The Renaissance, that is, the period that extends roughly from the middle of the fourteenth century to the beginning of the seventeen century, was a time of intense, all-encompassing, and, in many ways, distinctive philosophical activity. A fundamental assumption of the Renaissance movement was that the remains of classical antiquity constituted an invaluable source of excellence to which debased and decadent modern times could turn in order to repair the damage brought about since the fall of the Roman Empire. It was often assumed that God had given a single unified truth to humanity and that the works of ancient philosophers had preserved part of this original deposit of divine wisdom. This idea not only laid the foundation for a scholarly culture that was centered on ancient texts and their interpretation, but also fostered an approach to textual interpretation that strove to harmonize and reconcile divergent philosophical accounts. Stimulated by newly available texts, one of the most important hallmarks of Renaissance philosophy is the increased interest in primary sources of Greek and Roman thought, which were previously unknown or little read. The renewed study of Neoplatonism, Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism eroded faith in the universal truth of Aristotelian philosophy and widened the philosophical horizon, providing a rich seedbed from which modern science and modern philosophy gradually emerged.
Table of Contents
- Hellenistic Philosophies
- New Philosophies of Nature
- References and Further Reading
Improved access to a great deal of previously unknown literature from ancient Greece and Rome was an important aspect of Renaissance philosophy. The renewed study of Aristotle, however, was not so much because of the rediscovery of unknown texts, but because of a renewed interest in texts long translated into Latin but little studied, such as the Poetics, and especially because of novel approaches to well-known texts. From the early fifteenth century onwards, humanists devoted considerable time and energy to making Aristotelian texts clearer and more precise. In order to rediscover the meaning of Aristotle’s thought, they updated the Scholastic translations of his works, read them in the original Greek, and analyzed them with philological techniques. The availability of these new interpretative tools had a great impact on the philosophical debate. Moreover, in the four decades after 1490, the Aristotelian interpretations of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius, Ammonius, Philoponus, Simplicius, and other Greek commentators were added to the views of Arabic and medieval commentators, stimulating new solutions to Aristotelian problems and leading to a wide variety of interpretations of Aristotle in the Renaissance period.
The most powerful tradition, at least in Italy, was that which took Averroes’s works as the best key for determining the true mind of Aristotle. Averroes’s name was primarily associated with the doctrine of the unity of the intellect. Among the defenders of his theory that there is only one intellect for all human beings, we find Paul of Venice (d. 1429), who is regarded as the founding figure of Renaissance Averroism, and Alessandro Achillini (1463–1512), as well as the Jewish philosopher Elijah del Medigo (1458–1493). Two other Renaissance Aristotelians who expended much of their philosophical energies on explicating the texts of Averroes are Nicoletto Vernia (d. 1499) and Agostino Nifo (c. 1469–1538). They are noteworthy characters in the Renaissance controversy about the immortality of the soul mainly because of the remarkable shift that can be discerned in their thought. Initially they were defenders of Averroes’s theory of the unity of the intellect, but from loyal followers of Averroes as a guide to Aristotle, they became careful students of the Greek commentators, and in their late thought both Vernia and Nifo attacked Averroes as a misleading interpreter of Aristotle, believing that personal immortality could be philosophically demonstrated.
Many Renaissance Aristotelians read Aristotle for scientific or secular reasons, with no direct interest in religious or theological questions. Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525), one of the most important and influential Aristotelian philosophers of the Renaissance, developed his views entirely within the framework of natural philosophy. In De immortalitate animae (Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul, 1516), arguing from the Aristotelian text, Pomponazzi maintained that proof of the intellect’s ability to survive the death of the body must be found in an activity of the intellect that functions without any dependence on the body. In his view, no such activity can be found because the highest activity of the intellect, the attainment of universals in cognition, is always mediated by sense impression. Therefore, based solely on philosophical premises and Aristotelian principles, the conclusion is that the entire soul dies with the body. Pomponazzi’s treatise aroused violent opposition and led to a spate of books being written against him. In 1520, he completed De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus (On the Causes of Natural Effects or On Incantations), whose main target was the popular belief that miracles are produced by angels and demons. He excluded supernatural explanations from the domain of nature by establishing that it is possible to explain those extraordinary events commonly regarded as miracles in terms of a concatenation of natural causes. Another substantial work is De fato, de libero arbitrio et de praedestinatione (Five Books on Fate, Free Will and Predestination), which is regarded as one of the most important works on the problems of freedom and determinism in the Renaissance. Pomponazzi considers whether the human will can be free, and he considers the conflicting points of view of philosophical determinism and Christian theology.
