Phenomenological Psychology

graphicPhenomenological psychology is the use of the phenomenological method to gain insights regarding topics related to psychology. Though researchers and thinkers throughout the history of philosophy have identified their work as contributing to phenomenological psychology, how people understand phenomenological psychology is a matter of some controversy. On the one hand, in light of contemporary philosophy’s affirmation of qualia as non-reducible, some understand phenomenological psychology to be merely a method for understanding subjective experience. When phenomenological psychology is understood this way, clarification is usually sought in terms such as “introspection” and “psychologism.” Put as a question, are the research methods identified as phenomenological and used in psychology ultimately the formalization of methods for gathering and preserving data regarding merely the subjective experience of (subjective and objective) events?

On the other hand, phenomenological psychology refers to the use of phenomenology to study the necessary and universal structures of experience. In this way, phenomenological psychology is grounded in transcendental analysis as a research method which analyzes the necessary conditions for the possibility of human experience. Whereas according to the former understanding, the results of such research supposedly have minimal to no universal generalizability, the latter understanding speaks of a cognitional structure universally generalizable to the human species. This article discusses the nature and history of phenomenological psychology, addressing the above distinct understandings of phenomenology as applied to psychology and the distinction between phenomenological and naturalistic psychology.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Phenomenology?
    1. Method vs. Movement
    2. Avoiding Psychologism
    3. Transcendental Analysis and Attitude
  2. What is Psychology?
    1. Natural Science vs. Human Science
    2. Naturalistic vs. Personalistic Standpoint
    3. Elimination vs. Reduction vs. Supervenience
  3. Which Husserl? Whose Phenomenology?
    1. Husserl’s Five Different Introductions to Phenomenology
    2. Husserl’s Three Different Ways to Phenomenological Reduction
  4. Phenomenological Psychology as a Science
    1. Phenomenology vs. Phenomenography
    2. Descriptive Phenomenology
    3. Interpretive-Hermeneutic Phenomenology
  5. Phenomenological Psychology as the Analytic of Ontic Dasein
    1. Heidegger and Science
    2. Heidegger and Psychology
    3. The Therapeutic Value of Minding the Clearing
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Suggested Further Reading

1. What is Phenomenology?

a. Method vs. Movement

Phenomenology may be understood as a method for investigating the cognitional structure of experience or as a movement in the history of philosophy. Given the heterodoxy of approaches and emphases in the history of philosophy to phenomenology, formal explications of phenomenology usually resist speaking as if “phenomenology” refers to a unified “school” of thought. Yet, when considered as a movement in the history of philosophy, Edmund Husserl (1859-1938) is identified as the founder of phenomenology, and when considered as a method Immanuel Kant  (1724-1804) is identified as the progenitor of phenomenology.

It has become customary when discussing the origin of the term “phenomenology,” to refer to Christoph Friedrich Oetinger’s (compare Kant, 1900) 1762 use of the term and to invoke, following Martin Heidegger, a reference to Johann H. Lambert’s 1764 New Organon (Neues Organon) from where it appears Kant obtained the term. In a 1770 correspondence with Lambert, the outline of Kant’s appropriation of the term into the Critique of Pure Reason can already be seen. According to Kant,

The most universal laws of sensibility play an unjustifiably large role in metaphysics, where, after all, it is merely concepts and principles of pure reason that are at issue. It seems to me a quite particular, although merely negative science, general phenomenology (phaenomenologia generalis), must precede metaphysics. In it the principles of sensibility, their validity and their limitations, would be determined, so that these principles could not be confusedly applied to objects of pure reason (Kant, 1986, p. 59, translation slightly modified; compare Heidegger, 2005, p. 3).

Two pieces are of the utmost importance in this passage from Kant. First, Kant makes a distinction between the impure and the pure use of reason. Impure reason refers to the a priori aspects of experience, and these aspects are universal within the human experience. Further, impure reason is differentiated from pure reason insofar as impure reason includes what Kant in the above passage calls “sensibility.” Hence, “phenomenology,” for Kant, should be understood as the “science” that studies the aspects universal to human experience.

The second important piece of the Kant passage is his explicit description of phenomenology as determining the “principles of sensibility.” Here, “principle” should be understood in terms of the structural origins of human experience. In other words, Kant understands the principles of sensibility to belong to the order of necessary and universal conditions of human experience, a.k.a. the “structure of experience.” Already in this earliest definition by Kant, phenomenology pertains to human experience and, thereby, takes the first-person perspective of some subject as a point of departure. However, because phenomenology studies the universal and necessary aspects of such experience, it is neither merely subjective, nor concerned with a particular psychological subject.

G.W.F. Hegel inherited this understanding of phenomenology from Kant. According to Joseph Kockelmans, “it was only with Hegel that a well-defined technical meaning became attached” to the term phenomenology. For “Hegel, phenomenology was not knowledge of the Absolute-in-and-for-itself, in the spirit of Fichte or Schelling, but in his Phenomenology of Spirit [(Phänomenologie des Geistes)] he wanted to solely consider knowledge as it appears to consciousness” (Kockelmans, 1967, p. 24). Further, beyond the emergence of the term “phenomenology” in the eighteenth century, Heidegger traces its etymology to the terms phainomenon and logos in Aristotle, especially Book II of De Anima (On the Soul), where Aristotle discusses “seeing” (compare Heidegger, 2005, pp. 3-18).

