world in which He always knows that and how we will pray, in which He knows how He will respond to these prayers, and in which He knows how we will respond to His “guidance.” But assuming that Open Theists are right to deny counterfactual power over the past, God’s responses to prayer given Molinism cannot constitute advice that one may take or not, as it does given Open Theism, precisely because Molinists view the future as determinate and known by God once God has willed His initial creation.

Of course, God’s guidance is limited to His knowledge of how things will probably go if one thing is done rather than another. He cannot know what will happen as a result of our decision so long as the effects of that decision will be influenced by other free decisions. And the further in the future we consider, the less certain that even God can be of what will occur. So while God’s advice about what to do is certainly much better than any other person’s, it is no guarantee that everything will in fact go well. Furthermore, the idea of praying for guidance is most easily understood on a dialogical model, in which we speak with and hear from God. If one does not feel that God usually communicates with us so directly, then it is harder to understand how He might guide us in any precise way. It is important to note that seeking “signs” of God’s will for us is not likely to be particularly reliable if those signs could also be brought about or blocked by other free agents.

In light of the above discussion, we may conclude that Open Theists can understand the efficacy of prayers that God will act in certain ways and prayers for divine guidance in decision-making. In contrast, those who affirm meticulous providence or exhaustive and settled foreknowledge of what will contingently occur plausibly cannot understand this efficacy, since there seems to be no room for our prayers to affect God or for His response to them to affect our decisions, if the decisions of both God and ourselves have always been foreknown, and perhaps foreordained. But we have also seen that what initially seems to be a clear advantage for Open Theism is tempered by questions about how exactly we might influence God, and about how exactly He might communicate His advice to us in response to prayers for guidance.

The final theological implication of Open Theism that requires discussion is the degree to which we have a greater responsibility for our salvation if Open Theism is true. Traditionally, Christians have emphasized that we are constrained by our sinful nature in such a way that we cannot respond favorably to God without additional grace given by Him. If this grace is both necessary and sufficient for a "salvific" faith, then the ultimate cause of whether one is saved or not is God’s giving or withholding of that grace, rather than any “choice” one makes. Open Theism claims that it is essential that the choice for or against God that determines our salvation be genuinely up to us. We must be free to choose to love or reject God, in order for our choice to love Him to be genuine, and giving us that genuine choice is the reason that God has given us libertarian freedom.

To what extent is God’s glory diminished by His giving us a greater role in our salvation, that of genuinely choosing whether or not to follow Him? While some opponents of Open Theism have argued that any attribution to human persons of an ability to determine a necessary condition of salvation impugns God’s sovereignty, it is not at all clear that this is so. If Open Theism is true, we are still dependent on God’s gracious and freely-given invitation to us to love Him and thereby be saved. Open Theists may even affirm a doctrine of sin that predicates to us an inability to respond favorably to God without further enabling grace. But they claim that God has extended this enabling grace to all persons through Jesus Christ and the Holy Spirit. The only thing that we do is decide whether or not to accept the greatest gift imaginable. There is no cause for pride on our part in making the right choice. If we truly appreciate God’s glorious sovereignty, rather than requiring that His sovereignty be understood in particular ways, then the only appropriate response to God’s invitation involves humility.

The debate over whether Open Theism correctly portrays God’s relationship to His creation involves a complicated web of Biblical data, philosophical arguments, and reflection on the practical theological implications of the view. Certain points of contention clearly divide those who might consider Open Theism from those who will not: a belief that libertarian freedom is essential to moral responsibility, a belief that the past is fixed in such a way that we do not have the ability to bring it about that it was always different, and a belief that evil should be attributed to our imperfect human decisions rather than to a secret inscrutable will of God. Of these three beliefs, it is the second that divides Open Theists from Molinists, who also affirm libertarian freedom but attempt to do so in concert with meticulous providence. Even if one affirms all three of these beliefs, however, there remains the hard work of slowly working through a detailed examination of Scripture and reflection on the Christian life. This is the case for any theology, and it is perhaps especially so for a relatively young theology such as Open Theism.