Another philosopher who tried to keep Aristotle’s authority independent of theology and subject to rational criticism, is Jacopo Zabarella (1533–1589), who produced an extensive body of work on the nature of logic and scientific method. His goal was the retrieval of the genuine Aristotelian concepts of science and scientific method, which he understood as the indisputable demonstration of the nature and constitutive principles of natural beings. He developed the method of regressus, a combination of the deductive procedures of composition and the inductive procedures of resolution that came to be regarded as the proper method for obtaining knowledge in the theoretical sciences. Among his main works are the collected logical works Opera logica (1578), which are mainly devoted to the theory of demonstration, and his major work on natural philosophy, De rebus naturalibus (1590). Zabarella’s work was instrumental in a renewal of natural philosophy, methodology, and theory of knowledge.
There were also forms of Aristotelian philosophy with strong confessional ties, such as the branch of Scholasticism that developed on the Iberian Peninsula during the sixteenth century. This current of Hispanic Scholastic philosophy began with the Dominican School founded in Salamanca by Francisco de Vitoria (1492–1546) and continued with the philosophy of the newly founded Society of Jesus, among whose defining authorities were Pedro da Fonseca (1528–1599), Francisco de Toledo (1533–1596), and Francisco Suárez (1548–1617). Their most important writings were in the areas of metaphysics and philosophy of law. They played a key role in the elaboration of the law of nations (jus gentium) and the theory of just war, a debate that began with Vitoria’s Relectio de iure belli (A Re-lecture of the Right of War, 1539) and continued with the writings of Domingo de Soto (1494–1560), Suárez, and many others. In the field of metaphysics, the most important work is Suárez’ Disputationes metaphysicae (Metaphysical Disputations, 1597), a systematic presentation of philosophy—against the background of Christian principles—that set the standard for philosophical and theological teaching for almost two centuries.
The humanist movement did not eliminate older approaches to philosophy, but contributed to change them in important ways, providing new information and new methods to the field. Humanists called for a radical change of philosophy and uncovered older texts that multiplied and hardened current philosophical discord. Some of the most salient features of humanist reform are the accurate study of texts in the original languages, the preference for ancient authors and commentators over medieval ones, and the avoidance of technical language in the interest of moral suasion and accessibility. Humanists stressed moral philosophy as the branch of philosophical studies that best met their needs. They addressed a general audience in an accessible manner and aimed to bring about an increase in public and private virtue. Regarding philosophy as a discipline allied to history, rhetoric, and philology, they expressed little interest in metaphysical or epistemological questions. Logic was subordinated to rhetoric and reshaped to serve the purposes of persuasion.
One of the seminal figures of the humanist movement was Francesco Petrarca (1304–1374). In De sui ipsius et multorum aliorum ignorantia (On His Own Ignorance and That of Many Others), he elaborated what was to become the standard critique of Scholastic philosophy. One of his main objections to Scholastic Aristotelianism is that it is useless and ineffective in achieving the good life. Moreover, to cling to a single authority when all authorities are unreliable is simply foolish. He especially attacked, as opponents of Christianity, Aristotle’s commentator Averroes and contemporary Aristotelians that agreed with him. Petrarca returned to a conception of philosophy rooted in the classical tradition, and from his time onward, when professional humanists took interest in philosophy, they nearly always concerned themselves with ethical questions. Among those he influenced were Coluccio Salutati (1331–1406), Leonardo Bruni (c.1370–1444) and Poggio Bracciolini (1380–1459), all of whom promoted humanistic learning in distinctive ways.
One of the most original and important humanists of the Quattrocento was Lorenzo Valla (1406–1457). His most influential writing was Elegantiae linguae Latinae (Elegances of the Latin Language), a handbook of Latin language and style. He is also famous for having demonstrated, on the basis of linguistic and historical evidence, that the so-called Donation of Constantine, on which the secular rule of the papacy was based, was an early medieval forgery. His main philosophical work is Repastinatio dialecticae et philosophiae (Reploughing of Dialectic and Philosophy), an attack on major tenets of Aristotelian philosophy. The first book deals with the criticism of fundamental notions of metaphysics, ethics, and natural philosophy, while the remaining two books are devoted to dialectics.