It was not until the twentieth century, however, that a phenomenological “movement” is identified in the history of philosophy (compare Spiegelberg, 1965). Though Husserl is identified as the founder of this movement, the perplexities involved in understanding this movement as unified are discussed below. What is clear is that Husserl’s initial formulation of phenomenology was influenced by Franz Brentano (1838-1917). Not only is Brentano credited with identifying “intentionality” as the mark of the mental, at the University of Vienna “in his lectures on Descriptive Psychology (1889), Brentano employed the phrase ‘descriptive psychology or descriptive phenomenology’ to differentiate” a descriptive science of the mental “from genetic or physiological psychology” (Moran, 2000, p. 8). However, in what will be a central and career-long concern for Husserl, a descriptive phenomenology or psychology must avoid psychologism.

Though what is meant by psychologism is discussed below, it may be simply understood as the attempt to make objective reality depend upon the psychological features of some subject. For example, on the one hand, though some thing may be experienced differently by different humans, it is still the case that there is some thing to be experienced. That means it is not the case that the thing would be there for some humans and not for others. On the other hand, despite differences across human subjects (for example color blindness, mental illness, habitual tendencies) there are objective aspects of the experience of a thing which are universalizable across humans. Hence, phenomenology is not concerned with the non-universalizable.

b. Avoiding Psychologism

Though Husserl identifies more than one kind of psychologism, a characterization of Husserl’s phenomenology, insofar as it is an attempt to avoid psychologism, in general is possible. Psychologism for Husserl is a kind of relativism. In the two volume set titled Logical Investigations (1900-1901), which Husserl identified as his entry into phenomenology, psychologism is the theme of the entire first volume. There he notes, “Psychologism in all its subvarieties and individual elaborations is … relativism” (Husserl, 2001a, p. 82).

Generally stated, objective aspects of human experience are “psychologized” when “their objective sense, their sense as a species of objects having a peculiar essence, is denied in favor of the subjective mental occurrences, the data in immanent or psychological temporality” (Husserl, 1969, p. 169). According to Husserl, “the expression psychologism” applies to “any interpretation which converts objectivities into something psychological in the proper sense” (Husserl, 1969, p. 169; compare Hopkins, 2006). This is to say, that at any moment of some human subject’s experience the content of that moment may be differentiated between the objective and subjective aspects of the experience, and one is guilty of psychologism when one treats the objective (universalizable) aspects of the experience as if they are merely subjective. Though different subjects have different perspectives, to claim the reality of a situation is not universally true because it rather depends on the subjective determination of subjects is to be guilty of psychologism.

Husserl’s phenomenology, even his “descriptive” phenomenology, may be characterized as an attempt to avoid psychologism. In the second volume of Logical Investigations Husserl identifies the “exclusive concern” of phenomenology as

experiences intuitively seizable and analyzable in the pure generality of their essence, not experiences empirically perceived and treated as real facts, as experiences of human or animal experients in the phenomenal world that we posit as an empirical fact. This phenomenology must bring to pure expression, must describe in terms of their essential concepts and their governing formulae of essence, the essences which directly make themselves known in intuition, and the connections which have their roots purely in such essences. Each such statement of essence is an a priori statement in the highest sense of the word (Husserl, 2001b, p. 86).

Understanding Husserl’s phenomenology as engaged in a “war” (Husserl, 1969, p. 172) on psychologism helps clarify the actual relation between the various phenomenological psychology approaches to subjective experience and, at least, Husserl’s phenomenology, if not the “phenomenology movement” itself.

Not only is Husserl’s statement above helpful toward getting a sense of the theme of Husserl’s philosophy, it also invokes the important role of the a priori in his understanding of phenomenology. Contents of experience derived from the senses, that is the a posteriori, cannot provide universal and necessary knowledge. Similarly, “empiricism expressly teaches” “more or less vague probabilities resting on experience and induction, concerned with matters of fact in the life of man” (Husserl, 2001a, p. 56). Hence, Husserl’s concern to uncover the universal and necessary, that is the a priori, conditions of possible experience reveals a deep kinship with Kant’s critical philosophy generally, and specifically his Critique of Pure Reason (compare Kant, 1998; compare Allison, 1975; compare Heidegger, 1997).