5. References and Further Reading

a. For Open Theism

  • David Basinger, The Case for Freewill Theism: A Philosophical Assessment (Downer's Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 1996).
    • A brief consideration of freewill theism generally, and open theism specifically, especially as applied to the topics of omniscience, evil, and prayer.
  • Gregory A. Boyd, God of the Possible: A Biblical Introduction to the Open View of God (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2000).
    • A brief and easy to read consideration of the Biblical case for Open Theism.
  • Terence Fretheim, The Suffering of God: An Old Testament Perspective, Overtures to Biblical Theology (Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1984).
    • A study of the use of metaphors in describing God in the Old Testament, and a case for predicating suffering, and thus genuine responsiveness, to God.
  • William Hasker, “Foreknowledge and Necessity,” Faith and Philosophy 2, no. 2 (April 1985), 121-157.
    • An extended argument that foreknowledge is incompatible with libertarian freedom.
  • William Hasker, God, Time and Knowledge, Cornell Studies in the Philosophy of Religion (Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1998).
    • A book length exposition of the philosophical case for Open Theism. Also a good place to start to get a sense of the philosophical debate over the relationship of freedom and divine foreknowledge.
  • William Hasker, Providence, Evil, and the Openness of God, Routledge Studies in the Philosophy of Religion (New York: Routledge, 2004).
    • A consideration of the strengths of Open Theism in comparison with Calvinism, process theism, and Molinism, especially with regard to the problem of evil and the question of divine action within the world.
  • Clark H. Pinnock, Most Moved Mover: A Theology of God’s Openness (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2001).
    • An exposition of Open Theism in terms of the controlling metaphor of God as love that treats in turn: the Scriptural foundations for Open Theism, the development of traditional Christianity influenced by Hellenic philosophy, the philosophical case for Open Theism, and Open Theism’s adequacy to the practical demands of living one’s faith.
  • Clark H. Pinnock, Richard Rice, John Sanders, William Hasker, and David Basinger. The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God (Downers Grove, Ill.: InterVarsity, 1994).
    • The book that began the extensive debate over Open Theism. A series of five essays that consider Biblical and historical considerations in favor of Open Theism, what a systematic openness theology amounts to, the philosophical case for this view, and its practical implications. An appropriate starting point for anyone interested in learning about Open Theism.
  • Richard Rice, God’s Foreknowledge and Man’s Free Will (Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock Publishers, 2004). Previously published as The Openness of God: The Relationship of Divine Foreknowledge and Human Free Will (Minneapolis: Bethany House, 1980).
    • An early argument for the present-knowledge or open view of God.
  • John Sanders, The God Who Risks: A Theology of Providence (Downers Grove, Ill.: InterVarsity Press, 1998).
    • The best exposition of Open Theism to date, especially with respect to the Biblical case for the view, and in systematically setting out openness theology. Also an excellent source of additional references to texts related to Open Theism.
  • Richard Swinburne, The Coherence of Theism, rev. ed. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).
    • A penetrating philosophical case for understanding theism in a manner that accords with Open Theism’s view, made prior to the widespread use of that term.

b. Against Open Theism

  • William Lane Craig, The Only Wise God: The Compatibility of Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom (Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock Publishers, 2000).
    • An argument for the compatibility of divine foreknowledge and human libertarian freedom based on Molinism’s attribution to God of middle knowledge of subjunctive conditionals about what free agents will do in particular circumstances (counterfactuals of creaturely freedom).
  • Millard Erickson, What does God Know and When does He know it?: The Current Controversy over Divine Foreknowledge (Grand Rapids, MI: Zondervan, 2003).
    • An extended argument against Open Theism that also calls for greater moderation and civility in the debate over the topic.
  • Thomas P. Flint, Divine Providence: The Molinist Account (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1998).
    • The most thorough explication of Molinism, with critiques of both orthodox Thomistic and Open Theistic views of divine providence.
  • John Frame, No Other God: A Response to Open Theism (Phillipsburg, NJ: Presbyterian & Reformed, 2001).
    • A critique of Open Theism based on a Reformed reading of Scripture.
  • Norman L. Geisler and H. Wayne House, The Battle for God: Responding to the Challenge of Neotheism, (Grand Rapids, MI: Kregal Publications, 2001).
    • Calling Open Theism “neotheism,” this work argues that Open Theism is dangerously far from traditional Christianity, and seeks to explicate the orthodox view of God’s attributes.
  • Paul Helm, The Providence of God. Contours of Christian Theology, (Downers Grove: IL: InterVarsity Press, 1994).
    • A systematic explication of God’s providence as risk-free meticulous sovereignty.
  • Beyond the Bounds: Open Theism and the Undermining of Biblical Christianity, edited by John Piper, Justin Taylor, and Paul Helseth (Wheaton, IL: Crossway Books, 2003).
    • A series of essays arguing that Open Theism is unorthodox and not an acceptable form of Christianity.
  • Still Sovereign: Contemporary Perspectives on Election, Foreknowledge, and Grace, edited by Thomas R. Schreiner and Bruce A. Ware (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2000).
    • A series of essays explicating and defending the classical view of divine sovereignty.
  • Bruce A. Ware, God’s Lesser Glory: The Diminished God of Open Theism (Wheaton, Ill: Crossway Books, 2001).
    • An argument, primarily based on his reading of Scripture, that Open Theism is false and its consequences are dire.
  • R. K. McGregor Wright, No Place for Sovereignty: What's Wrong with Freewill Theism (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 1996).
    • An attempt to show what’s wrong biblically, theologically, and philosophically with freewill theism, both in its contemporary (Open Theism) and historical forms (Arminianism).

c. Multiple Views

  • Predestination and Free Will: Four Views of Divine Sovereignty and Human Freedom, edited by David Basinger and Randall Basinger (Downer's Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 1986).
    • Essays in favor of foreordination (John Feinberg), foreknowledge (Norman Geisler), God’s self-limited power (Bruce Reichenbach), and God’s self-limited knowledge (Clark Pinnock), with responses by each author to the other essays.
  • Divine Foreknowledge: Four Views, edited by James Beilby and Paul Eddy (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2001).
    • Essays in favor of Open Theism (Gregory Boyd), simple foreknowledge (David Hunt), middle knowledge or Molinism (William Lane Craig), and the Augustinian-Calvinist view (Paul Helm), with responses by each author to the other essays.
  • God and Time: Four Views, edited by Gregory Ganssle (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2001).
    • Essays on divine timeless eternity (Paul Helm), eternity as relative timelessness (Alan Padgett), timelessness and omnitemporality (William Lane Craig), and unqualified divine temporality (Nicholas Wolterstorff), with responses by each author to the other essays.
  • Christopher Hall and John Sanders, Does God Have a Future?: A Debate on Divine Providence, (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2003).
    • The product of a year’s dialogue via email between Hall, who affirms a classical theism, and Sanders, an Open Theist, about divine providence and foreknowledge.

Author Information

James Rissler
Email: amf@atlantamennonite.org
Oglethorpe University
U. S. A.