Throughout the fifteenth and early sixteenth century, humanists were unanimous in their condemnation of university education and their contempt for Scholastic logic. Humanists such as Valla and Rudolph Agricola (1443–1485), whose main work is De inventione dialectica (On Dialectical Invention, 1479), set about to replace the Scholastic curriculum, based on syllogism and disputation, with a treatment of logic oriented toward the use of persuasion and topics, a technique of verbal association aiming at the invention and organization of material for arguments. According to Valla and Agricola, language is primarily a vehicle for communication and debate, and consequently arguments should be evaluated in terms of how effective and useful they are rather than in terms of formal validity. Accordingly, they subsumed the study of the Aristotelian theory of inference under a broader range of forms of argumentation. This approach was taken up and developed in various directions by later humanists, such as Mario Nizolio (1488–1567), Juan Luis Vives (1493–1540), and Petrus Ramus (1515–1572).
Vives was a Spanish-born humanist who spent the greater part of his life in the Low Countries. He aspired to replace the Scholastic tradition in all fields of learning with a humanist curriculum inspired by education in the classics. In 1519, he published In Pseudodialecticos (Against the Pseudodialecticians), a satirical diatribe against Scholastic logic in which he voices his opposition on several counts. A detailed criticism can be found in De disciplinis (On the Disciplines, 1531), an encyclopedic work divided into three parts: De causis corruptarum artium (On the Causes of the Corruption of the Arts), a collection of seven books devoted to a thorough critique of the foundations of contemporary education; De tradendis disciplinis (On Handing Down the Disciplines), five books where Vives’s educational reform is outlined; and De artibus (On the Arts), five shorter treatises that deal mainly with logic and metaphysics. Another area in which Vives enjoyed considerable success was psychology. His reflections on the human soul are mainly concentrated in De anima et vita (On the Soul and Life, 1538), a study of the soul and its interaction with the body, which also contains a penetrating analysis of the emotions.
Ramus was another humanist who criticized the shortcomings of contemporary teaching and advocated a humanist reform of the arts curriculum. His textbooks were the best sellers of their day and were very influential in Protestant universities in the later sixteenth century. In 1543, he published Dialecticae partitiones (The Structure of Dialectic), which in its second edition was called Dialecticae institutiones (Training in Dialectic), and Aristotelicae animadversions (Remarks on Aristotle). These works gained him a reputation as a virulent opponent of Aristotelian philosophy. He considered his own dialectics, consisting of invention and judgment, to be applicable to all areas of knowledge, and he emphasised the need for learning to be comprehensible and useful, with a particular stress on the practical aspects of mathematics. His own reformed system of logic reached its definitive form with the publication of the third edition of Dialectique (1555).
Humanism also supported Christian reform. The most important Christian humanist was the Dutch scholar Desiderius Erasmus (c.1466–1536). He was hostile to Scholasticism, which he did not consider a proper basis for Christian life, and put his erudition at the service of religion by promoting learned piety (docta pietas). In 1503, he published Enchiridion militis christiani (Handbook of the Christian Soldier), a guide to the Christian life addressed to laymen in need of spiritual guidance, in which he developed the concept of a philosophia Christi. His most famous work is Moriae encomium (The Praise of Folly), a satirical monologue first published in 1511 that touches upon a variety of social, political, intellectual, and religious issues. In 1524, he published De libero arbitrio (On Free Will), an open attack a one central doctrine of Martin Luther’s theology: that the human will is enslaved by sin. Erasmus’s analysis hinges on the interpretation of relevant biblical and patristic passages and reaches the conclusion that the human will is extremely weak, but able, with the help of divine grace, to choose the path of salvation.
Humanism also had an impact of overwhelming importance on the development of political thought. With Institutio principis christiani (The Education of a Christian Prince, 1516), Erasmus contributed to the popular genre of humanist advice books for princes. These manuals dealt with the proper ends of government and how best to attain them. Among humanists of the fourteenth century, the most usual proposal was that a strong monarchy should be the best form of government. Petrarca, in his account of princely government that was written in 1373 and took the form of a letter to Francesco da Carrara, argued that cities ought to be governed by princes who accept their office reluctantly and who pursue glory through virtuous actions. His views were repeated in quite a few of the numerous “mirror for princes” (speculum principis) composed during the course of the fifteenth century, such as Giovanni Pontano’s De principe (On the Prince, 1468) and Bartolomeo Sacchi’s De principe (On the Prince, 1471).