This kinship is already indicated in the understanding of phenomenology as a method, often referred to as “transcendental analysis” or simply “phenomenology,” and Kant as the progenitor of this method. Yet, some phenomenological psychologists are still reluctant to acknowledge the value of Kant, though Husserl himself eventually affirmed the primacy of Kant’s thinking in such statements as the following: “The proof of this idealism is therefore phenomenology itself. Only someone who misunderstands either the deepest sense of intentional method, or that of transcendental reduction, or perhaps both, can attempt to separate phenomenology from transcendental idealism” (Husserl, 1999, p. 86). As an example, then, of someone who takes the method over the movement reading of phenomenology, Tom Rockmore in his Kant and Phenomenology provides a cogent characterization. According to Rockmore, Husserl “believed that he invented phenomenology and that earlier efforts, notably in Hegel, whom he seems to have known little about, but whom he criticized, were not significant” (Rockmore, 2011, p. 101). However, Rockmore goes further to explain,

Husserl depends on Kant in a number of ways: for example, his concern for philosophy as a rigorous science, his conception of phenomenology as transcendental idealism, the relation of transcendental phenomenology to the life-world, and, above all, the problem of psychologism. This problem, which arises in Kant’s criticism of Lockean so-called physiology, leads to a conception of the subject as a later version of the Kantian transcendental unity of apperception running through Husserl’s positon from beginning to end (Rockmore, 2011, p. 101).

Rather than address each of these aspects in Husserl’s phenomenology that are indebted to Kant, a brief discussion of “transcendental analysis”, combined with the above discussion of “psychologism,” should provide a sufficient base with which to grasp the following discussion of phenomenological psychology.

c. Transcendental Analysis and Attitude

How then, is “transcendental analysis” to be understood? In From Kant to Davidson, Andrew Carpenter concisely suggests, “Kant’s transcendental strategy involved investigating the necessary conditions for the possibility of experience” (Carpenter, 2003, p. 219). Carpenter then indicates three requirements. Firstly, “Identifying a phenomenon that one’s interlocutors agree exists.” Secondly, “Investigating the necessary conditions for the possibility of that phenomenon” (Carpenter, 2003, p. 219). Thirdly, “Examining the philosophical implications of the resulting ‘transcendental analysis’ of the possibility of the phenomenon [emphasis added]” (Carpenter, 2003, p. 219). This characterization correctly emphasizes transcendental analysis as a method with which to arrive at not the subjective characters of a phenomenon, but the necessary conditions for a phenomenon. Moreover, this characterization correctly illustrates the nature of the method of phenomenology, as transcendental analysis, by indicating the intermediate position of the method’s results. In other words, phenomenological disclosure of the conditions for the possibility of phenomena allows for a subsequent deeper understanding and discussion of the conditions.

This last insight, namely that the phenomenological method provides access to the necessary, and human species universal, a priori conditions for the possibility of experience, helps to contextualize Max Scheler’s (1874-1928) characterization of the “phenomenological attitude.” According to Scheler, phenomenology “is the name of an attitude of spiritual seeing in which one can see or experience something which otherwise remains hidden” (Scheler, 1973, p. 137). Then, understanding phenomenology as either a movement or method, it may also be understood as an “attitude.” Since a “method is a goal-directed procedure of thinking about facts, for example, induction or deduction” or “a particular procedure of observation and investigation, with or without experiment and with or without instrumental support for our senses, in the form of microscopes, telescopes, etc.” Scheler argues “Phenomenology, however, has a fundamentally different attitude. That which is seen and experienced is given only in the seeing and experiencing act itself … It does not simply stand there and let itself be observed” (Scheler, 1973, pp. 137-138). Hence, “attitude” refers to the relation to a phenomenon which allows it to show itself as itself (compare Heidegger, 1962, p. 51), when to a different attitude it would have shown itself differently. That the phenomenological attitude has the character of a science is ensured by the universality and necessity of what shows itself to observers who have gained such a relation to phenomena.

As the remaining sections explicate more fully, the discussion so far may already allow for a preliminary understanding of how phenomenology may be thought of as a descriptive psychology, and how a descriptive psychology may be understood as a phenomenological psychology. Whether considered as a movement, method, or attitude, phenomenology is understood to involve observation of phenomena yielding results of a specific kind. What is at stake, then, for observational research to be identified as phenomenological psychology, will involve the kind of results the research seeks to yield. Contextualizing phenomenological psychology as such, despite the claims of researchers from diverse movements utilizing diverse methods and with various attitudes to be engaged in some type of “phenomenology,” will help clarify whether such research is truly “phenomenological” psychology.

Consider that according to Aron Gurwitsch (1901-1973), “Husserl once referred to” Dorion Cairns (1901-1973) as “the future of phenomenology” in America, and as professor of philosophy and psychology and “arguably Husserl’s closest continuer” Cairns claimed, “It is an historical fact that Husserl’s investigations of subjectivity always had a philosophical goal. Their primary goal was never psychological. The results of his investigations can nevertheless be interpreted psychologically, as he himself indicated” (Cairns, 2010, pp. 1-2). Further, “A psychological interpretation of Husserl’s results is a simplification. The most abstruse of his methodological theories, the theory of transcendental-phenomenological reduction, is disregarded when his results are interpreted psychologically” (Cairns, 2010, p. 2). Yet, Cairns wavered, this should not stop “the psychologist who wants to discover in Husserl’s writings whatever is relevant to psychology as a natural science” (Cairns, 2010, p. 2).