Several authors exploited the tensions within the genre of “mirror for princes” in order to defend popular regimes. In Laudatio florentinae urbis (Panegyric of the City of Florence), Bruni maintained that justice can only be assured by a republican constitution. In his view, cities must be governed according to justice if they are to become glorious, and justice is impossible without liberty.
The most important text to challenge the assumptions of princely humanism, however, was Il principe (The Prince), written by the Florentine Niccolò Machiavelli (1469–1527) in 1513, but not published until 1532. A fundamental belief among the humanists was that a ruler needs to cultivate a number of qualities, such as justice and other moral values, in order to acquire honour, glory, and fame. Machiavelli deviated from this view claiming that justice has no decisive place in politics. It is the ruler’s prerogative to decide when to dispense violence and practice deception, no matter how wicked or immoral, as long as the peace of the city is maintained and his share of glory maximized. Machiavelli did not hold that princely regimes were superior to all others. In his less famous, but equally influential, Discorsi sopra la prima deca di Tito Livio (Discourses on the First Ten Books of Titus Livy, 1531), he offers a defense of popular liberty and republican government that takes the ancient republic of Rome as its model.
During the Renaissance, it gradually became possible to take a broader view of philosophy than the traditional Peripatetic framework permitted. No ancient revival had more impact on the history of philosophy than the recovery of Platonism. The rich doctrinal content and formal elegance of Platonism made it a plausible competitor of the Peripatetic tradition. Renaissance Platonism was a product of humanism and marked a sharper break with medieval philosophy. Many Christians found Platonic philosophy safer and more attractive than Aristotelianism. The Neoplatonic conception of philosophy as a way toward union with God supplied many Renaissance Platonists with some of their richest inspiration. The Platonic dialogues were not seen as profane texts to be understood literally, but as sacred mysteries to be deciphered.
Platonism was brought to Italy by the Byzantine scholar George Gemistos Plethon (c.1360–1454), who, during the Council of Florence in 1439, gave a series of lectures that he later reshaped as De differentiis Aristotelis et Platonis (The Differences between Aristotle and Plato). This work, which compared the doctrines of the two philosophers (to Aristotle’s great disadvantage), initiated a controversy regarding the relative superiority of Plato and Aristotle. In the treatise In calumniatorem Platonis (Against the Calumniator of Plato), Cardinal Bessarion (1403–1472) defended Plethon against the charge levelled against his philosophy by the Aristotelian George of Trebizond (1396–1472), who in Comparatio philosophorum Aristotelis et Platonis (A Comparison of the Philosophers Aristotle and Plato) had maintained that Platonism was unchristian and actually a new religion.
The most important Renaissance Platonist was Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499), who translated Plato’s works into Latin and wrote commentaries on several of them. He also translated and commented on Plotinus’s Enneads and translated treatises and commentaries by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Synesius, and other Neoplatonists. He considered Plato as part of a long tradition of ancient theology (prisca theologia) that was inaugurated by Hermes and Zoroaster, culminated with Plato, and continued with Plotinus and the other Neoplatonists. Like the ancient Neoplatonists, Ficino assimilated Aristotelian physics and metaphysics and adapted them to Platonic purposes. In his main philosophical treatise, Theologia Platonica de immortalitate animorum (Platonic Theology on the Immortality of Souls, 1482), he put forward his synthesis of Platonism and Christianity as a new theology and metaphysics, which, unlike that of many Scholastics, was explicitly opposed to Averroist secularism. Another work that became very popular was De vita libri tres (Three Books on Life, 1489) by Ficino; it deals with the health of professional scholars and presents a philosophical theory of natural magic.