2. What is Psychology?

a. Natural Science vs. Human Science

It is helpful to give a brief statement regarding the meaning of “psychology,” in order to understand to what “phenomenological psychology” is supposed to refer. Of all the many distinctions by which the science of psychology may be sub-divided, the distinction between psychology as a natural and as a non-natural science retains priority. This distinction may be seen throughout the entire history of philosophy and psychology (compare Brennan, 2002). Namely, the distinction is that between psychology as a natural science and psychology as a human science (compare Van Kaam, 1966).

Generally stated, psychology as a natural science seeks to account for psychological phenomena as natural phenomena, and psychology as a human science seeks to account for psychological phenomena as human, social, and cultural phenomena. Whereas the methods of psychology as a natural science tend toward those found in biology, chemistry or physics, the methods of psychology as a human science tend toward those found in history, sociology, and anthropology. There is currently a good deal of debate regarding whether phenomenology should be considered only a method viable for psychology as a human science or as both a human and natural science. Hence, how phenomenological psychology is to be understood is a matter of some controversy.

It is, therefore, insufficient to simply suggest, along with the Oxford Encyclopedia of Psychology, that “The term phenomenological is often used by psychologists to refer simply to the subjective point of view” (Kazdin, 2000, p. 162). On one hand, phenomenological analysis proper seeks the universal and necessary conditions for the possibility of human experiential phenomena. On the other hand, there is a paradigm for research in psychology as a natural science that seeks to isolate subjective phenomena, for example qualia, for example,, for the sake of discovering a correlation with natural phenomena such as electro-chemical activity of the central nervous system. Despite a departure from phenomenology proper, phenomenological psychology still refers, though ambiguously, to meaningful research projects; however, the specific difference between phenomenological and non-phenomenological projects in psychology is not “simply” “the subjective point of view” (compare Husserl, 1977, pp. 110-115).

b. Naturalistic vs. Personalistic Standpoint

Husserl was aware of the different approaches to psychology as a science, and though subjective phenomena qua subjective, as both Husserl and Cairns above explained, are not properly “phenomenological,” there is a distinction from Husserl’s work which may help further clarify the meaning of phenomenological psychology. In Book II of Husserl’s Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, he characterizes both of these approaches to psychology as depending upon two different types of the specific, and properly, phenomenological-transcendental attitude. In other words, this is his distinction between a “naturalistic attitude” and a “personalistic attitude.” Husserl notes phenomenologists can move “quite effortlessly, from one attitude into another, from the naturalistic into the personalistic, and as to the respective sciences, from the natural sciences into the human sciences” (Husserl, 2000, p. 190). Moreover, the personalistic attitude is “the attitude we are always in when we live with one another, talk to one another, shake hands with one another…” (Husserl, 2000, p. 192).

At this point, a number of different ways to identify generally the relation between psychology and phenomenology are available. Firstly, some part or portion of psychology may be seen as the study of merely subjective phenomena, and such a psychology would, thereby, incorrectly be called “phenomenological” in the proper philosophical sense. Moreover, even if subjective concerns in psychology are not the results of introspection, they pertain exclusively to empirical phenomena and would not be properly “phenomenological.” Secondly, the topics and themes of psychology may be seen as resulting from an attitude between a natural attitude and the properly phenomenological-transcendental attitude. In this way, the study of such topics and themes should lead ultimately to consideration of the transcendental features involved. Thirdly, psychology as a whole may be divided into the different attitudes of the naturalistic and personalistic with research in psychology as a natural science and as a human science resulting from these, respectively, and with both attitudes subordinated to the properly phenomenological attitude (compare Husserl, 1977, p. 166). Notice, in this way all phenomena, as phenomena of human experience, fall within the scope of phenomenology proper; however, it points to a significant confusion on the part of the psychologist when the non-universal, non-necessary aspects of the phenomena are taken as the features to be studied through phenomenological science. Hence, it is as if these three general identifications relate to one another circularly, since failure to accomplish the transcendental-phenomenological viewpoint of the third may place the psychologist, studying merely subjective phenomena, back at the first.

c. Elimination vs. Reduction vs. Supervenience

From the properly phenomenological perspective of the third general identification, then, the following comments by Kant and Husserl are understood more easily.  Kant famously argued in the Preface to his Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science that empirical psychology can never be a proper natural science (Kant, 2004, p. 7). For Kant, the naturalization of psychology suggests a denial of free will in humans, a position his philosophy fundamentally rejects. Similarly Husserl complained, “What is needed is a new ‘psychology’ of an essentially different type, a universal science of the spirit that is neither ‘psychophysical’ nor natural-scientific” (Husserl, 2000, p. 181; compare Husserl, 1970).

Yet, as indicated with the primary division of psychology into natural and human science, psychology tends to take a psychophysical understanding of human being as a point of departure for further research (compare [../hard-con/]). In fact, psychologists may be classified by a taxonomy of relations between the psychological and the physical. There are those who seek an elimination of either  the psychological or the physical in favor of the other, and there are a number of ways to take up such a position. However, the most popular of such ways today is, perhaps, “eliminative materialism” (compare Churchland, 1981). Next, there are those who seek a reduction of either one of the psychological, or the physical, to the other. Though, again, it seems more popular and plausible today to find the reduction of the psychological to the physical advocated. Lastly, there are those who seek to characterize the relation in terms of supervenience. The perhaps most popular articulation suggests that psychological states cannot be eliminated in favor of, or reduced to, physical states; however, there can be no changes to psychological states without there being accompanying changes to physical states (compare Kim, 1984; compare Kim, 1987).

Exemplified by his books Mind in a Physical World (1998) and Physicalism, Or Something Near Enough (2005), Jaegwon Kim arrives at a position which privileges the physical over the psychological, while characterizing the relation between the two as one of “conditional functional reduction.” Now, to say that some mental property is “functionalizable” is to say that its presence as a property of consciousness can be associated with the function it serves regarding the physical environment. Hence, though Kim affirms the irreducibility of the qualitative phenomenal properties (qualia) of consciousness to physical properties, there is a conditional reduction of qualia to the functional role they play regarding the organism’s adaptation to the environment. Insofar as these positions regarding the psychophysical constitution of human beings indicate the context of the elements involved in research identified as within phenomenological psychology, and with the avowed goal of “naturalizing” the phenomenology of qualia, (compare Varela, 1992) how might Husserl see such research projects?

To sketch a brief response to this question, beyond the gestures already made above (for example, the third general identification of phenomenological psychology), consider the following comments from a section titled “The delimitation of somatology and psychology” in Book III of Ideas. According to Husserl,

What one has here, from the point of view of natural science, is a number of individual human beings each with a particular consciousness, a particular psyche … belonging to each. In the psycho-physical interrelated context that is made possible by the material interrelations of the animate organisms, there arise in the individual psyches acts that are intentionally directed at something psychically external. But what appears here is always only new states of the individual psyches (Husserl, 1980, p. 18).

Later in the same book, Husserl clarifies,

As we know, there come continually into consideration in the phenomenological exploration of the acts both consciousness itself and the correlate of consciousness, noesis and noema. To describe and determine according to essence the phenomenon of intuition of a physical thing … is at the same time also to keep in mind that the act in itself is the “meaning” of something and that what is meant as such is “physical thing.” But to substantiate this, indeed, to make what is meant as physical thing as such, namely as correlate (something perceived as such with regard to the perception, something named as such with regard to the naming), the object of research … that is not to explore physical things, physical things as such. A “physical thing” as correlate is not a physical thing; therefore the quotation marks (Husserl, 1980, p. 72).

Simply put, “one must not confuse noema (correlate) and essence” (Husserl, 1980, p. 73). Wherever we go, we bring the necessary and universal conditions for the possibility of experience to our experiences. Both the naturalization project and the merely subjective point of view project are misidentified with phenomenological psychology, considering phenomenology proper; moreover, both of these projects may fail at avoiding psychologism (compare Husserl, 2001b, p. 86, quoted above; compare Husserl, 1977, p. 38).

3. Which Husserl? Whose Phenomenology?

a. Husserl’s Five Different Introductions to Phenomenology

As David Carr discusses in his “Translator’s Introduction” to Husserl’s The Crisis of the European Science and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy, Husserl produced a number of different “introductions” to phenomenology. However, as the above discussion of the progressive movement to transcendental phenomenology shows, there is a continuity to be discerned across the introductions (compare McKenna, 1982). Yet, at the same time, Husserl’s continued attempt to “introduce” phenomenology is widely seen as contributing to the controversy regarding the meaning of the term “phenomenology” itself (compare Spiegelberg, 1965). As Rockmore put it, “Husserl’s unconvincing claim to have invented phenomenology, which he struggles to define in a long series of texts, leaves both the meaning of the term, the genesis of the approach, and its import unresolved” (Rockmore, 2011, p. 191). According to Carr, Husserl attempts an introduction to phenomenology in all of the following books: Logical Investigations (1900); Ideas (1913); Formal and Transcendental Logic (1929); Cartesian Meditations (1931); The Crisis of the European Sciences (1937).

Further, as William McKenna mentions in his Husserl’s “Introductions to Phenomenology” and Iso Kern explicates in his article, “The Three Ways to the Transcendental Phenomenological Reduction,” these five books point to three ways to the much-discussed phenomenological reduction . Iso Kern, following and clarifying Hans-Georg Gadamer, indicates a “Cartesian way,” a way through “intentional psychology,” and a way through “ontology” into the “transcendental phenomenological reduction” (Kern, 1977, p. 126). Kern suggests these three ways are “not always sharply and clearly separated” in Husserl’s work. These ways may be seen as responses to questions such as “Through which steps in thinking does philosophic cognition arise?” and “How does knowing emerge from the aphilosophical life and become genuinely philosophical?” (Kern, 1977, p. 126).

b. Husserl’s Three Different Ways to Phenomenological Reduction

Since each of the ways explained by Kern are ways into the transcendental phenomenological attitude, only their differences will be briefly characterized here. The characterization of their differences is helpful toward clarifying what is meant by phenomenological psychology. This is because across the differing introductions, it is not difficult to lose sight of the many different unifying themes with which to coherently understand the relation between phenomenology and psychology. The key is to see that the introductions, rather than being set against one another, should be unified around Husserl’s attempts to instruct readers into the transcendental phenomenological attitude.