One of Ficino’s most distinguished associates was Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494). He is best known as the author of the celebrated Oratio de hominis dignitate (Oration on the Dignity of Man), which is often regarded as the manifesto of the new Renaissance thinking, but he also wrote several other prominent works. They include Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem (Disputations against Divinatory Astrology), an influential diatribe against astrology; De ente et uno (On Being and the One), a short treatise attempting to reconcile Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysical views; as well as Heptaplus (Seven Days of Creation), a mystical interpretation of the Genesis creation myth. He was not a devout Neoplatonist like Ficino, but rather an Aristotelian by training and in many ways an eclectic by conviction. He wanted to combine Greek, Hebrew, Muslim, and Christian thought into a great synthesis, which he spelled out in nine hundred theses published as Conclusiones in 1486. He planned to defend them publicly in Rome, but three were found heretical and ten others suspect. He defended them in Apologia, which provoked the condemnation of the whole work by Pope Innocent VIII. Pico’s consistent aim in his writings was to exalt the powers of human nature. To this end he defended the use of magic, which he described as the noblest part of natural science, and Kabbalah, a Jewish form of mysticism that was probably of Neoplatonic origin.
Platonic themes were also central to the thought of Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464), who linked his philosophical activity to the Neoplatonic tradition and authors such as Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius. The main problem that runs through his works is how humans, as finite created beings, can think about the infinite and transcendent God. His best-known work is De docta ignorantia (On Learned Ignorance, 1440), which gives expression to his view that the human mind needs to realize its own necessary ignorance of what God is like, an ignorance that results from the ontological and cognitive disproportion between God and the finite human knower. Correlated to the doctrine of learned ignorance is that of the coincidence of opposites in God. All things coincide in God in the sense that God, as undifferentiated being, is beyond all opposition. Two other works that are closely connected to De docta ignorantia are De coniecturis (On Conjectures), in which he denies the possibility of exact knowledge, maintaining that all human knowledge is conjectural, and Apologia docta ignorantiae (A Defense of Learned Ignorance, 1449). In the latter, he makes clear that the doctrine of learned ignorance is not intended to deny knowledge of the existence of God, but only to deny all knowledge of God’s nature.
One of the most serious obstacles to the reception and adoption of Platonism in the early fifteenth century was the theory of Platonic love. Many scholars were simply unable to accept Plato’s explicit treatment of homosexuality. Yet by the middle of the sixteenth century this doctrine had become one of the most popular elements of Platonic philosophy. The transformation of Platonic love from an immoral and offensive liability into a valuable asset represents an important episode in the history of Plato’s re-emergence during the Renaissance as a major influence on Western thought.
Bessarion and Ficino did not deny that Platonic love was essentially homosexual in outlook, but they insisted that it was entirely honourable and chaste. To reinforce this point, they associated Platonic discussions of love with those found in the Bible. Another way in which Ficino made Platonic love more palatable to his contemporaries was to emphasise its place within an elaborate system of Neoplatonic metaphysics. But Ficino’s efforts to accommodate the theory to the values of a fifteenth-century audience did not include concealing or denying that Platonic love was homoerotic. Ficino completely accepted the idea that Platonic love involved a chaste relationship between men and endorsed the belief that the soul’s spiritual ascent to ultimate beauty was fuelled by love between men.
In Gli Asolani (1505), the humanist Pietro Bembo (1470–1547) appropriated the language of Platonic love to describe some aspects of the romance between a man and a woman. In this work, love was presented as unequivocally heterosexual. Most of the ideas set out by Ficino are echoed by Bembo. However, Ficino had separated physical love, which had women as its object, from spiritual love, which was shared between men. Bembo’s version of Platonic love, on the other hand, dealt with the relationship between a man and a woman which gradually progresses from a sexual to a spiritual level. The view of Platonic love formulated by Bembo reached its largest audience with the humanist Baldesar Castiglione’s (1478–1529) Il libro del cortegiano (The Courtier, 1528). Castiglione carried on the trend, initiated by Bessarion, of giving Platonic love a strongly religious coloring, and most of the philosophical content is taken from Ficino.
One of the most popular Renaissance treatises on love, Dialoghi d’amore (Dialogues of Love, 1535), was written by the Jewish philosopher Judah ben Isaac Abravanel, also known as Leone Ebreo (c.1460/5–c.1520/5). The work consists of three conversations on love, which he conceives of as the animating principle of the universe and the cause of all existence, divine as well as material. The first dialogue discusses the relation between love and desire; the second the universality of love; and the third, which provides the longest and most sustained philosophical discussion, the origin of love. He draws upon Platonic and Neoplatonic sources, as well as on the cosmology and metaphysics of Jewish and Arabic thinkers, which are combined with Aristotelian sources in order to produce a synthesis of Aristotelian and Platonic views.
Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism underwent a revival over the course of the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries as part of the ongoing recovery of ancient literature and thought. The revival of Stoicism began with Petrarca, whose renewal of Stoicism moved along two paths. The first one was inspired by Seneca and consisted in the presentation, in works such as De vita solitaria (The Life of Solitude) and De otio religioso (On Religious Leisure), of a way of life in which the cultivation of the scholarly work and ethical perfection are one. The second was his elaboration of Stoic therapy against emotional distress in De secreto conflictu curarum mearum (On the Secret Conflict of My Worries), an inner dialogue of the sort prescribed by Cicero and Seneca, and in De remediis utriusque fortunae (Remedies for Good and Bad Fortune, 1366), a huge compendium based on a short apocryphal tract attributed at the time to Seneca.
While many humanists shared Petrarca’s esteem for Stoic moral philosophy, others called its stern prescriptions into question. They accused the Stoics of suppressing all emotions and criticized their view for its inhuman rigidity. In contrast to the extreme ethical stance of the Stoics, they preferred the more moderate Peripatetic position, arguing that it provides a more realistic basis for morality, since it places the acquisition of virtue within the reach of normal human capacities. Another Stoic doctrine that was often criticized on religious grounds was the conviction that the wise man is entirely responsible for his own happiness and has no need of divine assistance.
The most important exponent of Stoicism during the Renaissance was the Flemish humanist Justus Lipsius (1547–1606), who worked hard to brighten the appeal of Stoicism to Christians. His first Neostoic work was De constantia (On Constancy, 1584), in which he promoted Stoic moral philosophy as a refuge from the horrors of the civil and religious wars that ravaged the continent at the time. His main accounts of Stoicism were Physiologia Stoicorum (Physical Theory of the Stoics) and Manuductio ad stoicam philosophiam (Guide to Stoic Philosophy), both published in 1604. Together they constituted the most learned account of Stoic philosophy produced since antiquity.
During the Middle Ages, Epicureanism was associated with contemptible atheism and hedonist dissipation. In 1417, Bracciolini found Lucretius’s poem De rerum natura, the most informative source on Epicurean teaching, which, together with Ambrogio Traversari’s translation of Diogenes Laertius’s Life of Epicurus into Latin, contributed to a more discriminating appraisal of Epicurean doctrine and a repudiation of the traditional prejudice against the person of Epicurus himself. In a letter written in 1428, Francesco Filelfo (1398–1481) insisted that, contrary to popular opinion, Epicurus was not “addicted to pleasure, lewd and lascivious,” but rather “sober, learned and venerable.” In the epistolary treatise Defensio Epicuri contra Stoicos, Academicos et Peripateticos (Defense of Epicurus against Stoics, Academics and Peripatetics), Cosma Raimondi (d. 1436) vigorously defended Epicurus and the view that the supreme good consists in pleasure both of the mind and the body. He argued that pleasure, according to Epicurus, is not opposed to virtue, but both guided and produced by it. Some humanists tried to harmonize Epicurean with Christian doctrine. In his dialogue De voluptate (On Pleasure, 1431), which was two years later reworked as De vero falsoque bono (On the True and False Good), Valla examined Stoic, Epicurean, and Christian conceptions of the true good. To the ultimate good of the Stoics, that is, virtue practiced for its own sake, Valla opposed that of the Epicureans, represented by pleasure, on the grounds that pleasure comes closer to Christian happiness, which is superior to either pagan ideal.
The revival of ancient philosophy was particularly dramatic in the case of Skepticism, whose revitalisation grew out of many of the currents of Renaissance thought and contributed to make the problem of knowledge crucial for early modern philosophy. The major ancient texts stating the Skeptical arguments were slightly known in the Middle Ages. It was in the fifteenth and sixteenth century that Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism and Against the Mathematicians, Cicero’s Academica, and Diogenes Laertius’s Life of Pyrrho started to receive serious philosophical consideration.
The most significant and influential figure in the development of Renaissance Skepticism is Michel de Montaigne (1533–1592). The most thorough presentation of his Skeptical views occurs in Apologie de Raimond Sebond (Apology for Raymond Sebond), the longest and most philosophical of his essays. In it, he developed in a gradual manner the many kinds of problems that make people doubt the reliability of human reason. He considered in detail the ancient Skeptical arguments about the unreliability of information gained by the senses or by reason, about the inability of human beings to find a satisfactory criterion of knowledge, and about the relativity of moral opinions. He concluded that people should suspend judgment on all matters and follow customs and traditions. He combined these conclusions with fideism.