The Cartesian way seeks an absolute starting point from which philosophy may be understood as a science. This starting point demands absolute evidence, and this means simply clear and distinct evidence that cannot be doubted. Belief in the mind-external world is then to be doubted, since there is supposed to be no absolute evidence for belief in the mind-external world. Yet, knowledge about the world is based on belief in the world’s existence, and experience of what was previously believed to be the world does not cease when belief in the world is doubted. Hence, this relation to the experience of the “world,” is a reduced relation. The final step in the Cartesian way is to understand the intentional relation to the “world” as that of the “cogito,” that is the intentionality of the acting ego, such that the cogito provides absolute evidence for itself as the starting point for philosophy understood as a science. Notice, phenomenology involves understanding how the intentional structure of the subject provides objective knowledge of the mind-external world, and as such phenomenology’s interest in the intentional structure of the subject is not “subjective.”

The way through “intentional psychology,” then, according to Kern, takes the “physical sciences, which are interested purely in the physical and abstracts, from everything psychic. In opposition to these sciences, Husserl conceives the idea of a complementary science which is interested purely in the psychic and abstracts from everything physical” (compare Kern, 1977, p. 134). By pointing out that relations between objects in the lived experience of humans are not relations between those objects in mind-external reality, Husserl points the way to “lived experience.” This may be compared to the focus on the intentional relation to the “world” in the Cartesian way. Moreover, the lived experience pertains to the subject, but it is not “subjective.” Kern provides the following two quotes from Husserl’s The Crisis of the European Sciences as convincing evidence of Husserl’s view: “Psychology, the universal science of the purely psychic in general – therein consists its abstraction” (Husserl, 1978, p. 252) and “in the pure development of the idea of a descriptive psychology, which seeks to bring to expression what is essentially proper to souls, there necessarily occurs a transformation of the phenomenological-psychological epoché and reduction into the transcendental” (Husserl, 1978, p. 257).

Lastly, the “ontological” way may be seen as a direct attack on the psychologist who might mistakenly think phenomenology to refer “simply to the subjective point of view” (compare Kazdin, 2000, p. 162). According to Kern, “Rather, the objective ‘theme’ is implied intentionally in the subjective ‘theme’ (in the intentional life of subjectivity)” (compare Kern, 1977, p. 137). Further, “The change of attitude is to be compared with the transition from the second to the third dimension of space, which contains in itself the second dimension. This subjectivity [emphasis added], in which everything objective is constituted, is the transcendental one” (Kern, 1977, p. 137). Hence, the psychologist who takes phenomenological psychology to be an investigation of “the subjective point of view” understood as a “perspective through which the individual experiences his or her world [emphasis added]” (compare Kazdin, 2000, p. 164) is not actually engaged in phenomenological psychology. Further, the popular tendency to emphasize a subject’s “perspective” as transcending both other subjects and the potential truth value of criticism from other subjects stems from a misunderstanding of phenomenological psychology. As Kern explains, “This subjectivity … is exhibited as an intersubjectivity, made communal through the common objectivity,” and this science is an “exploration of the universal transcendental life, in which worldly objectivity [emphasis added], with its ontological a priori, is constituted” (Kern, 1977, p. 137).

Though an exhaustive list of phenomenologists is outside the scope of this article, what follows is a brief list of major figures in phenomenology. The purpose of this list is to suggest that, despite the heterogeneity of approaches across the figures peopling the list, as far as these individuals were engaged in phenomenology, they participated in a method grounded in the transcendental attitude. These figures include: Edmund Husserl; Martin Heidegger; Jean-Paul Sartre; Maurice Merleau-Ponty; Max Scheler; Edith Stein; Adolf Reinach; Moritz Geiger; Roman Ingarden; Dietrich von Hildebrand; Aron Gurwitsch; and Gabriel Marcel, among many others.

4. Phenomenological Psychology as a Science

a. Phenomenology vs. Phenomenography

As should be clear, phenomenological psychology, as a science, concerns itself with what is necessary and universal in human experience. This is opposed to the approach to human experience that seeks to record subjective experience as subjective. Such an approach, rather than be called “phenomenological,” is better referred to as “phenomenographical” (compare Marton, 1981). Whereas “phenomenology” refers to the study of what is objective in subjective experience, including the structures of subjectivity itself, “phenomenography” refers to the study of what is subjective in subjective experience.