Many Renaissance appropriators of Academic and Pyrrhonian Skeptical arguments did not see any intrinsic value in Skepticism, but rather used it to attack Aristotelianism and disparage the claims of human science. They challenged the intellectual foundations of medieval Scholastic learning by raising serious questions about the nature of truth and about the ability of humans to discover it. In Examen vanitatis doctrinae gentium et veritatis Christianae disciplinae (Examination of the Vanity of Pagan Doctrine and of the Truth of Christian Teaching, 1520), Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) set out to prove the futility of pagan doctrine and the truth of Christianity. He regarded Skepticism as ideally suited to his campaign, since it challenged the possibility of attaining certain knowledge by means of the senses or by reason, but left the scriptures, grounded in divine revelation, untouched. In the first part of the work, he used the Skeptical arguments contained in the works of Sextus Empiricus against the various schools of ancient philosophy; and in the second part he turned Skepticism against Aristotle and the Peripatetic tradition. His aim was not to call everything into doubt, but rather to discredit every source of knowledge except scripture and condemn all attempts to find truth elsewhere as vain.
In a similar way, Agrippa von Nettesheim (1486–1535), whose real name was Heinrich Cornelius, demonstrated in De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum atque artium (On the Uncertainty and Vanity of the Arts and Sciences, 1530) the contradictions of scientific doctrines. With stylistic brilliance, he described the controversies of the established academic community and dismissed all academic endeavors in view of the finitude of human experience, which in his view comes to rest only in faith.
The fame of the Portuguese philosopher and medical writer Francisco Sanches (1551–1623) rests mainly on Quod nihil scitur (That Nothing Is Known, 1581), one of the best systematic expositions of philosophical Skepticism produced during the sixteenth century. The treatise contains a radical criticism of the Aristotelian notion of science, but beside its critical aim, it had a constructive objective, which posterity has tended to neglect, consisting in Sanches’s quest for a new method of philosophical and scientific inquiry that could be universally applied. This method was supposed to be expounded in another book that was either lost, remained unpublished, or was not written at all.
In 1543, Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543) published De revolutionibus orbium coelestium (On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres), which proposed a new calculus of planetary motion based on several new hypotheses, such as heliocentrism and the motion of the earth. The first generation of readers underestimated the revolutionary character of the work and regarded the hypotheses of the work only as useful mathematical fictions. The result was that astronomers appreciated and adopted some of Copernicus’s mathematical models but rejected his cosmology. Yet, the Aristotelian representation of the universe did not remain unchallenged and new visions of nature, its principles, and its mode of operation started to emerge.
During the sixteenth century, there were many philosophers of nature who felt that Aristotle’s system could no longer regulate honest inquiry into nature. Therefore, they stopped trying to adjust the Aristotelian system and turned their backs on it altogether. It is hard to imagine how early modern philosophers, such as Francis Bacon (1561–1626), Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655,) and René Descartes (1596–1650), could have cleared the ground for the scientific revolution without the work of novatores such as Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588), Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597), Giordano Bruno (1548–1600), and Tommaso Campanella (1568–1639).
Telesio grounded his system on a form of empiricism, which maintained that nature can only be understood through sense perception and empirical research. In 1586, two years before his death, he published the definitive version of his work De rerum natura iuxta propria principia (On the Nature of Things according to their Own Principles). The book is a frontal assault on the foundations of Peripatetic philosophy, accompanied by a proposal for replacing Aristotelianism with a system more faithful to nature and experience. According to Telesio, the only things that must be presupposed are passive matter and the two principles of heat and cold, which are in perpetual struggle to occupy matter and exclude their opposite. These principles were meant to replace the Aristotelian metaphysical principles of matter and form. Some of Telesio’s innovations were seen as theologically dangerous and his philosophy became the object of vigorous attacks. De rerum natura iuxta propria principia was included on the Index of Prohibited Books published in Rome in 1596.