With this distinction in mind, there are a number of research methods classified as within phenomenological psychology to consider. In Phenomenological Psychology: Theory, Research, and Method, Darren Langbridge explains, “when applying phenomenological philosophy to psychology, we aim to focus on people’s perceptions of the world in which they live and what this means to them: a focus on people’s lived experience” (Langbridge, 2007, p. 4). Langbridge links “developments” of phenomenology in philosophy with their corresponding research methods in psychology. For example, he claims “phenomenology” refers to a “descriptive approach,” “existentialism” refers to an “interpretive approach,” and “hermeneutics,” refers to a “narrative approach” (Langbridge, 2007, p. 5). Though not listed by Langbridge, the perhaps most promising of the approaches to phenomenological psychology may be seen in Aron Gurwitsch’s work in the phenomenology of Gestalt psychology (compare Gurwitsch, 1966).

b. Descriptive Phenomenology

Descriptive phenomenology, as seen for example in Amedeo Giorgi’s The Descriptive Phenomenological Method in Psychology, results from not a “transcendental” attitude but one “more appropriate for psychological analyses of human beings since the purpose of psychology as a human science is precisely the clarification of the meanings of phenomena experienced by human persons” (Giorgi, 2009, p. 98). Associating phenomenological psychology with psychology as a human science, Giorgi suggests that in “psychology as a human science … The priority of an already existing methodology is not posited. Rather, what is posited as the privileged position is fidelity to the phenomenon” (Giorgi, 1971, p. 52). Hence, in the “descriptive phenomenological method in psychology” Giorgi explains, “The situations to be described are selected by the participants themselves and what is sought is simply a description that is as faithful as possible” (Giorgi, 2009, p. 96; compare Gilbert and Fisher, 2006; compare MacLeod, 2002; compare Loftus, 1979). Further, Giorgi acknowledges “The fact that the descriptions come from others could be challenged from a phenomenological perspective … but the descriptions provided by the experiencers are an opening into the world of the other [emphasis added] that is shareable” (Giorgi, 2009, p. 96).

c. Interpretive-Hermeneutic Phenomenology

Without discussing the other “developments” of phenomenological psychology here, the following two examples should suffice to contextualize how these developments relate to the descriptive approach. On the one hand, regarding an “Interpretative Phenomenological Analysis,” it is claimed,“One is trying to get close to the participant’s personal world” (Smith and Osborn, 2003, p. 51). On the other hand, it is suggested that the “research results” of such interpretive activities open “upon a limitless field of possible interpretations” (compare Kazdin, 2000, p. 164). Though it is not immediately clear how the results of any research could be subject to “limitless” interpretations, supposing such a characterization were true, it is also not clear what the purpose of research in psychology that is open to “limitless” interpretation might be. Hence, the controversy and challenges remain for phenomenological psychology. That is to say, the psychological sciences that self-identify as phenomenological may be interrogated regarding whether they avoid psychologism and whether they might be better classified as phenomenographic.

5. Phenomenological Psychology as the Analytic of Ontic Dasein

a. Heidegger and Science

As exemplified by work found in the Zollikon Seminars, Martin Heidegger has provided a number of valuable insights into how phenomenology may relate to psychology. This is despite the commonly held misconceptions regarding Heidegger’s relation to science. For a clear and concise discussion regarding Heidegger’s relation to science, see Joseph Kockelmans chapter titled “Heidegger on the Essential Difference and Necessary Relationship Between Philosophy and Science” (Kockelmans, 1970, pp. 147-167). According to Kockelmans, Heidegger does indeed see an “unbridgeable gap between philosophy and science.” Yet, “Although scientists generally interpret this view of Heidegger’s as a disparaging one, this is in no way his intention” (Kockelmans, 1970, p. 148).

In the November 23rd 1965 seminar of the Zollikon Seminars Heidegger explicitly states his position regarding “science.” Heidegger declares, “I have reservations about science – not science as science – but only about the absolute claims of natural science” (Heidegger, 2001, p. 123; compare Heidegger, 1972, p. 77; compare Caputo, 1973; compare Krell, 2008, p. 12). From this discussion, Heidegger provides his understanding of the distinction between psychology and philosophy, and this distinction applies to phenomenology in essentially the same way it was reflected on above in Husserl. That is to say, Heidegger suggests phenomenological psychology is intermediate to phenomenological transcendental philosophy. In Heidegger’s vocabulary, this means that phenomenological psychology is “ontic” and phenomenological transcendental philosophy is “ontological.”

b. Heidegger and Psychology

What this means for Heidegger is that when phenomenology is used as a method to understand being, then phenomenology is used philosophically, and when phenomenology is used as a method to understand being as human being, then it is used psychologically or anthropologically. Put another way, “ontic” refers to the facts related to human being-in-the-world, and “ontological” refers to the conditions for the possibility of being-in-the-world. Since being is a condition for the possibility of being-in-the-world, an analysis of being will yield ontological insights. Heidegger clarifies, despite the similarity of the language, “Daseinanalysis is ontic. The analytic of Dasein is ontological” (Heidegger, 2001, p. 124). Further, “in Being and Time there was often talk about ‘Daseinanalysis.’ In this context, Daseinanalysis does not mean anything more than the actual exhibition of the determination of Da-sein as thematized in the analytic of Da-sein” (Heidegger, 2001, p. 125). Similar to the discussion of the possibility of phenomenological psychology regarding Husserl above, this is an important distinction for phenomenological psychology in Heidegger, since “Insofar as the latter is defined as existence, these determinations of Da-sein are called existentialia (compare Keen, 1975).  Therefore, the concept of ‘Daseinanalysis’ [in contrast to psychological ‘Dasein-analysis’] still belongs to the analytic of Dasein and, therefore, to ontology” (Heidegger, 2001, p. 125).

To be clear, beings may be described in terms of cultural and historical facts. However, such descriptions fall short of understanding being as the condition for the possibility of beings. Frederick Wilhelmsen (1923-1996) famously described this difference in terms of beings as nouns and be-ing as a participle. Heidegger’s point here, then: it is not so much the case that ontic concerns are psychologistic (though they may be) as it is the case that they fall short of authentic ontological insights. What this means for phenomenological psychology is that insofar as it merely views the ontic fact domain of (human) being, then, according to Heidegger (like Kant and Husserl before him), it falls short of the transcendental attitude. However, just as descriptive psychology was seen above as intermediate on the way to the transcendental attitude, it is possible to interrogate the facts of human being through transcendental analysis, and such an interrogation leads to the “conditions for the possibility” of such facts. The analysis of these conditions, then, is the “analytic of Da-sein.” Hence, phenomenological psychology is not an exclusive enterprise insofar as the phenomenologically trained psychologist can, through such an analytic, rise to transcendental phenomenology and study ontology; though in doing so, they are no longer studying psychology. That is to say, on the one hand, psychology is clearly delimited from ontology. On the other hand, psychology is grounded in ontology. There can be no human being, if there is no be-ing. So, what is the value of phenomenology for psychology?

c. The Therapeutic Value of Minding the Clearing

The term “existential” should invoke the notion of freedom. As disclosing the existentials (existentialia), then, phenomenology may be used as a method toward an awareness, which is psychologically therapeutic, in its affirmation of human freedom. Just as existentialism and freedom belong together, so too awareness of the conditions making human experiences possible, when considered from the first-person perspective regarding lived experience, may be therapeutic. In essence this is the training of a client seeking psychotherapy to perform a phenomenological reduction to accomplish a transcendental attitude to their own lived experience. This is Da-sein analysis. This may be accomplished through analysis of the existentials conditioning the person-seeking-therapy’s being. Ultimately this is ontology, through psychology, not psychology; however, it is still related to psychology as being psychotherapeutic. By bringing each (human) being to an awareness of the clearing of being in which their being human in accomplished, they may “take hold of” their being differently (compare Heidegger, 1962), and this is an affirmation of the person’s freedom, which may be therapeutic given the everyday possibilities through which humans may forget the be-ing which allows beings to be.

6. Conclusion

The above discussion of phenomenology from the perspectives of a movement, a method and an attitude, clarified by examining shifts found in Husserl’s work, provided support to the value of understanding phenomenology as related to transcendental philosophy. Further, such an understanding of phenomenology elucidates the consistent thread running through the heterogeneous styles of the major figures standardly considered phenomenologists. In order to clarify further the meaning of phenomenological psychology as a science, phenomenology was contrasted with phenomenography. Phenomenography refers to the study of the merely subjective aspects of experience. Toward clarifying possible confusion regarding the potential use of phenomenology for psychology, the claim was made that much of was is called “phenomenology” today is actually phenomenography. This is an important insight involving an important distinction, and perhaps with further dissemination the controversy surrounding phenomenology will be resolved.

Lastly, Heidegger’s style of phenomenology and its relation to psychology was discussed. This included clarification, through Heidegger’s own words, of his position regarding science. Heidegger’s Da-sein analysis continues to have influence around the globe as a viable psychotherapeutic method. Interestingly, Heidegger’s Da-sein analysis, though expressed near the end of his career, has deep ties with and resonates with his Being and Time. Yet, this also extends Heidegger’s value and influence beyond even academic philosophy and psychology, since Heidegger’s philosophy, as a kind of therapy does not, necessarily, require a therapist. That is to say, Heidegger’s teaching regard the first-person perspective in such a way that it becomes possible for readers in understanding his vocabulary to begin to “see” being as he described it. The therapeutic value involved then, points further to the efficacious presence of philosophy in psychology and phenomenological psychology.

7. References and Suggested Further Reading

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  • Giorgi, Amedeo. (2009). The Descriptive Phenomenological Method in Psychology: A Modified Husserlian Approach. Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press.
  • Giorgi, Amedeo. (1971). “The Experience of the Subject as a Source of Data in Psychological Experiment,” in Phenomenological Psychology, Vol. I. A. Giorgi, W.F. Fischer, R. von Eckartsberg, (Eds). (pp.50-57). Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press.
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Author Information

Frank Scalambrino
University of Dallas
U. S. A.