Through the reading of Telesio’s work, Campanella developed a profound distaste for Aristotelian philosophy and embraced the idea that nature should be explained through its own principles. He rejected the fundamental Aristotelian principle of hylomorphism and adopted instead Telesio’s understanding of reality in terms of the principles of matter, heat, and cold, which he combined with Neoplatonic ideas derived from Ficino. His first published work was Philosophia sensibus demonstrata (Philosophy as Demonstrated by the Senses, 1591), an anti-Peripatetic polemic in defense of Telesio’s system of natural philosophy. Thereafter, he was censured, tortured, and repeatedly imprisoned for his heresies. During the years of his incarceration, he composed many of his most famous works, such as De sensu rerum et magia (On the Sense of Things and On Magic, 1620), which sets out his vision of the natural world as a living organism and displays his keen interest in natural magic; Ateismus triomphatus (Atheism Conquered), a polemic against both reason of state and Machiavelli’s conception of religion as a political invention; and Apologia pro Galileo (Defense of Galileo), a defense of the freedom of thought (libertas philosophandi) of Galileo and of Christian scientists in general. Campanella’s most ambitious work is Metaphysica (1638), which constitutes the most comprehensive presentation of his philosophy and whose aim is to produce a new foundation for the entire encyclopedia of knowledge. His most celebrated work is the utopian treatise La città del sole (The City of the Sun), which describes an ideal model of society that, in contrast to the violence and disorder of the real world, is in harmony with nature.
In contrast to Telesio, who was a fervent critic of metaphysics and insisted on a purely empiricist approach in natural philosophy, Patrizi developed a program in which natural philosophy and cosmology were connected with their metaphysical and theological foundations. His Discussiones peripateticae (Peripatetic Discussions) provides a close comparison of the views of Aristotle and Plato on a wide range of philosophical issues, arguing that Plato’s views are preferable on all counts. Inspired by such Platonic predecessors as Proclus and Ficino, Patrizi elaborated his own philosophical system in Nova de universalis philosophia (The New Universal Philosophy, 1591), which is divided in four parts: Panaugia, Panarchia, Pampsychia, and Pancosmia. He saw light as the basic metaphysical principle and interpreted the universe in terms of the diffusion of light. The fourth and last part of the work, in which he expounded his cosmology showing how the physical world derives its existence from God, is by far the most original and important. In it, he replaced the four Aristotelian elements with his own alternatives: space, light, heat, and humidity. Gassendi and Henry More (1614–1687) adopted his concept of space, which indirectly came to influence Newton.
A more radical cosmology was proposed by Bruno, who was an extremely prolific writer. His most significant works include those on the art of memory and the combinatory method of Ramon Llull, as well as the moral dialogues Spaccio de la bestia trionfante (The Expulsion of the Triumphant Beast, 1584), Cabala del cavallo pegaseo (The Kabbalah of the Pegasean Horse, 1585) and De gl’heroici furori (The Heroic Frenzies, 1585). Much of his fame rests on three cosmological dialogues published in 1584: La cena de le ceneri (The Ash Wednesday Supper), De la causa, principio et uno (On the Cause, the Principle and the One) and De l’infinito, universo et mondi (On the Infinite, the Universe and the Worlds). In these, with inspiration from Lucretius, the Neoplatonists, and, above all, Nicholas of Cusa, he elaborates a coherent and strongly articulated ontological monism. Individual beings are conceived as accidents or modes of a unique substance, that is, the universe, which he describes as an animate and infinitely extended unity containing innumerable worlds. Bruno adhered to Copernicus’s cosmology but transformed it, postulating an infinite universe. Although an infinite universe was by no means his invention, he was the first to locate a heliocentric system in infinite space. In 1600, he was burned at the stake by the Inquisition for his heretical teachings.
Even though these new philosophies of nature anticipated some of the defining features of early modern thought, many of their methodological characteristics appeared to be inadequate in the face of new scientific developments. The methodology of Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) and of the other pioneers of the new science was essentially mathematical. Moreover, the development of the new science took place by means of methodical observations and experiments, such as Galileo’s telescopic discoveries and his experiments on inclined planes. The critique of Aristotle’s teaching formulated by natural philosophers such as Telesio, Campanella, Patrizi, and Bruno undoubtedly helped to weaken it, but it was the new philosophy of the early seventeenth century that sealed the fate of the Aristotelian worldview and set the tone for a new age.
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Last updated: April 28, 2012 | Originally published: April 27, 2012
Categories: Renaissance Philosophy